The Philosophy of Digital Art
The philosophy of digital art is the study of the nature and appreciative grounds of all those kinds of art whose production and presentation crucially involves computer processing. This first-order inquiry cannot proceed without acknowledgment of claims made by media and cultural theorists, art theorists and art audiences, concerning the way digital image- and sound-making technologies are fundamentally changing our understanding of art, physical representation, and perceptual experience. These claims suggest that the “digital condition” (Kittler 1999) induces a loss of trust in the image, a new way of experiencing the world as indeterminate and fragmentary, and a breakdown of traditional boundaries between artist and audience, artwork and artistic process. Testing these claims requires a formal understanding of the distinction between analog and digital systems and the implications of that distinction for aesthetic appreciation. The philosophy of digital art proceeds from a carefully articulated general account of digital representation to an investigation of the precise ways in which different kinds of digital art are digital. This leads to further investigation into the ways an artwork’s digital status bears on its appropriate appreciation. By conducting a systematic analysis of the digital as an artistically significant category, the philosophy of digital art seeks to ground burgeoning interdisciplinary and popular interest in the so-called “digital revolution”.
Although technology-based art is viewed as being part of the “the final avant-garde of the twentieth-century” (Rush 2005), and digital art has been part of the mainstream art world since the late 1900s (Paul 2008), the philosophy of digital art is still an emerging subfield. Three seminal monographs, one on videogames (Tavinor 2009), one on digital cinema (Gaut 2010), and one on computer art (Lopes 2010), have been invaluable in laying the groundwork concerning philosophical questions about art and computer technology. Since these publications, further philosophical attention has been given to the digital arts, including the first published volume to focus on the aesthetics of videogames (see Robson & Tavinor, eds., 2018). However, there is still a great deal of philosophical work to be done. In particular, work is needed to provide a general conceptual framework for an interdisciplinary discussion of the true extent to which the digital has revolutionized art and media.
- 1. What is Digital Art?
- 2. Digital Images
- 3. Appreciating Artworks in Digital Media
- 4. Interactivity
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
In its broadest extant sense, “digital art” refers to art that relies on computer-based digital encoding, or on the electronic storage and processing of information in different formats—text, numbers, images, sounds—in a common binary code. The ways in which art-making can incorporate computer-based digital encoding are extremely diverse. A digital photograph may be the product of a manipulated sample of visual information captured with a digital camera from a “live” scene or captured with a scanner from a traditional celluloid photograph. Music can be recorded and then manipulated digitally or created digitally with specialized computer software. And a movie is now the product of an extremely complex sequence of choices between analog and digital processes at the stages of image and sound capture or composition, image and sound editing, color correction or sound mastering, special effects production, and display or projection.
The complexity of the digital cinema workflow draws attention to a further difference concerning whether reliance on the digital is restricted to the way an artwork is made or extends to the display of the work. A work may be made on a computer—say, a musical work composed with Sibelius or a play written in Microsoft Word—and yet meant for apprehension in a non-digital format—say, performance on traditional musical instruments or enactment on stage. Similarly, a movie could be captured and edited digitally before being printed on traditional 35mm photochemical film for projection in theaters. By contrast, works which are purely digital include a film made and projected digitally—for example, Avatar (2009), a piece of music composed and played back electronically—for example, the electroacoustic works of Gottfried Michael Koenig (see Other Internet Resources), and a work of ASCII art—an image made up from the 95 printable characters defined by the ASCII standard of 1963 and displayed on a computer monitor.
An example of ASCII art is:
(\_/) (='.'=) (")^(")
Purely digital works include interactive works such as videogames and digital installations. Videogames are arguably the newest digital works to be recognized as a potential art form, although Brock Rough (2018) claims that under certain circumstances, videogames and art are incompatible. Additionally, many interactive digital installations in the museum borrow videogame mechanics, which factor as prominent features to appreciate (Paul 2008).
Each of the examples above incorporates a computational process, to some degree, in the presentation of the work. In many ways, works comprised of digital media stand in stark contrast to those made by completely analog means.
The classical account of the analog-digital distinction is found in Nelson Goodman’s Languages of Art (1976). In fact Goodman’s account remains practically the only general account of the distinction. While David Lewis (1971) raises a series of objections to Goodman’s account, Lewis’ alternative account applies only to the representation of numbers. And while John Haugeland (1981) returns to the general distinction, he effectively qualifies and re-frames Goodman’s account in order to overcome Lewis’s and other potential objections. A few philosophers interested in clarifying the concepts employed by cognitive scientists have recognized the need for a general account of the analog-digital distinction (e.g., Dretske 1981; Blachowicz 1997; Katz 2008; Maley 2011). But in this context, as well, Goodman’s account is the essential point of reference. In some ways, this is surprising or at least striking: As Haugeland points out, the digital is a “mundane engineering notion” (1981: 217). Yet the philosophical context in which the notion receives its fullest analysis is that of aesthetics. As is well-known, Goodman’s interests in this context center on the role of musical notation in fixing the identity of musical works. But a musical notation is also a standard example of a digital system.
