Animal Cognition

First published Tue Jan 8, 2008; substantive revision Fri May 6, 2016

The philosophical issues that relate to research on animal cognition can be categorized into three groups: foundational issues about whether non-human animals are the proper subject of psychological investigation; methodological issues about how to study animal minds; and more specific issues that arise from within the specific research programs.

While the study of animal cognition is largely an empirical endeavor, the practice of science in this area relies on theoretical arguments and assumptions — for example, on the nature of mind, communication, and rationality. If nonhuman animals don’t have beliefs, and if all cognitive systems have beliefs, then animals wouldn’t be the proper subjects of cognitive studies. If animals aren’t agents because their behavior isn’t caused by propositional attitudes, and if all cognitive systems are agents, we get the same conclusion. While there are arguments against animal minds, the cognitive scientists studying animals largely accept that animals are minded, cognitive systems. As demonstrated by the 2012 Cambridge Declaration on Consciousness, many scientists also accept animal consciousness.

Many of the research programs investigating particular cognitive capacities in different species raise philosophical questions and have implications for philosophical theories, insofar as they impose additional empirical constraints for naturalistically minded philosophers. Traditional research paradigms in animal cognition are similar to those in human cognition, and include an examination of perception, learning, categorization, memory, spatial cognition, numerosity, communication, language, social cognition, theory of mind or mindreading, causal reasoning, and metacognition.

Scientists working within any one of these areas might use very different methods, because there is no one discipline of animal cognition. For example, social cognition could be studied by a biologist who documents mutual gaze in mother-infant dyads across primate species (e.g. Matsuzawa 2006b), an ethologist interested in free-ranging canid social play behavior (e.g. Bekoff 2001), an experimental psychologist testing theory of mind in an adult symbol-trained chimpanzee (e.g. Premack & Woodruff 1978), an anthropologist observing social games in capuchin monkey communities (e.g. Perry et al. 2003), or a cognitive neuroscientist investigating neural basis of gaze-following in primates (e.g. Emery 2000). Finally, findings about the cognitive abilities of animals often play a role in debates about the moral status of animals, as well as in investigations into whether animals may engage in some sort of moral practice.

1. What is Animal Cognition?

Animal cognition research examines the processes used to generate adaptive or flexible behavior in animal species. Much of the work on animal cognition is more appropriately described by the term comparative cognition, because the processes and capacities underlying behavior are compared between species (Shettleworth 2010). In the context of animal cognition research, cognition research usually focuses on questions about the mechanisms involved in specific capacities, such as learning, memory, perception, or decision-making. Researchers also investigate animal concepts, beliefs, and thoughts. While the representational theory of mind is a common assumption among animal cognition researchers, there is also investigation into the role perception plays in animal learning, and interest in how much explanatory work can be done by nonconceptual content, sometimes inspired by work in embodied cognition (e.g. Barrett 2011). And, while cognitive processes are often contrasted with associative processes, this distinction is often challenged (e.g. Buckner 2011; Mitchell et al. 2009). As a part of cognitive science, research in animal cognition aims to uncover the different cognitive mechanisms at play across species, with the purpose of understanding the varieties of cognition, the similarities between humans and other species, and the evolution and function of cognitive processes.

2. Foundational Issues

The philosophical discussion of animal cognition has been traditionally focused on the metaphysics and epistemology of mind in creatures that do not have language. Philosophers have asked whether animals are minded or rational, and whether they have concepts or beliefs, but they have also struggled with the issue of how to answer such questions given the inherent limitations of the investigation.

The early history of western philosophy reflects a tendency to see animals as lacking rationality. Aristotle defined “human” as “the rational animal”, thus rejecting the possibility that any other species is rational (Aristotle Metaphysics). Aquinas believed that animals are irrational because they are not free (Aquinas Summa Theologica). Centuries later, Descartes defended a distinction between humans and animals based on the belief that language is a necessary condition for rational mind; on his view animals are soulless machines (Descartes Discourse on the Method). Locke agreed that animals cannot think, because words are necessary for comprehending universals (Locke Essay Concerning Human Understanding). Following in this tradition, Kant concluded that since they cannot think about themselves, animals are not rational agents and hence they only have instrumental value (Kant Lectures on Ethics).

However, there were also dissenters. Voltaire criticized Descartes’ view, claiming that we can see the animals’ minds, just as we see human minds, and it is through interacting with animals that we come to judge that they have emotions, memories, and beliefs (Voltaire Philosophical Dictionary). Hume was downright dismissive of the animal mind skeptics when he wrote “Next to the ridicule of denying an evident truth, is that of taking much pains to defend it; and no truth appears to me more evident than that beasts are endowed with thought and reason as well as man. The arguments are in this case so obvious, that they never escape the most stupid and ignorant” (Hume Treatise of Human Nature, 176).

2.1 Animal Minds

Despite Hume’s judgment about their worth, much ink has been spilled developing arguments for the existence of animal minds, which is often seen as a special version of the other minds problem. Three kinds of arguments for other species of mind are: the argument from analogy, the inference to the best explanation argument, and the argument from evolutionary parsimony.

The argument from analogy for animal minds can be formulated as:

  1. All animals I already know to have a mind (i.e., humans) have property x.
  2. Individuals of species y have property x.
  3. Therefore, individuals of species y probably have minds.

Versions of the argument differ as to what they choose as the reference property x, and how they defend the choice of reference property. The reference property could refer to any number of things, such as a general capacity (e.g. problem solving), a specific ability (e.g. language, theory of mind, tool-use), a behavior, or even brain activity (see Farah 2008 for an example of this last approach).

The argument from analogy for animal minds is in one sense stronger than the argument for other minds, insofar as the reference class is larger. Rather than starting with the introspection of one’s own mind and then generalizing to all other humans, the argument for animal minds takes as given that all humans have minds and generalizes from the human species to other species. Nevertheless, in another sense the analogical argument for animal minds is weaker, since the strength of the argument is a function of the degree of similarity between the reference class and the target class. Humans are probably more similar to one another than they are to members of another species. While some researchers working with great apes have expressed concern about the argument from analogy (Povinelli et al. 2000; Povinelli 2000), it has been pointed out that those concerns do not accurately target analogical arguments for the existence of animal minds (Allen 2002). Furthermore, recent uses of analogical argument to defend animal consciousness have been based on careful investigation into the causal powers of the reference property (Varner 2012)

The inference to the best explanation argument for animal minds rests on the claim that the existence of animal minds is a better explanation of animal behavior and physiology than those offered by other hypotheses. A version of this argument can be formulated as:

  1. Individuals of species x engage in behaviors y.
  2. The best scientific explanation for an individual engaging in behaviors y is that they have a mind.
  3. Therefore, it is likely that individuals of species x have minds.

The inference to the best explanation argument justifies the attribution of mental states to animals based on the robust predictive and explanatory power that is gained from such attributions. As the argument goes, without such attributions we would be unable to make sense of animal behaviour. This argument relies on ordinary scientific reasoning; of two hypotheses, the one that better accounts for the phenomenon is the one to be preferred. Those who offer this sort of argument for animal minds are claiming that having a mind (whatever that amounts to) better explains the observed behaviour.

While it is fair to say that most scientists working with animals think they have minds, they also have a tendency to use the inference to the best explanation strategy when they disagree about the cognitive mechanisms at play in a particular species at a particular time.

The argument from evolutionary parsimony is based on the idea that closely related species share some physical traits, and this relationship can offer evidence in favour of a mentalistic causal explanation in certain cases. This argument can be formulated differently depending on the notion of parsimony (Sober 2015). In general, such arguments suggest that the fact that we share some property with an animal is enough to establish the animal as (probably) minded if we assume (a) that we share a common ancestor with the animal and (b) that we should prefer the most parsimonious explanation of the emergence of that property (de Waal 1999; Sober 2005). However, without knowledge of the mentality of the common ancestor, such arguments offer little additional evidence (Sober 2014).

Others contemporary philosophers suggest, like Hume and Voltaire, that we don’t need arguments for other animal minds, because we directly see minds when we are interacting with them. As we cuddle with our dogs and wrestle with our cats, we see our animal companions’ minds just as clearly as we see our infants’ minds when we play with them. Relying on an argument for other minds always opens the possibility that the argument turns out to be bad, and the conclusion false. But no matter what argument we run across, we will not be able to act as though we deny those minds we see in cats, dogs, and human infants (Jamieson 1998, 2009; Searle 1994).

2.2 Anthropomorphism and Folk Psychology

Though we might agree that animals have minds, worries arise when we start to describe what those minds look like. When researchers attribute mental content to other species, they open themselves to the charge of anthropomorphism. The term “anthropomorphism” has a number of different connotations, but most generally refers to the act of attributing human traits to other animals. Sometimes the term is used to refer only to psychological traits, and sometimes it is used to refer to traits that are claimed to be uniquely human (in which case anthropomorphism is an error by definition). In recent years, there have been a number of theoretical discussions about the charge of anthropomorphism itself (including the essays in Daston & Mitman 2005; Mitchell et al. 1997; and work by Andrews 2009, Andrews & Huss 2014; Asquith 1997; Buckner 2013; Crist 1999; Fisher 1990, 1991; Keeley 2004; Kennedy 1992; Meketa 2014; Rivas & Burghardt 2002; Shettleworth 2010b; Sober 2012; Wynne 2004, 2007), and worries about the use of folk psychology in animal cognition research more specifically (Penn 2011; Andrews forthcoming).

One way of seeing an anthropomorphic error is as a category mistake, rather than as a false attribution. An anthropomorphic error must be logically false, because members of the target species are not the sorts of things to which the term can apply (Keeley 2004; Fisher 1991). However, if the charge of anthropomorphism is the charge that the attributer is making a category mistake, then the charge is being made on conceptual, rather than empirical grounds. Thus, one response to the charge of anthropomorphism is continued research, for one wouldn’t know whether a property is anthropomorphic until after the relevant research has been completed. As Sober puts it, “The only prophylactic we need is empiricism” (Sober 2005, 97).

However, Sober also argues that the empirical methodology of psychology places a greater burden of proof on animal cognition research than it does on human cognition research. He suggests that comparative psychologists accept as the null hypothesis that different cognitive mechanisms are at work in humans and animals. Given that type 1 errors (reporting a false positive and rejecting a (possibly true) null hypothesis) are taken to be more serious errors than are type 2 errors (reporting a false negative and not rejecting a null hypothesis when it is false), the practice of science results in a bias against attributing psychological traits to animals (Sober 2005).

