## Notes to Causal Determinism

1. Some philosophers are misled on this point by the fact that some now-defunct presentations of Special Relativity theory seem to be grounded on an ontology of events. But Special Relativity does not need to be so presented, nor were the “events” used anything like common sense events.

2. The talk here of
prediction is intuitive but sloppy. What we should say is: none of the
states of the world before *t* = 0, conjoined with the laws of
CM, entailed the appearance of the space invader at *t* = 0.

3. To create a
cylindrical, spatially finite version of 2-D Newtonian space-time, one
draws two vertical lines (e.g. *x* = 0 and *x* =
*a*), cuts and throws away everything to the left of one and to
the right of the other, and identifies the two lines, thus making space
finite and closed. In this space-time setting, to power the space
invader we can't use the non-collision mechanism of Gerver and Xia; see
Earman (1986), p. 45.

4. Tachyons are hypothesized faster-than-light particles; there is no experimental basis for them, so ruling them out is no sin.

5. In GTR, a model
system consists of a point manifold *M* on which a metric tensor
**g ^{ab}** is defined, as well as a stress-energy
tensor

**T**(which can be everywhere zero), jointly satisfying Einstein's field equations. The mathematical property of general covariance possessed by Einstein's equations entails that from one valid model system <

^{ab}*M*,

**g**,

^{ab}**T**>, we can produce another model in which

^{ab}**T**and

^{ab}**g**have been altered by the diffeomorphism

^{ab}*h**: <

*M*,

*h**

**g**,

^{ab}*h**

**T**>. This new model is also a valid solution of Einstein's equations, but it describes a model in which the location of the metrical structures and material fields of

^{ab}**T**and

^{ab}**g**have been given different locations on the manifold. (They have been "shifted around", one might say, on the space-time manifold.) It is easy to construct a diffeomorphism

^{ab}*h**that shifts the locations of

**T**and

^{ab}**g**only

^{ab}*after*some global time-slice

*t*= 0 (at least, in models that admit such slices -- i.e., the GTR equivalent of our familiar “state of the world at time

*t*= 0.”).

6. Quantum mechanics
describes physical systems by means of states that are, notoriously, in
some sense incomplete, a charge leveled against the theory by Einstein,
Podolsky and Rosen in their famous 1935 essay “Can the Quantum
Mechanical Description of Reality Be Considered Complete?”. This
is most commonly illustrated by appeal to the Heisenberg Uncertainty
Principle (in one of its forms): if the position of a particle is
specified precisely, then its momentum must be unknown (i.e., described
by a state such that the probabilities of the particle having a certain
momentum are spread out over a wide range of possible values), and
vice-versa. Quantum mechanics as normally interpreted says that these
states are as complete a description as one can possibly get. A
*hidden variable theory* however postulates the existence of
determinate values for system-variables such as position and momentum,
despite their being “hidden” from quantum mechanics itself.
Einstein believed that ultimately we would find such a theory; David
Bohm did precisely that, in 1952 (see below, main article).

7. There are theorems proving that for certain kinds of Hamiltonians (including most of those that may be considered physically realistic), the evolution of the wavefunction under the Schrödinger equation is deterministic. The theorems have other antecedent conditions that may be considered restrictive, however, and see J. Norton, "A Quantum Mechanical Supertask," Foundations of Physic, 29 (1999), 1265-1302 for a case in which determinism breaks down. [I thank an anonymous referee for drawing my attention to these points.]

8. In the 1980s the physicists Girardi, Rimini and Weber developed a revised version of QM that incorporates a physically well-defined collapse mechanism. Their theory solves certain interpretive problems in QM but has remaining difficulties; it is an indeterministic theory.

9. Here I am not
referring to the time *directions* (toward-the-past,
toward-the-future), which are certainly legitimate enough in physics
and do sometimes play important roles. Rather, I am referring to our
intuitive *ontological* division of history into the past, the
present, and the future. “The present” in particular is not
to be found in any physical theory's description of the world. And
special relativity theory undermines the traditional conception of a
non-observer-relative present (see Callender 2000).