On Goodman’s broad, structuralist way of thinking, representational systems in general consist of sets of possible physical objects that count as token representations. Objects are grouped under syntactic and semantic types, and interesting differences between kinds of representational system track differences in the way syntactic and semantic types relate to one another. Digital systems are distinguished by being differentiated as opposed to dense. The condition of syntactic differentiation is met when the differences between classes of token representations are limited such that it is possible for users of the system always to tell that a token belongs to at most one class. The condition of semantic differentiation is met when the extension of each type, or the class of referents corresponding to a class of token representations, differs in limited ways from the extension of any other type; so that users of the system can always tell that a referent belongs to at most one extension. Goodman provides the following example of a simple digital computer, a system that meets the conditions of both syntactic and semantic differentiation: Say we have an instrument reporting on the number of dimes dropped into a toy bank with a capacity for holding 50 dimes, where the count is reported by an Arabic numeral on a small display (Goodman 1976: 159). In this system, the syntactic types are just the numbers 0–50, which have as their instances the discrete displays, at different times, of the corresponding Arabic numerals. Both conditions of syntactic and semantic differentiation are met because the relevant differences between instances of different numbers are both highly circumscribed and conspicuous. This means that users of the system can be expected to be able to read the display, or determine which number is instantiated on the display (syntactic differentiation) and which numerical value, or how many coins, is thereby being indicated (semantic differentiation).
Analog representation fails to be differentiated because it is dense. With an ordering of types such that between any two types, there is a third, it is impossible to determine instantiation of at most one type. Not every case involving a failure of finite differentiation is a case of density. However, a traditional thermometer is such that heights of mercury that differ to any degree count as distinct syntactic types, the kinds of things that can differ semantically. Similarly, for pictures distinguished according to regions of color, for any two pictures, no matter how closely similar, one can always find a third more similar to each of them than they are to each other. Density is a feature of any system that measures continuously varying values. That is, as long as the system in question is designed so that any difference in magnitude indicates a difference in type.
Returning to the digital, some commentators have questioned whether Goodman’s condition of (syntactic and semantic) finite differentiation is sufficient to distinguish the kind of representation in question (Haugeland 1981; Lewis 1971). John Haugeland, for example, argues that there can be differentiated schemes without the “copyability” feature that defines the practical significance of digital systems. Haugeland’s solution is to require the practical and not just the theoretical possibility of a system’s users determining type membership. In fact, however, Goodman himself would likely accept this modification. In a later work, Goodman explicitly states that finite differentiation must make it possible to determine type membership “by means available and appropriate to the given user of the given scheme” (Goodman and Elgin 1988: 125).
Whether or not a work of digital art is a work of representational art, and even with the most abstract works of digital art, there are layers of representation involved in the complex processes of their production and presentation. Most of these layers, and arguably the most important ones, are digital. Where there are analog systems involved, digital translation makes possible the realization of the values of the final work. This is perhaps best seen with paradigmatic cases of digital art. Consider the following two early works:
- Craig Kalpakjian, Corridor, 1995. Computer-generated animation on laser video disc, in the collection of the San Francisco Museum of Modern Art. The video leads us slowly down an empty office hallway that is slightly curved and evenly lit, with blank, pale walls and clouded-glass windows.
- Cory Arcangel, Landscape Study #4, 2002. Installation. A “reverse-engineered” video game that aims to transpose our everyday surroundings onto a video game platform. The work “plays” on a Nintendo gaming system and displays a continuously scrolling landscape with the blocky, minimalist graphics of the Mario Brothers game.
The first of these works involves digital moving imagery that is entirely generated by a computer program. At the same time, the video looks like it was or could have been recorded in an actual office setting. The particular significance of the work depends on the viewer being aware of its digital composition while at the same time being struck by its photorealistic familiarity. According to the San Francisco Museum of Modern Art (SF MoMA),
Kalpakjian thus reveals the complete artificiality of the built environments we inhabit, and their aesthetic distance from more humanistic forms. (SF MoMA n.d.)
The second work involves imagery that was initially captured digitally. Arcangel began by taking 360-degree photographs of his hometown of Buffalo, New York. He scanned and modified the photographs on his computer so that they could be coded according to the graphics capabilities of the Nintendo gaming system, and in order to give the images the distinctive look and feel of the Mario Bros game. Arcangel then programmed the landscape imagery to scroll continuously across a TV screen, as in the Mario Bros game. Finally, Arcangel melted the chips in a Super Mario cartridge, replacing them with his self-manufactured chips so that his landscape “game” could be run on any Nintendo system. As well as all the ways in which Arcangel’s work relies on both the technology and aesthetics of videogames, there are clearly ways in which it deliberately removes or blocks certain key features or capacities of videogames, perhaps most notably their robust interactivity. Playing a videogame essentially involves the prescribed creation of new display instances of a work. But we do not “play” Landscape Study #4, and its imagery is fixed by the artist. The kind of interactivity typical of videogames can also be found in artworks made without computers (see Lopes 2010: 49). But this type of interactivity is most closely associated with digital art because it is so much easier to achieve with the use of computers. This suggests a high degree of self-consciousness in Arcangel’s decision to block the interactivity of his reverse-engineered videogame. From the perspective of the philosophy of digital art, such a decision highlights the need for further discussion of the link between the nature of the digital and the nature of interactivity.
What is it about the ways in which the works by Arcangel and Kalpakjian are made that makes them digital in an appreciatively relevant sense? Computer imaging depends on the inherent programmability and automation of digital computers. Digital image capture depends on sampling and subsequently on the near-instantaneous processes of discrete coding. None of this would be possible without a series of linked systems each with finitely differentiated settings.
At the most basic level, the myriad transistors in a computer are essentially tiny digital schemes, each with two types: the “on” and “off” settings of the transistor-capacitor switch. The settings are discrete and distinguishable, as are their compliance classes, of 1s and 0s. The ubiquity of binary code in computer processing is a consequence of the fact that a digital computer is essentially a vast collection of on-off switches. A particular sequence of 1s and 0s realized at a particular time in virtue of the requisite arrangement of transistors is a binary instance of a particular number, interchangeable with all other instances of the same number and with no instances of different numbers. The difference between instances of one number and instances of other numbers is strictly limited to the difference in the ordering of 1s and 0s. In other words, Goodman’s condition of finite differentiation is clearly met. In turn, the numbers can refer to other values, including the light-intensity values of an image. A computation simply involves the generation of output strings of binary digits from input strings in accordance with a general rule that depends on the properties of the strings (Piccinini 2008). The modern (digital) computer encodes both data and instructions of human readable code and assembly languages as sequences of binary digits, or bits, and allows for the internal storage of instructions. This makes the computer essentially programmable in the sense that it can be modified to compute new functions simply by being fed an appropriate arrangement of bits.