The debate about how to interpret the results of animal studies in comparison to human studies can be viewed as a debate about an inconsistent application of what the psychologist C. Lloyd Morgan advanced as his Cannon. Morgan’s Canon states: “In no case may we interpret an action as the outcome of the exercise of a higher psychical faculty, if it can be interpreted as the outcome of the exercise of one which stands lower in the psychological scale” (Morgan 1894, 53). Though this is a longstanding rule of thumb in animal cognition research, sometimes referred to as the “principle of conservatism,” it is not a principle commonly used in human cognition research. To complicate matters, attempts to determine which psychical faculties are higher or lower, a task that Morgan’s Canon instructs a researcher to perform, have raised worries about its meaningfulness and usefulness (Allen-Hermanson 2005; Fitzpatrick 2008; Sober 2005).

Some argue that anthropomorphism is a human tendency that must be overcome in order to do good science, because it relies an unjustified generalization from linguistic humans to nonlinguistic animals. These critics suggest that animals who lack language may not even have concepts, and without language scientists are not in a position to attribute content. Since we are barred from making attributions, scientific psychology ought not engage with questions about animal mentality (e.g. Keeton 1967; Kennedy 1992; Blumberg & Wasserman 1995; Wynne 2004, 2007).

It has been noted that such arguments concern the proper methods of science, the scope of science, and how to interpret data (Keeley 2004; Bekoff & Allen 1997). As such, they are not empirical, but theoretical or methodological arguments. This can be seen in the way in which the debates sometimes result in an impasse. Those opposed to attributing mental properties to animals are accused of begging the question (Griffin 1992), by committing “reverse anthropocentrism” (Sheets-Johnstone 1992), “anthropodenial” (de Waal 1999), or “anthropectomy“ (Andrews & Huss 2014).

Such worries arise in the formulation of the null hypothesis in experimental research. Due to the standard statistical methods used in animal cognition experiments, choice of the null hypothesis in terms of an animal lacking a cognitive capacity biases the research against finding evidence in favour of that capacity (Andrews & Huss 2014; Mikhalevich 2014; Sober 2005). One concern is that researchers may have a failure of imagination when it comes to hypothesis generation; they may make an inference to the best explanation argument without considering enough plausible explanations. This reflects Kennedy’s worry when he claims that the following argument for attributing mental properties to animals rests on a false dichotomy: either animals are stimulus-response machines, or they are agents with beliefs and desires; since animals are not stimulus-response machines, they must be psychological agents (Kennedy 1992). According to Kennedy, the problem with this argument is that not all machines implement stimulus-response functions; some machines are complex and indeterministic, and if animals were machines, they would be machines of that sort (Barlow 1990; Kennedy 1992). Similar concerns are put forward by those who stress, contra Darwin, the discontinuity between humans and other animals (Penn et al. 2008).

Finally, some worry that the science of comparative cognition has been damaged by the idea that explanation of behavior in terms of species-typical predispositions rather than in terms of human-like reasoning or insight amounts to a “killjoy” explanation (Shettleworth 2010b). When one considers differences between humans and animals to be less joyful than similarities, it should not be surprising if more similarities are found. Even worse is the worry that some “human-like reasoning” postulated to explain human behavior is false, and that extraordinary behaviors performed by humans and other animals might arise out of simple processes (Andrews 2005, 2012; Barrett 2011; Buckner 2013; Penn et al. 2008; Shettleworth 2010b; de Waal & Ferrari 2010). The idea that human cognitive capacities are often exaggerated and over-intellectualized is inspired by work in various fields, including approaches in cognitive science that focus on the power of simple rules and the emergence of complex behavior in self-organizing systems, emergent properties, mental representation, artificial life, robotics, as well as situated, distributed and dynamical approaches to cognition, the heuristics and biases literature in social cognition, as well as dual-process accounts of cognitive architecture. Buckner calls the error of comparing animal cognitive capacities against an exaggerated picture of human cognitive capacities “anthropofabulation“, since it involves two errors: confabulating human cognitive mechanisms plus anthropocentrism (Buckner 2013).

The concerns about anthropomorphism appear to be largely limited to western scientists. It has been argued that researchers from countries with a Buddhist rather than Christian orientation are not culturally encouraged to see a categorical distinction between humans and nonhuman animals (Asquith 1991; Sakura 1998; Matsuzawa 2003; de Waal 2003). Unlike Christianity, the Buddhist doctrine does not claim that humans, but not animals, have immortal souls, and thus it does not allow humans to use animals for their own purposes in the ways Christianity does. The Buddhist tradition sees a connection between humans and other animals, and even states that humans can be reborn as animals. De Waal argues that the difference in cultural attitudes toward animals led Western primatologists to first reject Japanese methods, findings, and ideas; it is only recently that some of those ideas, such as Kinji Imanishi’s claim that primates display cultural differences within species, have made their way into Western scientific discourse (de Waal 2003).

2.3 Rationality

Rational actions are actions that fits together in some way. While often thought of as the result of logical reasoning, rational action might also be understood as teleological, causal, or probabilistic. For a collection of essays on rationality across species see Hurley & Nudds (2006).

The Stoic philosopher Chrysippus suggested that we can see logical reasoning in animal behavior in his story about the dog who, running nose to the ground, tracked a rabbit down a path. When the dog arrives at a three-way crossroads, he quickly sniffs the first two paths, and not finding the scent in either of the first two options, immediately runs down the third path, without sniffing first. This story suggests that Chrysippus’ dog was able to make a rational inference of the form:

  1. A or B or C.
  2. Not A.
  3. Not B.
  4. Therefore, C.

However, the dog may have solved the problem without full-blown logical reasoning. Minimal theories of rationality offer alternatives.

Some minimal theories of rationality stem from evolutionary thought. For example, on Fred Dretske’s view, even some simple learned behaviors, such as a bird’s avoiding eating a monarch butterfly, can be construed as minimally rational. Because monarchs who eat toxic milkweed become toxic to birds and other predators, when a bird learns not to eat monarch butterflies after having formed an association between eating monarchs and vomiting, it has a reason for its avoidance behavior. The birds also have a reason to avoid eating a viceroy, given that it is visually almost indistinguishable from a monarch, though not poisonous. The behavior in both cases is explained by the content of the bird’s thought (or “thought”), and for Dretske this is sufficient for the bird to count as a minimally rational agent (1988, 2006). Other theories of rationality that take evolutionary considerations into account include those of Daniel Dennett (1995, 1987), Ruth Millikan (2004, 2006), and Joelle Proust (1999, 2006).

Causal accounts of animal rational action portray the animal as engaging in causal, rather than propositional reasoning. José Bermúdez argues that not all animal action can be explained merely in terms of minimal rationality or teleology (2003, 2006). Rather, there are some behaviors that can only be explained in terms of propositional attitudes, informational states, or generalizations that go beyond the here and now. However, since animals cannot engage in metacognition by thinking thoughts about thoughts, they cannot have the concepts of inference needed for logical reasoning. Rather, we can describe their reasoning process in causal terms. Consider a gazelle who see a lion and then runs away. Gazelles can understand that lions cause them to run, and that since there is a lion here I run. This causal understanding is developed through experience with regularities in the environment, and while they are able to generalize to a certain extent, this ability is limited.

Probabilistic accounts of animal rationality also are used to explain complex animal behavior. For example, as an explanation of the Chrysippus’ dog case, Michael Rescorla suggests that the dog could have employed Bayesian reasoning, and can form and update probabilities given changes in perceptual information (Rescorla 2009). Predictive coding models of cognition that do not rely on the linguistic processing model associated with the computational theory of mind may be used to explain animal behavior as rational on par with human rationality.

Rationality in other species has been explored in experimental and naturalistic studies. Psychologists have formally tested animals in Chrysippus dog type situations. For example, great apes appear to engage in exclusion reasoning, when they know that one of two opaque containers are baited with food, and are shown that the empty one is empty, they will immediately reach for the second container, without looking inside (Call 2004, 2006; Marsh and Macdonald 2011; Erdőhegyi et al. 2007). There is evidence that monkeys, corvids, and dogs also can, in some cases, choose by exclusion.

Certain naturalistic behaviors also suggest rational thought, given that they appear to be cases of problem solving that rely on cognitive flexibility and learning. Tool use, for example, is a behavior that suggests rational thinking. Because tool use involves finding or constructing an object that is utilized as an extension of the body to achieve a specific goal, tool use involves identifying a problem, considering ways of solving the problem, and realizing that other objects can be used in the manipulation of the situation. Early experimental research on chimpanzee problem solving by the German psychologist Wolfgang Köhler had chimps constructing tools to acquire out-of-reach objects; it was reported that chimpanzees would stack boxes or put together tubes to form a long rod in order to reach bananas hung overhead (Köhler 1925). Given this behavior, Köhler suggested that chimpanzees solve some problems not by trial and error or stimulus-response association, but through a flash of insight. (But see Povinelli (2000) for a critique of the contemporary interpretation of Köhler’s research).

Naturalistic studies of tool use in animals took off in the 1960s, when two independent research teams in Tanzania observed chimpanzees making and using tools. Goodall found chimpanzees in Gombe using grasses and twigs to fish for termites, and she observed chimpanzees modifying twigs by stripping off their leaves so they could be used for this purpose (Goodall 1986). Around the same time, Kinji Imanishi’s team found chimpanzees using rocks to crack nuts in the Mahale forest, about 200 miles away from Goodall’s research site (Nishida 1990).

We now know that chimpanzees make and use tools for a number of different purposes. Chimpanzees at Fongoli, Senegal manufacture spears in four or more steps in order to hunt bush babies (Preutz & Bertolani 2007). Chimpanzees at Bossou, Guinea, use large branches from palm-oil trees to crack open the tree from its crown in order to gain access to a rich food source (Yamakoshi & Sugiyama 1995). Chimpanzees also construct and use sets of tools that they subsequently utilize in a determinate order; Goualougo chimpanzees will manufacture a perforating tool to enlarge holes in a termite nest after an unsuccessful fishing attempt; as soon as the exit hole is enlarged, the chimpanzee then inserts a fishing probe (Sanz and Morgan 2007). Chimpanzees also use tool composites, such as a hammer and anvil, to crack nuts (Nishida 1990; Sakura & Matsuzawa 1991) and they manufacture stone tools (Carvalho et al. 2008).

Tool use in the wild has been discovered across taxa, including invertebrates such as the octopus, birds, fish, amphibians, reptiles, non-primate mammals, monkeys, and great apes (Shumaker et al. 2011). Reports of animal tool use offer evidence in favor of the claim that some animal behavior is functionally rational, in the sense that its behavior allows the animal to achieve a goal. Furthermore, it is perhaps the result of an evolutionary adaptation. However, the extent to which such evidence addresses the question of whether the behavior is rational is going to depend on one’s view about the nature of rationality.

