Supplement to Common Knowledge

Proof of Proposition 3.1

Proposition 3.1.
Let Ω be a finite set of states of the world. Suppose that
  1. Agents i and j have a common prior probability distribution μ(·) over the events of Ω such that μ(ω) > 0 for each ω ∈ Ω, and
  2. It is common knowledge at ω that i's posterior probability of event E is qi(E) and that j's posterior probability of E is qj(E).

Then qi(E) = qj(E).

Let M be the meet of all the agents' partitions, and let M( ω) be the element of M containing ω. Since M( ω) consists of cells common to every agents information partition, we can write

M(ω) = k Hik,

where each HikHi. Since i's posterior probability of event E is common knowledge, it is constant on M(ω), and so

qi(E) = μ(E | Hik) for all k


μ( E ∩ Hik) = qi(E) μ(Hik)

and so

μ(E ∩ M(ω))
μ(E ∩ k Hik)
μ(kE ∩ Hik)
= Σk μ(E ∩ Hik) = Σkqi(E) μ(Hik)
= qi(E)Σk μ(Hik) = qi(E) μ(k Hik)
= qi(E) μ(M(ω))

Applying the same argument to j, we have

μ(E ∩ M(ω)) = qj(E) μ(M(ω))

so we must have qi(E) = qj(E). □

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Copyright © 2013 by
Peter Vanderschraaf
Giacomo Sillari <>

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