A program is a list of instructions, and instructions are strings of digits. The modern digital computer has components that serve to copy and store programs inside the machine, and to supply instructions to the computer’s processing units for implementation in the appropriate order. The outputs of a system can be dependent on specific inputs often in tandem with the conditional if-then statements. This is what is involved in a computer executing conditional branching instructions such that it can monitor and respond to its own intermediate computational states and even modify instructions based on its own processes. Such modifications are dictated by an algorithm—the program’s set of rules and operations. It is the digital computer’s capacity for branching, due to its digital programmability, that allows for the kinds of higher-level automation involved in the use of imaging applications and sequential image-generation. Our artists, Kalpakjian and Arcangel, do not have to enter the strings of digits for every basic operation of the computer that underlies the complex operations involved in describing and manipulating images (among other features). If they did have to do this, they would never finish making their artworks. Rather, artists can rely on open-source code, libraries, or commercial software that automatically and instantaneously supplies the lines of code required for the execution of their decisions.
The imaging software with which Kalpakjian works allows him to generate architectural interiors in rich detail. Arcangel does not require as much from his imaging software given that he is manipulating previously captured and scanned images. The process of scanning the photographs, just like the process involved in digital photography, involves sampling and quantization of a visual source; assigning an integer, from a finite range, to the average light-intensity measured across each small area of source-space corresponding to a cell in a grid. This process involves averaging and rounding up values, and it involves measurement, or sampling, of light intensities at (spatially and temporally) discrete intervals. Some, indeed many, of the differences in light intensity across the source image or scene (and at different times, in the case of moving imagery) are thereby dropped by the process of digital image-capture. Among some media theorists, this fact has led to deep suspicion of the digitally recorded image, prompting the feeling that the digital image is always a poor substitute for the analog. Current digital technologies for image-capture and display have such high rates of sampling frequency and resolution that the values dropped in quantization are well below the threshold of human perception. At the same time, Arcangel’s Landscape Study #4 reminds us that digital artists may choose to exploit visible pixellation for particular artistic ends.
A digitally recorded image need not appear any less richly detailed or varied in color than an analog image. All the same, in the terms of D. N. Rodowick, whereas the analog photograph is an “isomorphic transcription” of its subject, a digital photograph is a “data-output”, with a symbolically-mediated link to its subject (Rodowick 2007: 117–8). This ontological divide—described by William J. Mitchell as a “sudden and decisive rupture” in the history of photography (1994: 59), is then assumed to have aesthetic implications: Rodowick insists that the “discontinuities” in digital information “produce perceptual or aesthetic effects”. Despite this insistence, however, Rodowick goes on to acknowledge that, with enough resolution, “a digital photograph can simulate the look of a continuously produced analogical image”. This concession would seem to work against any attempt to identify the aesthetic effects of pixellation, even if “the pixel grid remains in the logical structure of the image” (Rodowick 2007: 119). But if we are to interpret Rodowick charitably, he could be implying that ontology at least partly determines appropriate appreciation; even if a digital photograph can look just like an analog photograph, its (known) digital status affects which of its perceptible features are aesthetically relevant and how we appropriately engage with them.
The media theorists’ worry about the impoverished digital image primarily refers to the production of digital images with its reliance on sampling and quantization. But there are also analogous worries one could have about the digital presentation of images, worries about deep structural changes to analog images once they are displayed digitally—for example, on a liquid crystal display (LCD) screen or when projected digitally on a flat surface. Of course one could simply be interested in investigating these structural changes without being particularly worried about them. This shall be our approach.
The traditional method of film reel projection has been a remarkably stable and entrenched technology, remaining largely unchanged for over a century. But digital projection is on the rise, particularly in conjunction with the networked distribution of movies. And although movie audiences may not be able to see the difference on screen between analog and digital projection, their expectations are changing—for example, about what can go wrong in the presentation of a movie. A deeper assumption that has not changed, one that is almost universal among film scholars, is that cinema fundamentally depends on an illusion. Cinema is the art of moving images and thus its very existence depends on our being tricked into seeing a rapid succession of static images as a persistent moving image. In the philosophy of film, there is a small debate about the status of cinematic motion—whether it really is an illusion as is commonly assumed. An analysis of digital projection technology reveals new complexities in this debate but ultimately provides additional reasons to stick with the popular illusionist view.
Traditional and digital projection methods could not appear more different: the former involves running a flexible film strip through a mechanical projector; the latter involves a complex array of micromirrors on semiconductor chips, which, in combination with a prism and a lamp, generate projectable images from binary code. Nevertheless, both are methods for generating the impression of a continuously illuminated, persistent moving image from a sequence of static images. Compared with traditional projection, however, digital projection includes an extra step, whereby the images in the static sequence are generated from flashes of light. In order to generate each image in the digital projector, a light beam from a high-powered lamp is separated by a prism into its color components of red, blue, and green. Each color beam then hits a different Digital Micromirror Device (DMD), which is a semiconductor chip covered with more than a million tiny, hinged mirrors. Based on the information encoded in the video signal, the DMDs selectively turn over some of the tiny mirrors to reflect the colored lights. Most of the tiny mirrors are flipped thousands of times a second in order to create the gradations of light and dark making up a monochromatic, pixellated image—a mirror that is flipped on a greater proportion of the time will reflect more light and so will form a brighter pixel than a mirror that is not flipped on for so long. Each DMD reflects a monochromatic image back to the prism, which then recombines the colors to form the projected, full-color image. This image—if it were held for long enough on the screen—would be perceived as static. In order then to produce the impression of motion in the projected, full-color image, the underlying memory array of the DMDs has to update rapidly so that all the micromirrors are released simultaneously and allowed to move into a new “address state”, providing new patterns of light modulation for successive, slightly different images.