2.4 Belief

The question of whether animals have beliefs is also difficult to answer given the lack of theoretical agreement about the nature of belief. The most common view is that belief is a representational state, and that the mental representation, which fixes content, expresses propositional content. For some, this view is consistent with animal belief, since they believe that, like humans, animals can operate in a Language of Thought (Fodor 1975; Cheney & Seyfarth 2007; Tetzlaff & Ray 2009). Some representationalists have suggested that animals might have representational belief that cannot be expressed propositionally (Bermúdez 2003; Camp 2009; Rescorla 2009). For example, Camp suggests that some beliefs are based on imagistic representational systems, such as diagrams or maps, and that such systems can account for baboon social knowledge, so there is no need to posit a baboon language of thought (Camp 2009; in response to Cheney & Seyfarth 2007). While Cheney and Seyfarth claim that the baboon cognitive system is vehicled by a language of thought given its nature as representational, discrete-valued, hierarchically structured, rule-governed, open-ended, and independent of sensory modality, Camp argues that the inference is not warranted, since non-sentential representational systems can also have such features. Baboons can have beliefs without having beliefs with propositional content. Bermúdez also argues that animals have non-propositional beliefs, because some animal behavior is only explicable in terms of beliefs and desires. However, Bermúdez denies that animal belief has any structure; rather, on his account animal beliefs are simple imagistic representations of things in the world that permit some thoughts about others’ goals and perceptions (Bermúdez 2003). The view that animals can have perceptual beliefs that ought not be understood in terms of propositional attitudes has also been defended by Glock (2000, 2010).

Representationalists of all sorts point out the limitations in the different kinds of representational systems. Camp, who defends the claim that maps have a rich syntactic structure, admits some limitations: mental maps do not seem to be able to accommodate some first order thoughts such as non-specific existentially quantified propositions or universally quantified propositions, or any second-order thoughts (Camp 2007). Like Camp, Bermúdez defends the position that, while animals can think, they cannot hold beliefs about beliefs, but he denies that imagistic thought has syntactic structure, and hence he concludes that animals are not logical thinkers (Bermúdez 2003, 2009). Carruthers also argues that, while even insects have beliefs (Carruthers 2004), there is no evidence that any nonhuman species has metacognitive abilities (Carruthers 2008). Carruthers suggests that the evidence from animal behavior supports the position that belief, like desire, comes in degrees (Carruthers 2008).

For others, the lack of an external language (and the lack of an error theory to account for why animals would have a language of thought while lacking external language) suggests that animals do not have beliefs at all (Dennett 1996; Davidson 1982, Stich 1978). Donald Davidson has offered an argument against animal rationality based on an association between concepts, beliefs, and language. On Davidson’s view, believers must have the concept of belief, because in order to have a belief, one must recognize that beliefs can be true or false, and one cannot understand objective truth without understanding the nature of beliefs. In order to develop an understanding of objective truth, one must be able to triangulate with others, to talk to others about the world, and hence all believers must be language users. Since other species lack language, they do not have beliefs (Davidson 1982). Davidson also argues against animal beliefs based on the claim that having a notion of error is necessary for counting as a believer (Davidson 1975). These arguments have been widely discussed in the literature.

A different argument against animal belief has been presented by Stephen Stich, who argues that we cannot attribute propositional attitudes to animals in any metaphysically robust sense, given our inability to attribute content to an animal’s purported belief (Stich 1978). On Stich’s view, if attribution of belief to animals is understood purely instrumentally, then animals have beliefs. However, if attribution of beliefs to animals requires that we can accurately describe the content of those beliefs, then animals don’t have beliefs. In response to Armstrong’s suggestion that we can fix the content of animal belief de re (Armstrong 1973), Stich argues that we cannot make de re attributions because this would violate the truth-preserving role of attribution. In addition, because “nothing we could discover would enable us to attribute content to an animal’s belief” (Stich 1978, 23), we are unable to make de dicto attributions to other species. Hence, we can make no attribution, and if we can’t say what an animal’s belief is about, it makes no sense to say that an animal has a belief. The worry here is similar to the worry about anthropomorphism; when we use our language to ascribe content to other species, we may be attributing to them more than is appropriate. Stich is concerned that when we say “Fido believes there is a meaty bone buried in the backyard” we are attributing to Fido concepts he cannot possibility have, concepts like “backyard” which are only comprehensible if one has corresponding concepts such as “property line”, “house”, “fence”, and so on. Stich’s argument can be formulated as:

  1. In order for something to have a belief, it must have a concept.
  2. In order to have a concept, one must have particular kinds of knowledge, including knowledge of how the concept relates to other concepts.
  3. Non-human animals don’t have such knowledge.
  4. Therefore, non-human animals don’t have beliefs.

There are at least three ways to respond the arguments that beliefs require concepts which require language. One can deny the necessary connection between concepts and language, as we saw above; also, as we will see in the next section some argue that concepts can be had by individuals who lack language (Allen & Hauser 1996; Allen 1999; Glock 2010). A second is to deny the necessary connection between beliefs and concepts; given nonconceptual content, belief may be possible without having concepts (Bermúdez 2003; Glock 2010). A third path is to be an instrumentalist about belief, such that being able to attribute content that allows for successful predictions of behavior is sufficient for having belief, even in the absence of language (Dennett 1995), or by attributing propositional content that tracks the content of animal minds (Rowlands 2012). One may go so far as to argue that beliefs need not be understood in terms of mental representations. In addition, given that some theories of content determination do not rely on linguistic abilities (e.g. teleological, causal), one may attempt to sidestep the kinds of concerns raised by Davidson and Stich by adopting such accounts.

2.5 Concepts

While some philosophers defend the metaphysical claim that natural language is necessary for having concepts (Brandom 1994, Davidson 1975, Dummett 1993), and while others defend the epistemic claim that that language possession is a necessary condition for identifying concepts (Stich 1978), empirical research in animal cognition suggests that both views may be mistaken. Researchers seek to uncover the nature of animal concepts both de re and de dicto using a variety of methods.

One of the earliest methods for examining animal concepts came out of a series of experiments with pigeons. The subjects were shown photographs, and were trained to peck at the pictures that contained a target object, such as a tree, and not respond to the pictures that didn’t contain the target object. After the training period, the pigeons were able to generalize to new photographs, pecking only at those that contained trees just as in the training set. It was suggested that this sorting ability demonstrates that the pigeon has a concept of the target object (Herrnstein 1979; Herrnstein et al. 1976).

Many reject the idea that being able to sort objects is sufficient for having a concept corresponding to the sortal, since humans can sort objects while lacking the corresponding concept. As Colin Allen and Marc Hauser put it, “It is possible to teach a human being to sort distributors from other parts of car engines based on a family resemblance between shapes of distributors. But this ability would not be enough for us to want to say that the person has the concept of a distributor” (Allen & Hauser 1996, 51).

Rather than identifying concept acquisition with sorting behavior, Allen and Hauser suggest alternative methodologies for identifying concepts in other species. For example, they offer a possible (though, they admit, ethically untenable) test for a death concept among vervet monkeys (Allen & Hauser 1996). Vervet mothers are capable of recognizing the alarm cries of their infants, and when they hear such a cry the mother will look towards her infant, and the other females will look towards the mother. Allen and Hauser suggest that playing a recording of a recently deceased infant’s alarm cry would help to determine whether vervets have a concept of death. If the mother responds to these recordings in an atypical fashion, unlike the usual response made to a living infant, that response provides evidence that vervet monkeys have the concept of death. According to Allen and Hauser, having a concept permits different responses to identical stimuli. The actual sound of the infant’s alarm cry during life is identical to the sound played back after death. If the response to this stimulus is different, this is evidence that there has been a conceptual change associated with the stimulus. Allen presents the general strategy for attributing concepts to animals as follows: “An organism O may reasonably be attributed a concept of X (e.g. TREE) whenever:

  1. O systematically discriminates some Xs from some non-Xs; and
  2. O is capable of detecting some of its own discrimination errors between Xs and non-Xs; and
  3. O is capable of learning to better discriminate Xs from non-Xs as a consequence of its capacity”(Allen 1999, 37).

Another method for studying animal concepts comes from research on human infants (Hauser et al. 1996; Hauser & Carey 1998; Bermúdez 2003; Gómez 2005, Uller 2004). The preferential looking time paradigm, also known as the dishabituation paradigm, is used to study human infants’ understanding of the physical and social world (Baillargeon & DeVos 1991; Spelke 1991). Dishabituation experiments are thought to help us understand what kinds of predictions infants make about their world, and this information can help us determine how they see the world. The methodology is simple; an infant is repeatedly shown a stimulus, and as soon as he becomes habituated to the stimulus, the infant becomes disinterested. At this point, a new stimulus is shown. If the infant sees the new stimulus as different from the target stimulus, or impossible given the target stimulus, the infant will look longer at the new stimulus. If the infant takes the new stimulus to be similar to the target stimulus, then she will not show any additional interest. The idea is that by comparing responses among groups of individuals, a researcher can learn something about how that group conceptualizes the world. Bermúdez argues that such methods can be used to make de dicto ascriptions to animals (Bermúdez 2003 b).

In one study using this method, Marc Hauser and colleagues investigated numerical concepts in different primate species, including rhesus monkeys (Hauser et al. 1996) and cotton-top tamarins (Uller 1997). The researchers tested the monkeys’ ability to keep track of individual objects placed behind a barrier. They found that, like human infants, the monkeys look longer at impossible outcomes. For example, in one test condition the rhesus monkeys were shown two eggplants serially placed behind a screen, and then the screen was lifted showing only one eggplant. The monkeys looked longer at the one eggplant than they did when shown the two eggplants, suggesting that they represent the eggplants as distinct sortals.

Another way we might learn how different species organize the world is to teach individuals a symbolic communication system. For example, the biologist Irene Pepperberg trained an African Grey parrot named Alex to sort objects using meta-level concepts that categorize other concepts. Alex was able to sort objects according to color, shape, and matter, and he was able to sort sets of objects according to number. In addition to sorting, Alex could report which feature makes two objects similar or different. For example, when presented with a red block and a red key, Alex responded to the question “What’s same?” by uttering “color.” He could also report similarities and differences in shape and matter. Pepperberg claims that her studies demonstrate Alex’s understanding of categorical concepts, and reveal the classifications that Alex devised (Pepperberg 1999). However, one might be worried that the concepts exhibited by symbol-trained animals are an artifact of the communication system, and not typical of the species.

Finally, animal concepts are also being studied in the field, where the concepts’ usefulness to animals may be more apparent. Through careful observation and field experiments of wild individuals, researchers are examining the natural concepts different species may use in order to categorize events in their social and physical environment. For example, primatologists observed that Diana monkeys have acoustically distinct alarm calls for different predators, and that the female alarm calls differ from the male (Zuberbühler et al. 1997; Zuberbühler et al. 1999). This natural difference allowed Zuberbühler and colleagues to set up a field experiment with the purpose of determining whether the male and female alarm calls mean the same thing to the monkeys. He found that they treated the acoustically different calls as synonyms. Such evidence suggests that researchers can identify at least some animals’ concepts “de re”.

