Supplement to Common Knowledge

Proof of Proposition 2.8

Proposition 2.8.
L*N(E) ⊆ K*N(E), that is, Lewis-common knowledge of E implies common knowledge of E.

Suppose that ω ∈ L*N(E). By definition, there is a basis proposition A* such that ω ∈ A*. It suffices to show that for each m ≥ 1 and for all agents i1, i2, … , imN,

ω ∈ Ki1Ki2Kim(E)

We prove the result by induction on m. The m = 1 case follows at once from (L1) and (L3). Now if we assume that for m = k, ω ∈ L*N(E) implies ω ∈ Ki1Ki2Kik(E), then L*N(E) ⊆ Ki1Ki2Kik(E) because ω is an arbitrary possible world, so Ki1(A*) ⊆ Ki1Ki2Kik(E) by (L3). Since (L2) is the case and the agents of N are A*-symmetric reasoners,

Ki1(A*) ⊆ Ki1Ki2Kik(E)

for any ik+1N, so ω ∈ Ki1Ki2Kik(E) by (L1), which completes the induction since i1, ik+1, i2, … , ik are k + 1 arbitrary agents of N. □

Return to Common Knowledge

Copyright © 2013 by
Peter Vanderschraaf
Giacomo Sillari <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.
[an error occurred while processing this directive]