The two-stage process of digital projection, whereby each image in a static sequence is generated by flashing light and the impression of a moving image is then generated by the rapid execution of the sequence, draws attention to the metaphysical complexity of the question of how movies move. In particular, one is unlikely to determine the status of the impression of motion that makes possible the art of cinema unless one can determine the status of the imagery that is seen to move. Given that motion involves an object occupying contiguous spatial locations in successive moments of time, a moving object must be re-identifiable over time. A moving image in a film, arising as it does out of the rapid display of a succession of still images, is not obviously a persistent object that can be seen to move. Then again, perhaps it is enough that ordinary viewers identify an image—say of a moving train— as the same image, for the moving image to persist (Currie 1996). Alternatively, the moving image could be thought to persist as a second-order physical entity constituted by a sequence of flashing light (Ponech 2006).
The second proposal immediately runs into trouble with digital projection. If the traditionally projected moving image exists as a series of flashes of light, in digital projection, other “intermediate” objects must be granted existence—for example, the stable point of light consisting of the rate of flashes, and gaps between them, of a single micromirror on the DMD. At the same time, the moving image itself must be stripped of its existence since it does not consist of flashes of light. This is due to the fact that, in digital projection, there are no gaps between frames and so no underlying, imperceptible alternation of light and dark. This leaves the realist in the awkward position of claiming that the moving image goes in and out of existence with the switch between analog and digital projection technologies.
The first proposal, on which cinematic motion is a secondary quality, threatens to destroy the distinction between the apparent and the illusory. It suggests a way of reinterpreting any case of perceptual illusion as a case involving the ascription of secondary qualities. That is, unless it can be shown that there are independent means of checking that we are mistaken about genuine illusions. But even if this can be shown, a problem remains: While there may not be an independent check for the motion in an image, there is likewise no independent check for a genuine illusion of color. Given the contrived conditions of movie viewing, there is more reason to think of cinematic motion as akin to an illusory, than to a genuine, experience of color. With the introduction of digital projection, the conditions are arguably even more contrived. For it is not just movement in the image but the image itself that is constituted by rapid flashes of light. And the technology involved is far less accessible than that of a traditional mechanical projector in the sense that one cannot, just by looking at the projection device, see (roughly) how it works. In this way, an analysis of digital movie projection serves to reinforce the traditional assumption that cinema is an art of illusion. In addition, however, the analysis suggests that the illusion at the heart of cinema is particularly impenetrable—akin to an illusion of color, and thus an illusion of a mere appearance that cannot be checked (Thomson-Jones 2013).
With digital movie projection, we begin to see the importance of understanding the technology of display for understanding the nature of digital art. Another way we see its importance is in relation to images displayed on LCD screens. According to Goodman, images are essentially analog. Nevertheless, there seems to be a way for engineers to circumvent the essential analogicity of pictorial schemes by using digital technologies for encoded subphenomenal discrimination. Arguably, finite differentiation can be imposed on the scheme of all possible images displayed on high-resolution LCD screens. As we shall see, this has far-reaching implications for the ways in which we think about and properly appreciate image-based art.
Both in his earlier and in his later work in aesthetics, Goodman commits to “a special relation” between the analog and the pictorial, one that is seen when we compare “the presystematic notions of description and picture in a given culture”. Given two schemes, S and S′, where S consists of all descriptions or predicates in a language such as English, and S′ consists of all pictures, if we were told only of the structures of S and S′, we could distinguish the pictorial scheme by its being analog (Goodman and Elgin 1988: 130). The special relation remains, Goodman claims, despite the possibility of a digital sub-scheme made up of black and white grid patterns all of which happen to be pictures. In such a scheme, the differences between patterned types that matter for the scheme’s being digital do not include all of the differences that matter for distinguishing pictorial types. Pictures are distinguished by color, shape, and size, which vary continuously; any variation in color, shape, or size potentially results in a different picture. When we impose limits on the differences that matter for distinguishing one grid pattern in the scheme from another, we are not interpreting the grid patterns as pictures; if we were to do so, we would have to treat them as members of a syntactically dense, an analog, scheme.
Goodman’s insight about grid patterns and pictures suggests an immediate difficulty for explaining the digital status of images displayed on LCD screens: Clearly it will not be sufficient to point out that such images are pixellated, and therefore made up of small identical building blocks that impose a lower limit on the differences between display-instances. Remember that pictures are defined by color, shape, and size, which vary continuously. This means that even if the physical pixels of an LCD screen are such that there are gaps between the possible shapes, sizes, and colors that the screen can instantiate, and there are a finite number of shapes, sizes, and colors that the screen can instantiate, there is still going to be vagueness at the limits of types. Any means of discretely carving up the property spaces of color, shape, and size has to involve grouping into types what are in fact (subphenomenally) distinct shapes, sizes, and colors, some of which may differ less from adjacent properties grouped into other types. This makes it impossible always to determine unique class membership; hence, finite differentiation is not achieved.