Social knowledge offers a window for field researchers who investigate animal concepts. Cheney and Seyfarth argue that primate behavior relies on a rich body of social knowledge, and that this knowledge suggests that primates have conceptual understanding (Cheney & Seyfarth 2009, 2015). Taking the case of baboons, we know that they recognize individuals, classify them into groups according to properties including close social bonds, kinship, dominance ranks, and transient sexual relations. For example, knowledge of kinship is demonstrated in instances of kin-mediated reconciliation, when an antagonistic encounter is resolved by a kin of the aggressor giving a reconciliation grunt. This categorical information informs baboon behavior. In addition, some of these relationships change over time, and can have widespread repercussions over the group dominance organization. Baboons are able to quickly make adjustments about linear dominance ranks after a rank reversal, even when the reversal affects different matrilines and causes changes in the rank relationship of several individuals. Cheney and Seyfarth argue that memory and classical conditioning alone cannot account for the richness of primate social knowledge, given the amount information primates would have to represent — they claim that a baboon would have to learn thousands of dyadic relations, and tens of thousands of triadic relations in order to anticipate other animals’ behavior. In addition to worries about the space needed to represent all those relations, they point out that the speed of baboon behavior in response to a complex problem is not consistent with the hypothesis that baboons solve social problems by searching through a humongous and unstructured database of relations. Rather, Cheney and Seyfarth suggest that baboons and other primates with complex social societies organize individuals into rule-governed classes, or concepts. This, they argue, is an adaptive strategy (Cheney & Seyfarth 2009).

While much of the discussion has focused on whether animals have concepts and how concepts can be identified, it has also been argued that the animal evidence suggests that we may better represent cognitive diversity and individual complexity by considering that there are different kinds of representations, and not all of them are conceptual. Some animal behaviors may rely on nonconceptual content which permits flexible behavior but does not require the ability to identify objects, while other behaviors rely on perception-based concepts and even propositional content (e.g. in the case of symbol-trained apes) (Newen & Bartels 2007).

The idea that if we can’t say what animals think, then animals don’t have beliefs has been challenged by appealing to nonconceptual content. Jacob Beck (2013) suggests that we cannot say what an animal thinks because animals think in a nonlinguistic format. Just as a painting can have content without having content that is expressible in language, animals may have content that is not expressible in language. Furthermore, humans may share some of this content with animals, and so we could share beliefs with an animal if we think in the same nonlinguistic format about the same thing. The nonlinguistic format may be an analog one, rather than in a digital format such as language. Analogue formats do not permit analysis in terms of how meaningful parts fit together to make a meaningful whole, the way language does. Instead, analogue formats have their meaning holistically, but like a photograph analog representations come in degrees of focus. Examples of analog content include pictures, images, and maps, and since we cannot translate from such representations to a sentence (Beck asks us to consider how to translate the Mona Lisa into English!), we won’t be able to translate animal representations into language. But animals can still have representations, just as the Mona Lisa still exists despite the fact that it is untranslatable. Beck provides an example of nonconceptual content shared by humans and animals in the case of analogue magnitude states, which are representations of approximate number (Beck 2012). Humans and other species can make judgments about greater or lesser arrays of objects so long as the ratio is large enough. Beck argues that these approximate number representations cannot be accurately expressed in sentences, and concludes that this offers evidence in favor of non-conceptual content for animals and humans alike. Analogue magnitudes are examples of perceptual representational states, which do not have the same logical properties as sentential representational states.

3. The Science of Animal Cognition

Today, no one discipline has a monopoly on the study of animal cognition. Psychology, biology, anthropology, animal welfare, philosophy, animal studies, and other programs all include researchers working on animal cognition. Just as no one discipline has an exclusive focus on animal cognition, there is no one method that characterizes research in animal cognition. While early scientific interest in animal behavior was approached differently by the psychologists, who focused on using laboratory experiments to uncover mechanisms, and ethologists, who used observational methods to uncover the evolution of behavior, today many scientists approach the study of animal cognition by using a combination of methods.

3.1 Early Anecdotal Method

Contemporary scientific interest in animal minds and cognitive capacities is often traced back to Charles Darwin’s theory of evolution by natural selection. In The Descent of Man, Darwin introduced many of the issues that motivate the research programs in animal cognition today, including tool use, reasoning, learning, concepts, consciousness, social cognition, artistic abilities, and moral cognition. In addition, Darwin anticipated current interest in implicit reasoning with his comment “The savage would certainly neither know nor care by what law the desired movements were effected; yet his act would be guided by a rude process of reasoning, as surely as would a philosopher in his longest chain of deductions” (Darwin 1974, 75).

Like Aristotle centuries before him, Darwin advocated the continuity of the mental across species; just as some morphological characteristics are homologous across species living in similar environments, we should expect psychological and behavioral similarities as well: “the difference in mind between man and the higher animals, great as it is, certainly is one of degree and not of kind” (Darwin 1974, 122). This view was also advocated by Darwin’s contemporary, the naturalist George Romanes, who in his book Animal Intelligence writes “there must be a psychological, no less than a physiological, continuity extending throughout the length and breadth of the animal kingdom” (Romanes 1970, 10). Darwin’s view about continuity across species has been challenged on several dimensions, from the notion that language or culture plays a fundamental role in the evolution of cognition to worries about anthropomorphism (for discussions see Andrews & Radenovic 2012; Penn et al. 2008; Shettleworth 2010b).

The method that Darwin, Romanes and their contemporaries first used to investigate these questions could be described as the anecdotal method. Stories about animal behavior were collected from a variety of people, including military officers, amateur naturalists, and layfolk, and were compiled and used as evidence for a particular cognitive capacity in that species. This approach was widely criticized. The “evidence” gathered was often a story told about an event witnessed by a single person, usually not a trained scientific observer. In addition, these stories were often acquired second- or third- hand, so there were worries that the reports had been embellished or otherwise altered along the way. These problems were recognized early on, and in response Romanes developed three principles for accepting anecdotes in order to avoid some of these problems:

  1. Never accept an incident report as fact without considering the authority or respectability of the observer.
  2. If the observer isn’t known, and the incident report is sufficiently important, consider whether the observer may have reason or cause to make an inaccurate report.
  3. Look for corroborations of the observation by examining similar or analogous observations made by other independent observers (Romanes 1970).

The third principle was the one he most relied on, writing “This principle I have found to be a great use in guiding my selection of instances, for where statements of fact which present nothing intrinsically improbable are found to be unconsciously confirmed by different observers, they have as good a right to be deemed trustworthy as statements which stand on the single authority of a known observer, and I have found the former to be at least as abundant as the latter” (Romanes 1970, ix).

Despite Romanes’ attempts, the method remained problematic insofar as it didn’t provide any statistical information about the frequency of such behaviors; selection bias would lead people to report only the interesting intelligent behaviors and ignore the frequency of behaviors that might serve as counterevidence. Thus, the anecdotal method as practiced by Darwin and Romanes lacks many of the virtues associated with good scientific methods.

Though the early anecdotal method has been rejected, some researchers argue that anecdotes play an important role in animal cognition research (Bates & Byrne 2007), and observation of behavior is still considered a valuable research tool, as we will see below.

3.2 Experimental Methods

The British biologist and psychologist C. Lloyd Morgan, who is often credited with the rise of contemporary animal cognition methods, was critical of Romanes’ methods. He noted that animal behaviors that are interesting to us could be caused in various ways, which makes the search for mechanisms causing behavior the important task for an animal psychologist. Morgan asked us to consider the example of Tony, a fox-terrier pup who was able to open the gate from his garden and escape into the road. Tony succeeded at this task by putting his head under the latch of the gate, then lifting the latch and waiting for the gate to swing open. Morgan suggests one might interpret Tony’s behavior in terms of him having a goal and knowing how to achieve that goal, but because there are other interpretations, it would be too hasty to draw that conclusion. Perhaps instead Tony was responding to the visual affordances of the gate, seeing the latch as liftable without having the goal to get out of the garden. A third possibility is that was using general reasoning principles to open the gate, and Tony’s general knowledge was applied to this specific situation. It is only this third interpretation that Morgan categorizes as rational, given his view that rational thought is conceptual thought that permits analysis via general principles.

Morgan concludes that Tony’s behavior ought not be interpreted as rational because Tony’s behavior is fairly interpreted as not requiring that he forms some mental concept of how to solve the task. This case serves as an example of Morgan’s canon: “in no case is an animal activity to be interpreted in terms of higher psychological processes, if it can be fairly interpreted in terms of processes which stand lower in the scale of psychological evolution and development” (Morgan 1903, 292). Morgan’s Canon is an epistemic principle that advises to explain a behavior in terms of the lowest cognitive capacity possible, and Morgan thinks that reasoning in terms of sense experience is lower, and that reasoning conceptually in terms of general principles is a higher psychological process.

Despite a common interpretation of Morgan’s Canon as a behavioristic rule, Morgan was committed to the existence of animal minds. In his autobiography, he wrote, “…throughout the whole investigation, from first to last, my central interest has been psychological as I understand the meaning of this word. My aim has been to get at the mind of the chick or the dog or another, and to frame generalizations with regard to mental evolution” (Morgan 1930, 249). Furthermore, Morgan, like Romanes, advocated for the attribution of human mental activities to animals using the method of interpretation via introspection, and he noted the necessity of interpreting animal behavior. However, at the same time he cautioned us against thinking that behaviors that appear to be clever, whether human or animal behaviors, are actually clever. Morgan wrote, “To interpret animal behavior one must learn also to see one’s own mentality at levels of development much lower than one’s top-level of reflective self-consciousness. It is not easy, and savors somewhat of paradox” (Morgan 1930, 250). This commitment, which has been dubbed Morgan’s Challenge (Andrews 2015), arises from Morgan’s recognition that it is difficult for humans to follow his advice not to over-intellectualize human cognition. The error we risk by not meeting Morgan’s Challenge has been recently dubbed “anthropofabulation” by Cameron Buckner, given that the error involves looking at animals from an anthropocentric perspective and confabulating the mechanisms humans use (Buckner 2013).

