Supplement to Common Knowledge

Rubinstein's Proof

[Note: See Definition 3.2 for the notation used in this proof.]

Let T2 denote the number of messages that Joanna's e-mail system sends, and T1 denote the number of messages that Lizzi's e-mail system sends. We might suppose that Ti appears on each agent's computer screen. If T1 = 0, then Lizzi sends no message, that is, ω1 has occurred, in which case Lizzi's unique best response is to choose A. If T2 = 0, then Joanna did not receive a message. She knows that in this case, either ω1 has occurred and Lizzi did not send her a message, which occurs with probability .51, or ω2 has occurred and Lizzi sent her a message which did not arrive, which occurs with probability .49ε. If ω1 has occurred, then Lizzi is sure to choose A, so Joanna knows that whatever Lizzi might do at ω2,

E(u2(A) | T2=0)
2(.51) + 0(.49)ε
.51 + .49ε
−4(.51) + 2(.49)ε
.51 + .49ε
  E(u2(B) | T2=0 )

so Joanna is strictly better off choosing A no matter what Lizzi does at either state of the world.

Suppose next that for all Ti < t, each agents' unique best response given her expectations regarding the other agent is A, so that the unique Nash equilibrium of the game is (A,A). Assume that T1 = t. Lizzi is uncertain whether T2 = t, which is the case if Joanna received Lizzi's tth automatic confirmation and Joanna's tth confirmation was lost, or if T2 = t − 1, which is the case if Lizzi's tth confirmation was lost. Then

μ1(T2 = t−1 | T1 = t) = z
ε + (1−ε)ε
  > ½.[1]

Thus it is more likely that Lizzi's last confirmation did not arrive than that Joanna did receive this message. By the inductive assumption, Lizzi assesses that Joanna will choose A if T2 = t−1. So

E(u1(B) | T1 = t) −4z + 2(1−z)
  = −6z + 2
  < −3 + 2
  = −1,


E(u1(A) | T1 = t) = 0

since Lizzi knows that ω2 is the case. So Lizzi's unique best action is A. Similarly, one can show that A is Joanna's best reply if T2 = t. So by induction, (A,A) is the unique Nash equilibrium of the game for every t ≥ 0.

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Peter Vanderschraaf
Giacomo Sillari <>

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