Pixellation alone, no matter the resolution, cannot account for images displayed on LCD screens belonging to a digital scheme; digital images qua images thus remain stubbornly analog. But perhaps Goodman’s condition of finite differentiation can still be met with a closer analysis of digital image technology. Current technologies for sampling and instantiating light intensities group objective colors well below the level of phenomenal discrimination. For example, in the standard “Truecolor” system, a display pixel has three 8-bit subpixels, each of which emits a different visible wavelength with an intensity from a range of 256 values, yielding over 16 million objective colors. Such a large number of available colors gives the impression of a color continuum when, in fact, digital sampling technology has been used to carve up the objective color space into a disjoint series of wavelength intensities. On the one hand, from the fact that display pixels can be lit at intensities between and indiscriminable from adjacent discriminable intensities, it seems to follow finite differentiation is defeated. On the other hand, precisely because digital technology involves microtechnology and metrology for subphenomenal discrimination between colors, the light intensity groupings that are expressed numerically as red-blue-green triplets in a system like Truecolor can be narrower than the objective color types that contribute to the resultant image scheme. The key is keeping the variations in the essentially analog properties of color, shape, and size small enough so that they cannot accumulate to the point of making a difference to image perception (Zeimbekis 2012). The types in the scheme of digital images are technologically segmented, transitive groupings of the same color-, shape-, and size-experiences. The carving out of a transitive sub-set of magnitudes has to occur relative to the needs of the users of the system. In the case of digital color, the types are classes of light intensities sufficient to cause the same color experience for normal human perceivers. The replicability of digital images is made possible by the gap between the discriminatory limits of the human visual system and the discriminatory limits of digital sampling technology.
Digital images can be replicated insofar as they are digital and thus finitely differentiated. They are finitely differentiated because they rely on subphenomenal sampling and display technology. In practical terms, replication depends on the use of binary code, even though this is not in fact what makes images qua images digital. Of course binary code representations are themselves part of a digital scheme. But the role of binary code in image-instantiation is just one of consistent preservation; preservation for long enough to permit reproduction. Despite the inherent replicability of digital images, it does not appear to follow automatically that artworks involving these images are multiples.
The SF MoMA is in possession of the original of Kalpakjian’s work, Corridor; they control access to the video imagery. At present, the work is not available to be viewed: it cannot be viewed on-line as part of a digital archive or collection, nor is it currently on view in the physical space of the museum. The image sequence comprising the work could be multiply instantiated and widely distributed, but in fact it is not. Similarly with Arcangel’s work, Landscape Study #4: described as an installation, it is to be exhibited in a physical gallery alongside an arrangement of printed stills, with a television connected to a Nintendo Entertainment System. Again, the image sequence displayed on the television could be multiply instantiated and widely distributed, but it is not. Clips and copies of the landscape imagery are available on-line, but these are not taken to instantiate parts of the work itself. By contrast, works of net art are instantiated whenever they are accessed by someone on-line.
There are many kinds of net art, including various forms of experimental on-line literature, conceptual browser art, and works drawing on software and computer gaming conventions. Extensive on-line collections of visual and audiovisual net art are rigorously curated and at the same time immediately accessible to ordinary Internet users. The contrast is striking, between the conventions of access and presentation, for works of net art and for works like those by Kalpakjian and Arcangel. Perhaps a digital artwork comprising multiply instantiable images need not itself be multiply instantiable. At this point, in considering the factors determining the status of a digital visual artwork, the philosophy of digital art joins an ongoing debate about the ontology of art.
On the question of whether artworks are all the same kind of thing or many different kinds of things, ontological pluralism is often taken to be implied by the primary role of the artist in “sanctioning” features of his or her work (Irvin 2005, 2008; Thomasson 2010). A sanction can consist simply in a self-professed artist painting a canvas, say, and handing it over to a gallery with a title attached. The artist has sanctioned those features of the work that make it a traditional painting. But what was once largely implicit is now often explicit: many contemporary works of art are defined by a set of instructions for their presentation (e.g., aspect ratio, resolution). We can find similar examples of non-digital works that are defined by a set of instructions such as Felix Gonzalez-Torres’ Untitled (Portrait of Ross in L.A.) (1991), which is given to a gallery to display by way of nothing other than a set of instructions for constructing and maintaining a pile of candies. Whether non-digital or digital, the instructions determine what is part of the work and what is not, and whether the work is singular or multiply instantiable. As a result, the instructions guide appropriate interpretation of the work. On this view, ontology precedes interpretation: we cannot properly and fully appreciate a work, for the work that it is, without a prior determination of what it comprises. This is a matter of contention, however. On another way of thinking, artworks just are objects of interpretation, and there is no artwork prior to interpretation whose boundaries can be identified before we begin interpretation (Davies 2004).
The issue of the relation between ontology and interpretation is a complex and difficult one, but progress likely can be made on the issue through an examination of digital art practices. This is particularly in light of the high degree of self-consciousness with which many digital artists and digital art curators specify the features of digital art works. It is common practice, for example, when archiving net art, to have artists fill out a questionnaire in order to specify which features of a work are crucial for its preservation—whether features of appearance, timing and motion, interactivity potentials and methods, linking to other sites, or hardware and software. When a work of net art is individuated by its imagery, the artist has chosen to make the inherent replicability of digital imagery part of his or her work. That this is a choice is suggested by the existence of singular works of digital visual art, like the examples discussed above. If indeed the works by Kalpakjian and Arcangel can function allographically—and certainly, this question requires further investigation (see D’Cruz and Magnus 2014)—this would support a primary role for the artist’s presentation instructions in fixing, not just the art form (installation, movie, conceptual work, etc.) but the basic structure of the work: for example, whether the work is singular and thus identical with a certain kind of physical display or multiple with no original display. Where interactive digital works are concerned, individuation is determined by the algorithm. An algorithmic account of interactive digital art suggests that, although the code is important for adequate instantiation of the work, it is the algorithm that specifies the crucial features of the work (Lopes 2010; Tavinor 2011; Moser 2018). Since the code is, ontologically speaking, less relevant than the algorithm, this account also makes allowances for the variability that may be found in the code when an instance of a program is run on different kinds of devices.