The Clever Hans scandal of 1904 demonstrated Morgan’s Canon in use; Hans was a famous Russian trotting horse who charmed crowds by showing an ability to calculate mathematical problems, as well as to read German and musical notation, simply by tapping his hoof (Candland 1993; Pfungst 1965). After much investigation, the experimental psychologist Otto Pfungst found that Hans wasn’t counting or reading language, but rather he was reacting to his owner von Osten’s bodily motions. Von Osten was unconsciously cuing Hans to start and stop tapping his foot at the correct time, and Hans had merely leaned to associate von Osten’s movements with the correct behavior. Today, the legacy of Clever Hans can be seen in the control methods used during the experimental testing of an animal’s ability. For example, researchers who know the correct response will wear a welder’s mask, blackened goggles, or some other device to keep the subject from being cued by eye gaze or facial expressions. Another method is to use naive trainers during testing.

Around this time, other experimental psychologists in the United States and Russia were interested in uncovering principles of learning. In the US, Edward Thorndike (1874–1949) adopted Morgan’s experimental method but rejected his appeal to introspection. Thorndike worried that introspection is unscientific, because it is unobservable and we cannot test its reliability or validity. Behavior, on the other hand, can be observed and quantified by numerous observers, so Thorndike turned toward behaviorism as a means for studying animal behavior.

Thorndike focused on the ability of animals to solve problems. In a well-known set of experiments, Thorndike placed cats in a variety of puzzle boxes, and observed the strategies the cats used to escape. When first put in a new box, the cats took a long time to find the solution, but after becoming more experienced with the box, they were able to escape much more quickly. Thorndike found that the cats improved their reaction time by ignoring the ineffective actions and performing the useful ones. This suggested to Thorndike that cats learn through trial and error, and his conclusion helped to reinforce the belief that animal behavior can be fully explained in associative terms.

While the psychologists succeeded in introducing much-needed rigor into the study of animal minds, there was some concern that they had gone too far, that the methods were too stringent, and that the drive for repeatable and controlled experiments could not be used to uncover all there is to know about the function of animal minds. For example, the ethologists thought that in order to understand animal behavior, animals must be observed in their natural environment. As sterile laboratory experiments stripped the subjects of social and environmental context, the worry arose that some studies may be ecologically invalid.

With the fall of behaviorism and the rise of cognitivism in psychology, animal cognition researchers have returned to investigating animal minds. Today there are many approaches to studying animals experimentally, in labs, zoos, dogs’ living rooms, forests, fields, and oceans. One research program coming out of Kyoto University’s Primate Research Institute (PRI) investigates chimpanzee minds by combining captive experimental research with chimpanzees in Kyoto and wild observational and experimental research with chimpanzees in Africa (Matsuzawa et al. 2006). First, the physical, cognitive, and social development of chimpanzees is taken into account in the design of experiments, and subjects are raised by their mothers rather than by human caregivers or unrelated animals. In addition, lab work and fieldwork is synthesized; field observations are used to develop experiments, and experiments are conducted both in the field and in the laboratory. Finally, the method includes analysis of the physiological and biological features of the species that could be related to cognitive abilities.

The experimental research at PRI uses what they call the “participant observation” method, which is based on the triadic social relationship between mother, infant, and experimenter. When testing chimpanzees in the lab, they are never taken from their natural social environment; rather, the experiments are brought into the social environment. As a researcher becomes a member of that social environment, she can run experiments that are woven into normal daily activities. At PRI, a different researcher is bonded with each mother-infant dyad, and the relationship is expected to last a lifetime. This close relationship between human and chimpanzee is thought to offer many benefits. It makes the chimpanzees more willing to engage in the research activities, so the researcher can gain a better understanding of what chimpanzees can and cannot do (rather than what they are willing or not willing to do). In addition, Matsuzawa claims that the participant observation method fares better at investigating species-typical social cognition than isolated experiments on single subjects, because the PRI chimpanzees are not integrated into a human social environment, but the researchers themselves adapt to the chimpanzee social environment (Matsuzawa 2006a). Finally, the bond between researcher and subject allows the human to interact with his chimpanzee “research partners” at a younger age, given the relation of trust between researcher and mother. Mother and infant can be taught a task together, which can help to illuminate developmental differences in particular abilities. For example, Inoue and Matsuzawa reported that infant chimpanzees are better able to recall strings of numerals in order than adult chimpanzees and humans (Inoue & Matsuzawa 2007).

Another way to avoid the worry about the ecological validity of experiments is to perform them in the animal’s natural environment. In field experiments, researchers intervene in the natural environments of their subjects, rather than in a laboratory. One kind of field experiment is the playback experiment, in which researchers play an audio recording of an animal call in order to test the behavioral responses to the call in various contexts. Cheney and Seyfarth describe the structure of playback experiments as follows: researchers first collect recordings of various calls given by different individuals. Then, they examine the responses of the subject when a recording of some individual’s call is amplified by a hidden loudspeaker (the individual whose call is being played is generally out of sight in such experiments). The subject is video recorded before and after the playback. These experiments can be used to test how the same subject responds to two different calls played in the same context, as well as how the subject responds to the same call played in different contexts (Cheney & Seyfarth 2007). Playback experiments have been used in many contexts across species; for example, such experiments have shown that vervet monkeys respond differently to different alarm calls given for different predators (Seyfarth et al. 1980), that baboons grunt to reconcile after a fight (Cheney et al. 1995), and that baboons reconcile after a relative of the aggressor grunts (Wittig et al. 2007a). Playback experiments also suggest that bottlenose dolphins recognize the signature whistle of their relatives (Sayigh et al. 1998; Janik et al 2006), and that great male tits differ on personality dimensions (Amy et al. 2010).

3.3 Observational Methods

While early psychologists were performing animal behavior experiments in the laboratory, ethologists such as Oskar Heinroth, Konrad Lorenz, Nikolaas Tinbergen, and Karl von Frisch were following animals into the field to observe naturally occurring behavior. The ethological method comes from biology, and takes into account not only the behavior, but also the context of behavior, the environment, and the physiology and evolutionary history of the animal. However, at least initially, the ethologists were less interested in cognitive mechanisms than were the experimentalists. Classical ethology gave birth to a number of different fields of study. Behavioral ecology developed into a unique field oriented towards determining how a behavior evolved and the functions of that behavior (Krebs & Daies 1993; Wilson 1975). Cognitive ethology was born as a field focused on animal consciousness (Griffin 1984, 1985, 1992), though in this literature consciousness is as much of a focus as beliefs, intentions, self-awareness, deception, and theory of mind. Griffin’s use of the word “consciousness” belies his greater interest in cognition, given that most of the topics he discusses (e.g. perception, memory, spatial cognition, language, tool use etc.) are cognitive (Griffin 1992). Today few researchers welcome the cognitive ethology label (Allen 2004; Shettleworth 2010a). Rather, we witness an integration of the experimental and ethological approaches to studying cognition by scientists in psychology, biology, and anthropology, among other fields (Shettleworth 2010a). Some now use the term “cognitive ecology” to refer to the study of cognitive processes in an animals’ natural environment (Healy & Braithwaite 2000; Real 1993).

In the early days of ethology, Lorenz and Tinbergen were interested in analyzing the complex and rigid set of movements that make up a single act. They postulated that such movements, which they called fixed action patterns, are innate and caused by the existence of a releasing mechanism that responds to some external sensory stimulus. Ethologists study such acts at various organizational levels, e.g. at the individual, dyad, family group, and species levels (Menzel 1969). To explain behavior, ethologists follow Tinbergen’s suggestion that we can distinguish between explanations in terms of proximate causes, such as mechanism and function, and ultimate causes, such as ontogeny (the maturational processes involved in the behavior) and evolution (Tinbergen 1963).

But before an explanation for some behavior can be found, the behavior must be well understood in the context of species-normal behavior. Thus, the ethologist will begin the study of a species by constructing an ethogram from field notes taken after many hours of observation (Brown 1975; Lehner 1996). An ethogram is a thorough catalogue of the characteristic behavioral units of a species, and each unit is given a verbal description and perhaps an image. Theoretical debates arise over the issue of how an ethogram should label and describe behavioral units. Behaviors can be described formally, and describe the action at the level of muscular contractions, or patterns of bodily movements (e.g. beak pecks ground). On the other hand, an ethogram could describe behaviors functionally, and place the behavior in a larger context by referring to the purpose or consequence of the behavior (e.g. eats) (Hinde 1970).

There are criticisms of both functional and formal methods of description. Formal descriptions may leave out important aspects of an animal’s behavior, whereas functional descriptions are subject to over-interpretation and may lead to anthropomorphism, and they may conflate explanations in terms of ultimate and proximate causes (see Allen & Bekoff 1997 for a discussion). Millikan (1993) and Allen and Bekoff (1997) provide philosophical defenses of relying on functional descriptions in ethology. While Millikan has claimed that ethologists should only be concerned with behavior as functionally described, Allen and Bekoff argue that the choice between a functional and formal description will vary on the context, depending on which is more useful. In many cases, functional descriptions will be preferred because of the advantages Hinde (1970) has identified. For one, behavior described functionally will result in fewer data sets, making for more robust data analysis. In addition, descriptions in terms of function are more informative than formal ones, given that they include information about the cause of the behavior or its consequence. Finally, behavioral changes can be described in terms of environmental changes.

However an ethologist decides to describe behaviors, the question of how to individuate a behavior arises (Russon et al. 2007; Skinner 1935). Descriptions of behavior can be finely grained, and refer to the specifics of a behavior, e.g. using a stone (or a leaf cup, or chewed leaves, or a hand, or fur, etc.) for drinking water from a river. On the other hand, behaviors can be roughly grained into larger behavioral units, e.g. using a drinking tool. If behaviors should be categorized to reflect the way the species organizes its behavior, then identifying behaviors requires first knowing the species’ internal organizational scheme (Byrne 1999; Russon et al. 2007).

While ethograms are used to record typical behaviors, many researchers also collect rare and nonstandard behaviors, as well as behaviors that just have not been observed before. These reports are often referred to as “incidents” or “qualitative reports” rather than “anecdotes”, in order to avoid the negative connotation associated with the anecdotal method of Darwin’s contemporaries. Researchers publish incidents when they indicate that a species engages in previously unknown behaviors. For example, when Jane Goodall reported seeing chimpanzee hunting and lethal intergroup aggression, the scientific image of chimpanzees had to be significantly revised (Goodall 1986). An example of a more recent observational finding suggests that juvenile chimpanzees may play with sticks in the way human children play with dolls (Kahlenberg & Wrangham 2010).

The psychologist Richard Byrne defends the scientific use of rare events as a useful research tool, writing that “careful and unbiased recording of unanticipated or rare events, followed by collation and an attempt at systematic analysis, cannot be harmful. At worst, the exercise will be superseded and made redundant by methods that give greater control; at best, the collated data may become important to theory” (Byrne 1997, 135). By sharing their incident reports, researchers have engaged in collaborative research projects to study rare or unusual behaviors, such as deception (Whiten & Byrne 1988) and innovation (van Schaik et al. 2006), and systematic study often begins with observations of spontaneous behavior (Bates & Byrne 2006; Russon & Andrews 2010, 2011; van Schaik et al. 2006).