Reflection on the kinds and significance of choices available to an artist contributes to a full appreciation of his or her work. For any artwork, appreciation begins with recognition of its status as a work, the product of artistic activity of some kind, and thus something to be appreciated as the achievement of an artist or group of artists. Most commonly, this achievement is understood in terms of the aesthetically significant effects achieved by an artist with certain kinds of tools and materials and in light of certain appreciative conventions. In other words, the achievement is always relative to an artistic medium. Returning to the case of an artist choosing what to do about the inherent replicability of digital imagery, another way of thinking about this choice is in terms of the artist recognizing the limits and capacities of her chosen medium. Images conveyed digitally are always replicable and so when an artist aims to convey artistic content through digital imagery, she either has to accept the inevitable multiplicity of her images or resist the tendency of the medium and somehow specify the work’s singularity in presentation. At a more fine-grained level, our appreciation of particular effects—of color and composition, expression, narrative structure, and so on—depends on the effects themselves but also on background acknowledgment of their degree of difficulty or innovation in the relevant medium. One worry with digital art is that its production relies on the computer automation of many of the tasks, both manual and cognitive, traditionally involved in making art. The effects achieved by computer automation cannot be assessed in the same way as those achieved by traditional “hands-on” artistic methods. The terms of our appreciation, therefore, need to be adjusted in the digital age. This is certainly compatible with the continued relevance of medium-based appreciation, as long as we can make sense of digital media as artistic media (Binkley 1998). But there is a strong tendency in film and media studies to assume that the medium has absolutely no role to play in the appreciation of digital art.
Summing up this view, it supposedly follows from the fact that modern (digital) computers encode every kind of information in the same way—i.e., as a sequence of binary digits—that an artwork that crucially relies in its production on computer processing is no longer defined by its mode of presentation, whether in images, moving images, sound patterns, or text. A work’s display is rendered merely contingent by the fact that it is generated from a common code. By adding a particular instruction to the code sequence specifying a work, imagery associated with that work could be instantaneously converted into sounds or text, or just into different imagery. This possibility alone supposedly renders meaningless all talk of an artwork being in a particular medium and being properly appreciated in terms of that medium (Kittler 1999; Doane 2007).
Given the considerable effects of digital technology on artistic production, it is perhaps understandable that some commentators are inclined toward a radical overhauling of art theoretical concepts. But their arguments in support of such an overhaul are, at best, incomplete. We see this once we cite some important continuities between ways of making and thinking about art in the analog age and in the digital age. It has always been the case, for example, that “any medium can be translated into any other” (Kittler 1999: 1): without using a computer, someone could manually devise a set of rules (an algorithm) for the translation of image values, say, into sounds or text. Moreover, a common storage and transmission means for (moving) imagery and sound is not unique to digital technology: As Doron Galili points out (2011), electronic image transmission going back to the late nineteenth century—in other words, precursors of the TV—relies on the conversion of both images and sound into electronic pulses.
Apart from these important continuities, the media theorist’s inference from translatability to medium-free art simply does not hold. That we could set about “translating” the imagery of Citizen Kane into a symphony does not mean that the original artwork lacks a medium; it is a movie, after all, and as such, it has to be in the medium of moving images. The symphonic translation of Citizen Kane is not the same work as the 1941 movie by Orson Welles. This reminds us that, in deciding whether there is a digital medium, we must not reduce the medium to the artist’s materials, for it also matters how the artist uses those materials. Nor must we limit the constitutive materials of a medium to physical materials. The case of literature shows that neither the materials of an art form, nor their modes of manipulation, need be physical. The medium of literature is neither paper and ink nor abstract lexical symbols, but letters and words used in certain ways. There are, of course, many different ways of physically storing and transmitting literary works, including by the printed page, in audio recordings, and by memory (human or computer). But from the fact that The Tale of Two Cities can be preserved in many different formats, it does not follow that this novel is any less decisively a novel and, as such, in the medium of literature.
Just as with a literary work, the preservation and transmission of digital works in different formats depends on the use of a common code, but a binary numeric code rather than a lexical one. If words and their literary uses constitute the medium of literature, then binary code, along with the information it implements, and its artistic uses constitute the medium of digital art. This allows for the possibility that the digital medium contains various sub-media, or “nested” media (Gaut 2010). For instance, within the medium of digital art, the medium of digital visual art comprises artistic uses of computer code specifically to create images. In technical terms, such uses can be referred to as (artistic) “bitmapping”, given that a computer ultimately stores all images (2D and 3D vector) as bitmaps, code sequences that specify the integers assigned to light intensity measurements in a pixel grid. The medium of bitmapping is thus distinguished by a kind of digital technology, but the kind used to produce just those items belonging to the traditional medium of images.
Once the notion of digital media is revealed to be no more confused or mysterious than the familiar notion of literary media, its irreducible role in appreciation becomes apparent. To take just one example, proper appreciation of movies in the digital age depends on recognizing that digital movie-making tools do not just make traditional movie-making easier; they also present new creative possibilities and challenges. Given the maturity and mass-art status of the cinematic art form, it is easy to take for granted the medium of moving imagery; we may think we know precisely its limits, and we may even think we have seen everything that can be done with it. The digital medium is different, however, and digital cinema is in both the medium of moving imagery and the digital medium.