4. Research Programs

The various research programs in animal cognition can all be seen as an attempt to uncover the underlying mechanisms involved in behavior. The functional approach aims to categorize behavior functionally (according to either ultimate or proximate function), and to discover the cognitive mechanism(s) that are use in such behaviors. The initial problem, of course, is to know whether the behavior counts as having a particular function; this is particularly troublesome when a certain function has a mechanism closely identified with it. For example, while communication understood by a biologist in terms of ultimate function is nothing more than an adaptive process of information exchange between two individuals that does not require cognition, the use of the term to describe a behavior may have Gricean implications to others, which in turn can lead to unjustified inferences about the about mechanism.

Animal behavior has been long explained in terms of what are sometimes thought to be “simple” associative learning methods such as classical and instrumental conditioning, or in terms of species-specific responses. Species-specific responses are what are sometimes called innate behaviors, but this term is problematic for a number of reasons (Bateson and Mameli 2007; Mameli & Bateson 2011), and has largely been abandoned by scientists; they refer instead to the predispositions demonstrated by typical members of the species or subset of species (e.g. the long call of the male orangutan). Associative learning comes about through experiencing relationships between events, and results in an expectation that the relationship will continue. However, the more we learn about the processes involved in building associations, and the more it seems we can do with them, the less “simple” and the more cognitive they appear to be (Carruthers 2009, De Wit & Dickinson 2009; Dickinson 2009; Rescorla 1988; Shettleworth 2010a). Other processes thought to be involved in some instances of animal behavior are transitive inference, causal learning, and path-integration. Questions arise about the nature and cognitive requirements of these processes, and their relation to associative learning.

The research programs in animal cognition are too numerous to thoroughly cover here; fortunately, there are good introductory psychology texts (e.g. Shettleworth 2010a; Wynne & Udell 2013) and biology texts (Dugatkin 2013). What follows is a brief introduction to some areas of research that have been of interest to philosophers.

4.1 Communication

Animal communication is often described as information exchange between a sender who signals a receiver. Biological approaches consider communication to occur when one animal’s behavior serves as a stimulus that causes a change in another animal’s behavior, regardless of whether the signaler’s behavior is intentional or voluntary; for example, a female chimpanzee’s genital swelling that is observed by a male who initiates a courtship is an instance of communication. In biology contexts, this is often referred to as “functional communication”.

For a discussion of contemporary theory and research in animal communication, see Ulrich E. Stegmann’s collection Animal Communication Theory: Information and Influence (2013).

4.1.1 Referential and Expressive Signals

Those who argue that animal communication systems and human language are homologous (functionally similar due to common evolutionary origin) or analogous (functionally similar with different evolutionary origins) to one another have attempted to demonstrate that some animal signals are referential in some sense. One test for referential communication is to see if the behavior is flexible by determining whether there is only a probabilistic relationship between the stimulus and response. For example, if there are different responses to different utterers (e.g. infant vs. adult, dominant vs. submissive), this is thought to demonstrate flexibility in the behavior that is suggestive of referential understanding (Evans 2002; Tomasello & Zuberbühler 2002). In addition, it is thought that referential calls will encode specific information about the predator and that animals who hear the alarm call perceive that encoded information (Evans et al. 1993a, Evans 1997).

Marler et al. (1992) offer two criteria that must be met for a signal to be functionally referential. The production criterion requires that all the stimuli that elicit the signal belong to one category, either a general category such as “aerial predators” or a more specific one such as “eagle.” The perception criterion states that the utterance of the referential signal is alone sufficient to elicit the same behavior as would be elicited by perceiving the referent (Marler et al. 1992). Given these criteria, Marler and Evans examined the anti-predator behavior of bantam chickens, and found that the chickens reliably give different alarm calls to aerial predators and ground predators (Evans et al. 1993b; Evans & Marler 1995). Because they also behave differently toward the two different predators, Marler and Evans suggest that the alarm cries functionally refer to the kind of predator approaching. When a chicken emits a scream after seeing a hawk, they claim the chicken is referring to the hawk, and not simply expressing fear of the hawk, or ordering conspecifics to take cover, crouch, and look up to the sky.

Alarm calls and other communicative vocalizations that fulfill these requirements are found in many species. Gunnison’s prairie dogs, for example, give different alarm calls to humans, hawks, and dogs/coyotes. In response to the hawk alarm call, only the prairie dogs that are in the flight path of the hawk respond, running into a burrow. The human alarm call elicits a community wide flight into the burrows, whereas the dog/coyote alarm call leads all individuals to run to the edge of the burrow and stand erect (Kiriazis & Slobodchikoff 2006). Vervet monkeys also give alarm calls for different predators. Following up on the field observations of zoologist Thomas Struhsaker (1967), Cheney and Seyfarth used playbacks of prerecorded alarm calls to demonstrate that when a leopard alarm is sounded, the vervets run into trees, where they are safe from the leopards due to the monkeys’ agility in jumping from tree to tree. When an eagle alarm is sounded, monkeys look up and run into bushes. When the snake alarm is sounded, the monkeys stand bipedally and peer into the grass around them (Cheney & Seyfarth 1990). Other species found to have different alarm calls and different behavior for different species of predator include Diana monkeys (Zuberbühler 2000), Campbell’s monkeys (Zuberbühler 2001), and meerkats (Manser 2001; Manser et al. 2001). In addition, ground squirrels (Owings & Hennessy 1984), tree squirrels (Green & Meagher 1998), and dwarf mongooses (Beynon & Rasa 1989) are all known to have alarm calls that distinguish between terrestrial and aerial predators. Many other calls and gestures are thought to involve referential communication of this sort. For example, the food calls of chimpanzees are thought to indicate not only the presence of food, but also the location or quality of food (e.g. Slocombe & Zuberbühler 2005, 2006). Similar findings have been reported for chickens (Evans & Evans 2007). Bottlenose dolphins are said to refer to themselves via their signature whistle (Janik et al. 2006).

In Darwin’s The Expression of Emotions in Man and Animals, he argues that animal signals are expressions of emotions with the function of relaying the signaler’s emotional or motivational states. These signals are largely species-specific and not flexibly used. For example, Darwin describes the cat’s arching and hissing at a dog as an expression of the cat’s terror and anger (Darwin 1886, p. 56). Ethologists followed Darwin’s lead in describing animal signals as expressions of emotional or motivational state, and many ethologists thought that expressive signals were incompatible with referential ones. The assumption that animal signals are expressions of emotions led scientists to focus on questions such as whether animals communicate degree of arousal or motivation — emotional expression in analog and not just in binary, and many studies suggest that some do. However, since the 1980’s there is a growing body of evidence that undermines the assumption that there is a dichotomy between expressive signals and referential ones, and some argue that animal signals can inform receivers about both motivational state and external objects or events (Marler et al. 1992; Manser et al. 2002). For example, we can see evidence for this claim from the research on suricate alarm calls. Suricates are a variety of African mongoose known to give different alarm calls to mammalian, avian, and reptilian predators, and they respond differently to the calls depending on the degree of urgency the call demonstrates (Manser et al. 2001). In playback experiments, suricates respond qualitatively differently to the three different alarm calls, and they respond quantitatively differently to different levels of urgency within each alarm call class. For example, in response to a low urgency snake alarm recording, suricates will raise their tails, approach the loudspeaker, and sniff the area around it, but they will quickly resume their previous activity. However, if a high urgency alarm call is played, the suricates will continue the alarm response behavior for a significantly longer time.

While it is clear that human language can simultaneously refer to external events and express an individual’s feelings about those events (e.g. “Fire!” vs. “Fire?”), questions remain about the nature of reference in animal communication, and whether it is the same or different from how linguistic expressions refer. To describe a call as functionally referential is to remain agnostic about the role of cognition. Moreover, this leaves aside the question of whether the act is voluntary, intentional, or involves mental representations. Philosophical questions can be raised about the referential nature of animal signals in terms of their meaning, truth-evaluability, and the mechanisms involved. One philosophical treatment of the nature of animal alarm calls defends the view that alarm calls are best understood as neo-expressive avowals — self reports of one’s present mental state that have both an action component (the expressing) and a semantic component (the representation) (McAninch et al. 2009). Allen and Saidel suggest that empirical work can be done to determine the kinds of referential communication different species can engage in, and that such research can help us better understand the mechanisms subsuming human language (Allen & Saidel 1998). For example, one might investigate the claim that dolphin signature whistles function as proper names in relation to various theories of reference.

4.1.2 Intentional Signals

Most discussions of intentional signals in animal communication at some point come into contact with the treatment by Daniel Dennett. In his discussion of the possible meanings of vervet monkey alarm calls, Dennett provides an analysis of the levels of intentionality that may be at work (Dennett 1987). Dennett suggests that animal cognition researchers would benefit from adopting the language of folk psychology. Moreover, he claims that animals such as vervet monkeys should be viewed as intentional systems whose behaviors are predictable via attributing beliefs, desires, and rationality to them; that is, Dennett suggests that scientists should talk about animal beliefs (understood in terms of the intentional stance, of course). The question, then, is what sort of beliefs do animals have when they vocalize: do the vervets think about the effects of their calls on the others’ behaviors, or do they think about the effects of their calls on others’ epistemic states or minds?

Dennett’s view is inspired by his interpretation of H.P. Grice’s theory of meaning. For Grice, a speaker means something by an utterance x if and only if the speaker utters x with the intention that: (1) it produces a response in the intended audience, (2) that the audience recognizes the speaker’s first intention, and (3) that the audience’s recognition of the speaker’s first intention serves as a reason for the audience responding as it does (Grice 1957). Given Grice’s requirement, Dennett suggests only creatures who can hold a third-order belief (e.g., I think that she thinks that I think) will be communicators (Dennett 1987). That would entail that only creatures who mindread, that is, those who can think about others’ mental states, are able to communicate. This leaves out some cognitively diverse human adults, human infants and probably most animals.

While strong criteria for intentional communication requires third-order intentionality, lower bars can be set (Gómez 2007; Moore 2014, 2015; Sperber& Wilson 1986). Perhaps the most basic requirement for a communicative signal to be intentional is for it to be under the signaler’s voluntary control. In addition to neurobiological evidence that some animal signals are voluntary (Allen & Saidel 1998; see also articles in Platt & Ghazanfar 2010), there is behavioral evidence that animal signals can be used flexibly in ways that suggest voluntariness. Audience effects are one example of the flexibility that characterizes some signals. Roosters, for example, will alarm call more frequently in the presence of a hen than when they are alone (Evans & Marler 1995), and in the presence of a conspecific than in the presence of a bobwhite quail (Karakashian et al. 1988). Another example of apparent flexibility in controlling vocalizations comes from observations of chimpanzee border patrols, an extremely risky practice that may result in death following an intergroup encounter. As chimpanzees approach the border of a neighboring community, they become unusually silent (Mitani et al. 2002).

There is also behavioral evidence that animal signals may be context sensitive in the same way linguistic utterances are. Just as some argue that the pragmatic context of language does significant semantic work for humans (e.g. Stalnaker 1999; Sperber and Wilson 1986), both the production of and the responses to animal signals can be dependent on contextual factors. For example, while honeybee waggle dances communicate to the nest mates the location of a food source, the dance does not determine their response; if an individual remembers the location of a preferable food source, the bee may visit that source instead (Grüter et al. 2008; Grüter & Farina 2009). And, on the production side, there is experimental evidence that orangutans repeat a gesture when they are only partially understood, and will use different gestures when a message is misunderstood (Cartmill & Byrne 2007).

Michael Tomasello argues that some ape signals are examples of intentional communication, and claims that intentional signals “are chosen and produced by individual organisms flexibly and strategically for particular social goals, adjusted in various ways for particular circumstances. These signals are intentional in the sense that the individual controls their use flexibly toward the goal of influencing others” (Tomasello 2008, 14). To make an intentional signal, Tomasello thinks one must be able to flexibly use the signal, be aware of the attentional state of the communicative partner, and be able to learn the signal.

While much of the interest in animal communication has been focused on vocalizations, some believe that gestural communication may be a better place to look for intentional communication, especially in the great apes and especially if gestural theories of language evolution are correct (e.g. Corballis 2002; Arbib, 2002; Arbib et al., 2008; Pollick & de Waal 2007). Gestural communication has been studied in gorillas (Genty et al. 2009), orangutans (Cartmill & Byrne 2007; Russon & Andrews 2010), and chimpanzees (Tomasello 1994; Pika & Mitani 2006; Pika et al. 2005). Recent reports claim that orangutans also use sequences of gestures to communicate requests and other messages by acting out, or pantomiming, what they intend to communicate. For example, in the context of a head-cleaning game, a semi-free ranging young orangutan was observed to take a leaf from a human’s hand when the human refused to use it to clean his head. The orangutan then briefly rubbed his head with the leaf, and then handed the leaf back to the human, who proceeded to clean the orangutan’s head with it (Russon & Andrews 2010). Unsystematic reports of pantomime behavior can be found for other great apes as well, though formal research programs on pantomime in great apes need to be pursued further (Russon & Andrews 2011).

4.1.3 Symbolic Communication

In the 20th century there was great interest in teaching symbolic communication systems to other species. The earliest forays into this area were with chimpanzees, and focused on teaching spoken language to chimpanzees raised as human children (Kellogg & Kellogg 1933; Hayes & Hayes 1951). With the realization that chimpanzees lack the vocal apparatus needed to utter human words, research shifted to teaching chimpanzees American Sign Language and artificial symbolic communication systems. The first such study, Beatrix and Allen Gardner’s Project Washoe, was initially reported to be a success. Using explicit training methods, including shaping, molding, and modeling, the researchers were able to train the infant Washoe to form at least 132 ASL signs. Focus was on production of gestures, rather than comprehension, and the Gardners’ stated intention was to train Washoe (and later, other chimpanzees) in a social setting, mimicking the language-learning environment of children as much as possible. The Gardners claim that, “[Washoe] learned a natural human language and her early utterances were highly similar to, perhaps indistinguishable from, the early utterances of human children. Now, the categorical question, can a nonhuman being use a human language, must be replaced by quantitative questions: how much human language, how soon, or how far can they go?” (Gardner & Gardner 1978, 73).

While the Gardners’ claims about ape language were being echoed by others working on ape language (e.g., Premack 1971; Patterson 1978), not everyone agreed. The psychologist Herbert Terrace, who used the methods of the Gardners to teach ASL signs to an infant chimpanzee named Nim Chimpsky, argued that the apes were not using the signs to communicate. Terrace concluded that some of the results achieved by the Gardners could be explained by associative learning rather than comprehension of the semantics of the symbols. In his study, he tried to control for associative learning, and his focus on syntax had him attend to symbol order in multi-symbol strings. While early results of this study seemed promising, after watching videos of Nim’s symbol use he noticed that what had been initially seen as spontaneous utterances were often imitations of utterances just made by his trainers. Terrace reviewed films of Washoe’s utterances, and found similar patterns: the teacher initiates the signing, and the chimpanzee mimics the teacher’s signs. He also noted that the give and take rhythm of child-adult communication was not mirrored by the chimpanzee-trainer conversations, and took this difference in pragmatics as further evidence that the chimpanzees were not using language (Terrace et al. 1979).

Though the Gardners defended their studies against Terrace’s critiques (Gardner & Gardner 1989), other researchers tried to control for alternative interpretations of their results. Premack, for example, relied on transfer tests as evidence that the chimpanzee Sara understands the symbols she was taught (Premack 1971). In a transfer test, a new symbol is taught only in the context of a subset of the subject’s vocabulary. Once the subject reaches criterion on the teaching set, a formal test is conducted using novel strings of symbols.

The post-Terrace research on symbolic communication expanded to include different species, such as the other apes, dolphins, parrots, and sea lions. In addition, the focus of some studies has shifted from syntax to semantics, and from production to comprehension. More recently, the investigation into whether other species can learn a symbol system in order to communicate with humans has largely lapsed, with focus shifting back to investigating syntactic skills independently from communicative meaning, and to animals’ natural communication capacities.

Symbolic Communication Research

Species Study Description
Chimpanzee Kellogg & Kellogg (1933) Co-rearing of a 7 1/2 month-old female chimpanzee, Gua, with their 10 month-old son, Donald, for nine months. Both were explicitly trained in spoken English. Though Gua failed to produce language, she was said to comprehend 95 terms by the end of the study.
Chimpanzee Hayes & Hayes (1951,1952) A female chimpanzee Vicky was raised from infancy as a human child for almost 8 years. Despite extensive training, Vicky was only able to utter four words.
Chimpanzee Gardner & Gardner (1971) Explicit teaching of ASL signs to a female chimpanzee Washoe in a social setting. Washoe was 11 months-old when the project started, and after 51 months of training she reached criterion on 132 signs.
Chimpanzee Premack (1971) Explicit teaching of symbol use to a 6 year-old chimpanzee Sarah in a laboratory setting. Sarah was taught to associate objects, actions, classes, logical connectives, etc. with plastic chips, and was taught to produce strings of symbols that obey syntactic rules.
Chimpanzee Rumbaugh (1973) Explicit teaching of a lexigram system to 2 1/2 year-old female chimpanzee Lana in a computer-mediated laboratory setting. Lana produced strings of lexigrams that obey syntactic rules. Later Lana’s performance was said to be an emulation of human symbol use because she failed to grasp the referential aspect of the lexigrams.
Chimpanzee Savage-Rumbaugh (1980) Explicit teaching of a lexigram system to two male chimpanzees, Sherman (5 years-old) and Austin (4 years-old). Emphasis was on semantics rather than syntax. Sherman and Austin were reported to use the lexigrams with one another to request objects.
Gorilla Patterson (1978) Explicit teaching of ASL signs to a female gorilla Koko in a social setting.
Chimpanzee Terrace et al. (1979) Explicit teaching of ASL signs to a 2 week-old male chimpanzee, Nim Chimpsky, using the methods of Gardner & Gardner; failed to replicate their results.
Orangutan Miles (1983) Explicit teaching of ASL to an encultured male orangutan Chantek in a social setting. Chantek was 9 months-old when the project started, and it continues nearly twenty years later.
Sea lion Schusterman et al. (1984) Explicit teaching of comprehension of an artificial gestural communication system to a female sea lion, Rocky, since 1978, modeled after the bottlenose dolphin communication system developed by Lou Herman.
Chimpanzee Matsuzawa (1985) Explicit teaching of numeral use to a female chimpanzee Ai in a social setting. Ai was 1 year-old when she arrived at Kyoto in 1977. Research continues on the language, numerical, and other cognitive abilities of chimpanzees, including developmental studies of Ai’s son, Ayumu, using the participant observation method.
Bonobo Savage-Rumbaugh (1986) Spontaneous acquisition of lexigram symbol use in a 2 1/2 year-old male bonobo Kanzi after almost two years of observing explicit attempt to teach his surrogate mother.
Bottlenose dolphin Herman et al. (1986) Explicit teaching of comprehension of an artificial gestural communication system with some logical structure to four captive dolphins, Phoenix, Akeakamai, Hiapo, and Elele.
Chimpanzee Fouts et al. (1989) Social learning of ASL from a trained chimpanzee Washoe to a young naive chimpanzee Loulis.
Chimpanzee Boysen & Berntson (1989) Explicit teaching of numerals to an encultured female chimpanzee, Sheba.
African Grey Parrot Pepperberg (1999) Social modeling of spoken language used to teach the parrot Alex to vocalize English words. Alex was able to label objects by name, color, shape, and matter.
Orangutan Shumaker (1997) Explicit teaching of a symbolic lexigram communication system with some logical structure to the male orangutan Azy, ongoing since 1995.
Border Collie Pilley & Reid (2011) Explicit teaching of unique proper-name nouns (spoken in English) for 1022 objects to Chaser, whose training began by her caregivers when she was 8 weeks old.

Advocates of this research program argue that the studies uncover something about the relationship between language and mind, the evolution of human language, and the roles played by development and scaffolding in human language (Lloyd 2004). However, to the critics, these studies simply provide more evidence in favor of the power of association and the ability of humans to train animals to do nearly anything. There is a huge literature on these studies, with critics (Pinker & Bloom 1990; Pinker 1994; Chomsky 1980) as well as defenders (Lloyd 2004; Greenfield 1991; Savage Rumbaugh et al. 1998).

One area of contention has to do with whether animals that successfully use some aspect of human language are using it qua language, or are instead engaged in symbolic communication. At least three different demarcations between language and other symbolic communication systems have been offered. According to Noam Chomsky’s original linguistic program, to use language is to embody certain structural principles, and all language users are able to produce a potentially infinite number of grammatical strings via recursive embedding (Chomsky 1968). The linguistic anthropologist Charles Hockett identified up to seventeen design features that occur in every human language, including semanticity, discreteness, and arbitrariness (Hockett 1977). More recently Hauser, Fitch, and Chomsky (2002) argue that the mechanism that allows for recursive thinking is the central cognitive requirement for language, and is a feature of human communication systems not found in other species. However, research on European starlings finds that we can train birds to discriminate a recursive grammar from among strings of starling sounds (Gentner et al. 2006), and that there are similarities between human language and birdsong along cognitive, neurological, genomic, and behavioral dimensions (Bolhuis, J.J. et al. 2010).