At first glance, it might seem odd to speak of “challenges” or “limits” in relation to digital processes, which allow for instantaneous and endless modification with increasingly user-friendly applications and devices. The high degree of automation in the process of capturing an image with a digital video camera, along with increasingly high image resolution and memory capacity, could make it seem as though digital images are too easily achieved to be interesting. Then there are the practically endless possibilities for “correcting” the captured image with applications like Photoshop. Digital sound recording is likewise increasingly automated, increasingly fine-grained, and reliant on ever-larger computer memory capacities. Modifying and mastering recorded sound with digital editing software allows for an unlimited testing of options. In digital movie editing, sequence changes are instantaneous and entirely reversible—quite unlike when the editing process involved the physical cutting and splicing of a film (image or sound) strip. Digital tools thus allow moviemakers to focus (almost) purely on the making of choices about the look and sound of the movie without having to worry about the technical difficulty or finality of implementation.
Rather than dismissing all digital works as too easily achieved to be interesting, medium-based appreciation requires that we consider the digital on its own terms and allow for the possibility that certain kinds of increased technical efficiency can bring new creative risks. For example, even though committing to certain editorial decisions does not entail irreversible alterations to a filmstrip, arriving at those decisions involves sifting through and eliminating far more options, a process which can easily become overwhelming and therefore more error-ridden. When we properly appreciate a digital movie, therefore, part of what we need to appreciate is the significance of any scene or sequence looking just the way it does when it could have, so easily, looked so many other ways. Similarly, when we properly appreciate an interactive digital installation or videogame, we are, in part, appreciating certain representations, functions, and capabilities of the input-output system that are made possible by digital media. This is undeniably a form of medium-based appreciation, but the medium to which we appeal is the digital medium rather than traditional media. If the digital medium is computer code used in certain ways—for example, to make moving images, then it is only when we think of a digital movie as in this medium that we can appreciate it as a particular response to the creative problem, introduced by coding, of finalizing selections from a vast array of equally and instantly available options.
The case of digital cinema is perhaps a useful starting point for work in the philosophy of digital art. Digital cinema is a multi-media art form, after all, involving 2D and 3D moving images as well as sound, and with the potential for robust interactivity, whereby audiences select story events or otherwise modify a movie’s screening in prescribed ways (Gaut 2010: 224–43). Many of the digital tools developed by the movie and video game industries are now available more widely to artists interested in making other forms of digital art, including net art, digital sound installations, and virtual reality art (Grau 2003; Chalmers 2017; Tavinor 2019). In terms of how the use of these tools affects proper appreciation, there are important continuities between the movie-making context and the wider digital art world. In addition, the philosophy of film is a well-established subfield in aesthetics, one that engages with both film theory and cognitive science in order to explicate the nature of film as a mass art (Thomson-Jones 2014, Other Internet Resources). For many of the standard topics in the philosophy of film, interesting and important questions arise when we extend the discussion from analog to digital cinema. There is a question, for example, about the kinds and significance of realism that can be achieved with traditional celluloid film as compared with manipulated digital imagery (Gaut 2010: 60–97). The philosophy of film can provide some of the initial terms of analysis for artworks in a broad range of digital media. At the same time, it is important to approach the digital arts on their own terms under the assumption that the digital is an artistically significant category.
More and more, contemporary artists are taking advantage of the dynamic and responsive capabilities of digital media to make their art interactive. The experimental online literature, conceptual browser art, and videogames mentioned above require user interactivity, but all to varying degrees. Therefore, if interactivity plays a distinctive role in the digital arts, there are good reasons to analyse the nature of these works more deeply.
Not all digital works are interactive, and not all interactive works are digital. However, since computers are inherently interactive, much of the early philosophical literature on interactivity arose from the emergence of computer art (also see Smuts 2009; Lopes 2001; Saltz 1997). The distinctive character of interactive digital art is best considered in tandem with the work’s ontology.
All interactive artworks, digital and non-digital, have dual ontological structures that consist of properties belonging to the work and properties that belong to the work’s instances. So far, this is not so different than performance works like music and dance, or even digital photographs that can be multiply instantiated. Where digitally interactive works are concerned, certain properties of the work are borne by the work’s algorithm, whereas properties of the instances are brought about by the user’s interaction.
Given that appreciation of certain artworks is embedded in a user’s interactivity, philosophers are then tasked with defining interactive art in a manner that eliminates unsanctioned actions from constituting a kind of interactive work. One could imagine, for example, someone hacking into a digital file to manipulate a digital image, thus generating new instance-properties of the work. That, and more benign actions such as reading chapters of, let us say, a digitized copy of The Brothers Karamazov in random order may change the properties of the work, but such activities are not prescribed. This, once again, underscores the importance of the artist’s sanction. Bearing this in mind and relating it to computer art, Dominic Lopes offers the following definition, “A work of art is interactive just in case it prescribes that the actions of its users help generate its display” (Lopes 2010:36, original emphasis). Similarly, Berys Gaut’s definition states that “a work is interactive just in case it authorizes that its audience’s actions partly determine its instances and their features” (Gaut 2010: 143, original emphasis). In specifying certain actions as prescribed and authorized, these often-cited definitions restrict the kinds of works that ought or ought not be considered candidates for an interactive art category.
The capability of a work to generate instance-properties from the user’s actions is recognized within philosophical aesthetics as a distinctive feature of interactive artworks. However, given the ontological similarities between performance works and interactive ones, it follows that one may question the specific roles of ‘user’ and ‘audience’ in the definitions presented above. Lopes clarifies that,
A person plays the role of a user in generating a display of a work only if he or she (1) generates the display, (2) exploring the work, so that (3) an audience attends to the work partly by attending to his or her doing (1) and (2) (Lopes 2010: 82).
Users explore a work by generating the display via a computational process. For Lopes, the user and audience can be the same, but they need not be. For philosophers of art, the above conception falls just shy of fully excluding performance works from a category of interactive art (Gaut 2010; Kania 2018). Afterall, it can be argued that a musician similarly engages in (1), (2), and (3) when she performs a specific work. If this is the case, the terms ‘user’ and ‘audience’ are not always synonymous, unless it is stipulated that for interactive works the identity of users and audiences are identical. This is atypical of non-interactive performance works where a performer plays for an audience, beyond him or herself. This distinctive user-audience relationship also suggests that adequate appreciation of a work is not granted by merely observing a user interact with it (Kania 2018: 188).
The aforementioned words ‘instance’ and ‘display’ (used interchangeably here) can be applied to both interactive and non-interactive works characterized by a two-level ontology. Nevertheless, there are significant metaphysical differences between works like an interactive digital installation or videogame and others like a digital photograph. One of the more significant distinctions has to do with the structure of the displays; displays of interactive works are variable in ways the displays of non-interactive works are not (Lopes 2010). More precisely stated, the displays of interactive works are considered variable if they have a succession of states or they are repeatable (Lopes 2010: 37–38). To characterize the first kind of variability, consider the following description of the digital installation “Universe of Water Particles on a Rock where People Gather” (henceforth, where People Gather) by TeamLab:
The Rock where People Gather is reproduced in a virtual three-dimensional space. Water is simulated to fall onto the rock, and the flow of the water draws the shape of the waterfall. The water is represented by a continuum of numerous water particles and the interaction between the particles is then calculated. Lines are drawn in relation to the behavior of the water particles. The lines are then “flattened” using what TeamLab considers to be ultrasubjective space.
When a person stands on the rock or touches the waterfall, they too become like a rock that changes the flow of water. The flow of water continues to transform in real time due to the interaction of people. Previous visual states can never be replicated, and will never reoccur (TeamLab 2018).
Users interact with the work to generate variations in the succession of displays, but none of the previous states are repeatable. Compare this with the second kind of display variability. Digital works that are networked, such as most net art and videogames, are repeatable because they can be multiply accessed and instantiated by different users, in different places, and all at once; variations are generated when the work is repeated. Although repeatable digital works are possible due to digital media’s unique transmissible nature, more needs to be said about how this trait distinguishes interactive digital works from non-interactive digital images.
If the displays of digital photographs vary from instance to instance due to different settings on different devices (e.g., brightness, resolution, intensity), then the aesthetic and structural differences of all works with multiple displays need to be considered in greater detail. Consider, for example, that with many videogames, players can choose which route to take, quests to accept, characters to kill or save, personalities to adopt, and the like. These sorts of in-game player choices are not merely features that generate varying resolutions and the like: the interactivity shapes the stories that unfold, which can be reshaped during another playing of the same game for very different outcomes. In these cases, strong variability occurs because the works consist of differing multiple displays (Preston 2014). For clarification, Dominic Preston says,
for any given artwork, each possible set of structural and aesthetic properties F is a display type of that artwork. (Preston 2014: 271, original emphasis).
From the above, we can briefly infer the following scenarios: digital photographs are ontologically similar to plays and music because they consist of one display type, but multiple displays given subtle variances between the particular tokens. Works that instance a succession of states such as “where People Gather” consist of multiple potential display types but where only one display is instantiated at any given time. Now, compare such works with those like videogames and comparable interactive digital examples that present us with strong degrees of display variability to such an extent that we might re-classify the work’s genre depending upon the outcomes. For example, one playthrough might end in a tragedy but, given a player’s different choices, end in a non-tragedy at another time, to list just one example. Under a Prestonian view of display types, these sorts of works consist of both multiple display types and multiple displays, which means users will generate one of the possible display types each time they repeat the work. While this concept is mostly applicable to videogames, one could imagine interactive digital installations or net art with similar degrees of variability.
It is important to reiterate that the strong interactivity just described is not distinctively digital. Whilst interactivity is a standard feature of many contemporary digital works, and the responsiveness of such works is remarkable, non-digital appreciative categories can also exploit a similar degree of display variability. For example, literature, theater, and tabletop role playing games can be strongly interactive similarly to many digital artworks. What is unique about all such works are the ways in which things like immersion, agency, identity, and fictions, to list a few, are impacted by the interactivity, due to the user’s role in the work (for more, see Robinson & Tavinor 2018; Patridge 2017; Meskin & Robson 2016).
Although they have only begun to scratch the surface, philosophers of art have done a good deal to stress the significance of both digital media and interactivity in the arts, as well as their ongoing influence in changing philosophical conceptions of art and artistic practices. However, further investigation is needed on topics such as forms of realism distinctive of digital image-based art, digital conceptual art, art categories and media distinctions in relation to digital art, and the impact of digital technology on practices of making, displaying, and appreciating art. Given that digital media connect physical locations to virtual ones, it is also worth exploring the ways in which the connectivity and mobility of digital art challenge our traditional notions of site-specificity and location-specific art. On a related note are the social (and perhaps political) implications of digital art, which are also of growing interest.
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- Gottfried Michael Koenig Project
- Austin Museum of Digital Art
- Digital Art Museum
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- Digital Art & Design – Victoria and Albert Museum, information on the history and practice of computer art and design.
- The Whitney Museum’s Art Port, providing access to the museum’s collection of digital art and an exhibition space for commissioned works of net art.