Chomsky was a vocal critic of early animal language studies, especially of the claims made by some researchers that the apes had acquired language. For Chomsky, language requires syntax, which he claimed was lacking in all the communication systems of the apes. Furthermore, to train an ape to use symbols is a laborious process, whereas children learn language effortlessly. Language is innate, according to Chomsky, so if apes had the capacity for learning language, they would speak without human intervention (Chomsky 1968). Chomsky often states his criticism as an a priori argument against animal language: : “if an animal had a capacity as biologically sophisticated as language but somehow hadn’t used it until now, it would be an evolutionary miracle, like finding an island of humans who could be taught to fly” (cited in Lloyd 2004, 585).

Another argument Chomsky has offered against animal language is based on the dissimilarity between animal communication systems and human language. He writes, “The question of whether other systems are ‘like’ human language is a question about the usefulness of a certain metaphor” (Chomsky 1980, 434), and he argues that the structural principles, manner of use, and ontogenetic development of ape symbol use is so different from human language that any analogy between the two would be very weak. Those who defend the animal symbolic communication system as language take Chomsky to task on this point, and stress the similarities between the two systems of communication.

Given findings in genetics, the biological capacity for language may be more accurately described as a collection of biological capacities, some of which we share with other species. The FOXP2 gene is found to play a role in speech production, and some claim that it was instrumental in the development of language in humans. The FOXP2 gene is also expressed in the same part of the brain in zebra finches, and it has been reported that finch fledglings with reduced FOXP2 are impaired in their ability to learn to sing (Haesler et al. 2007).

4.1.4 Gestural communication

While most discussions of animal communication focus on vocal communication, animal communication may also occur through different modalities. The bee dance is an example of a postural method of communication. Great apes communicate using gestures, such as pantomime (Russon & Andrews 2011). The idea that human language evolved from body movements such as gesture, miming, and dance has been promoted by Michael Corballis (1992, 2002) and Merlin Donald (1991) as the gestural theory of language acquisition. Because for primates bodily movement is under voluntary cortical control to a greater extent than are vocalizations, it may be that our hominid ancestors, as well as our great ape cousins, use gesture and posture to intentionally communicate. The neuroscientist Michal Arbib supports the gestural theory of language evolution, through appeal to the mirror system, which is a neural system found in humans and other primates which is active both when witnessing another engage in an action and when one engages in that action oneself (Arbib 2005).

Tomasello claims that chimpanzees intentionally communicate only via gestures, because when gesturing but not when vocalizing apes monitor the gaze of communicative partners (Leavens and Hopkins 1998), and repair failed communication attempts by repeating a message or elaborating on it (Liebal et al 2004, Leavens et al 2005).

Ravens have been observed to use gestural communication, in their head and beak movements that indicate the presence of objects such as moss or twigs to their partner (Pika & Bugnyar 2011). Elephants have also been observed to use postural communication, as when they orient their body to indicate where they want to go next (Poole & Granli 2011). In addition, some elephants understand human pointing (Smet & Byrne 2013).

4.2 Mindreading or Theory of Mind

Like humans, many species are social animals who, in addition to navigating a physical world, must also navigate a social world. In the 1970s it was suggested that in order to succeed in a competitive social world, individuals would benefit from having some understanding of the mind of others (Humphrey 1976, 1978), with Alison Jolly suggesting that knowing other minds helps members of big social groups cooperate (Jolly 1966). Humphrey wrote, “...I venture to suggest that if a rat’s knowledge of the behavior of other rats were to be limited to everything which behaviorists have discovered about rats to date, the rat would show so little understanding of its fellows that it would bungle disastrously every social interaction it engaged in; the prospects for a man similarly constrained would be still more dismal” (Humphrey 1978, 60). The idea here is that knowledge of other minds can offer added value over knowing others’ behavioral patterns.

The term “theory of mind” was introduced by psychologists David Premack and Guy Woodruff around this time. The specific question Premack and Woodruff were interested in was whether the chimpanzee attributes beliefs and desires in order to predict and explain behavior, something they assumed that humans do. In effect, Premack and Woodruff wanted to know whether a chimpanzee is a Humean action theorist who understands the behavior of others as being caused by propositional attitudes. Thus, while they defined theory of mind as the ability to predict and explain behavior by attributing mental states, they were more focused on whether chimpanzees engage in belief and desire reasoning. Premack and Woodruff attempted to determine whether Sarah, the same chimpanzee from Premack’s symbolic communication project, has a theory of mind. To examine whether Sarah understands what others believe, they used the following paradigm: Sarah was shown videotapes of humans trying to solve certain tasks (e.g. acquiring out of reach bananas, warming up a cold room by lighting a heater) and she was supposed to choose from an array of photos to pick the solution (Premack & Woodruff 1978). Because Sarah picked the correct photograph at an above-chance level, Premack and Woodruff concluded that she has a theory of mind. They claimed that Sarah must have been attributing “at least two states of mind to the human actor, namely, intention or purpose on the one hand, and knowledge or belief on the other” (Premack & Woodruff 1978, 518).

In commentary on this study, it was pointed out that Sarah could have used other methods to solve the problems. She could, for example, have attended to the goal of the actors, as opposed to their mental states (which is the interpretation that Premack now endorses (Premack & Premack 2003)). Most of the commentators were unconvinced by the design of the study, and several suggested alternative methodologies for examining the question. One suggestion was to require the subject to solve a coordination problem. In order to succeed in a coordination problem, the subject would have to alter his own behavior in expectation of what another will do (e.g. Bennett 1978; Dennett 1978; Harman 1978). Dennett suggests that a good coordination problem might require that the subject considers another’s false belief, so that the behavior being predicted will be an unusual one, such as a behavior that would only be exhibited if the actor had a false belief. A false belief coordination problem would thus avoid alternative interpretations having to do with identifying the actor’s goal, or making associations from similar situations in the past. The behavior performed by an actor who has a false belief will not achieve the actor’s goal, and will probably not be something the subject has witnessed previously. The main problem with this suggestion, Dennett notes, is how to determine the content of the predictions a chimpanzee might make.

Given the difficulties associated with developing a good nonverbal test for mindreading (Dennett 1983), Dennett’s suggestion was taken up by researchers interested in studying theory of mind in children (Wimmer & Perner 1983). Wimmer and Perner accepted Premack and Woodruff’s definition of theory of mind, and become interested in the question of the stage at which small children acquire a theory of mind. To answer this question, they designed the false belief task, which was to become a standard test for theory of mind. Children watched a show in which a puppet named Maxi puts away a piece of chocolate in a box before leaving the room. While Maxi is out, his mother finds the chocolate and moves it to a cupboard. Maxi returns to the scene, the show is stopped, and children are asked to predict where Maxi will go to look for his chocolate. If the child says Maxi will look in the cupboard, she fails the test, and thus shows that she doesn’t have a theory of mind. If the child says Maxi will look in the box, she passes; passing the task shows that the child has a theory of mind, because she demonstrates that she can attribute mental states and use them to predict Maxi’s behavior.

This research program was closely associated with a debate on folk psychology between folk psychology as theory (the view that human knowledge of other minds is theoretical in nature), and folk psychology as simulation (the view that our knowledge of other minds relies on using our own mind as a model). Due to this debate, philosophers starting substituting the term "mindreading" for the term "theory of mind" so as to be inclusive. In the late 1990s there was a growing acceptance that both theory-theory and simulation theory were partially right and partially wrong, and this culminated in a general acceptance of some sort of hybrid theory (e.g. Nichols & Stich 2003; Goldman 2006). These arguments make use of empirical data from both the developmental and the animal cognition literature.

During this time, there were a few attempts to uncover mindreading in animals using nonverbal paradigms, without much success (Heyes 1998). Given the subsequent theoretical and definitional disagreements, some researchers have concluded that “the generic label ‘theory of mind’ actually covers a wide range of processes of social cognition” (Tomasello et al. 2003b, 239). The research program in animal mindreading subsequently shifted from attempts to come up with a nonverbal false belief task, toward more specific questions about cognitive capacities like understanding others’ perceptual states (Hare et al. 2000), goals (Uller 2004), or intentionality (Tomasello 2005).

4.2.1 Mindreading perceptions

There has been much interest in examining primates’ understanding of perceptual states. The standard approach in the investigation starts with two assumptions: that perceptual states, like belief states, are hidden from the observer’s standpoint and hence have to be postulated as theoretical entities; and that knowing someone’s perceptual states, like knowing another’s belief state, facilitates accurate predictions about future behavior. Ethological evidence that chimpanzees monitor gaze and modify their behavior when they are visible to others (e.g. Plooij 1978; Whiten & Byrne 1988; Goodall 1986) was taken to provide evidence that chimpanzees can attribute perceptual states to others. As a result, experimental researchers decided to design studies meant to determine whether chimpanzees understand seeing.

The results of early laboratory studies were mixed; David Premack’s research suggested that chimpanzees do understand seeing (reviewed in Premack & Premack 2003), whereas studies by Povinelli and Eddy (1996) challenged that conclusion. Later studies suggested that chimpanzees understand both seeing and intentionality (Hare et al. 2000; Hare et al. 2001). In Hare et al.’s experimental set-up, a subordinate and a dominant chimpanzee are released in a room baited with food. Normally, if both animals can see the food, or see one another witness the baiting, a subordinate animal will avoid the food and allow access to the dominant. However, in these experiments, when the food is occluded from the dominant’s view, the subordinate will approach it. Only if the dominant can see the food or the baiting will the subordinate avoid it. The animals are across the room from one another, so the subordinate has to consider the visual perspective of the dominant in order to judge correctly whether he can see the food or not. Because it seems that the subordinate is able to make different judgments about whether to seek out the food based only on whether it is visible to the dominant, this study is thought to indicate that the apes understand the mental state of seeing.

Povinelli and Vonk (2004) criticize the Hare et al. studies, suggesting that the ecological nature of the study (using food competition behavior from the subject’s natural repertoire) is a weakness of the study, not a strength as the authors believed, because the chimpanzees could have made inferences based on past observed behavior. In response, the authors claim that they have accounted for all possible alternative explanations for the subordinate’s behavior, making an inference to the best explanation argument that the subordinate understands what the dominant sees (Tomasello et al. 2003a, 2003b; Hare et al. 2006).

In a review of the literature, Call and Tomasello (2008) conclude that there is ample evidence that chimpanzees understand others’ goals, intentions, perceptions and knowledge, but that there is no experimental evidence that they understand false belief. Evidence for this final claim comes from recent studies, such as a turn-taking food competition study that suggests chimpanzees can understand other’s knowledge state, but not their belief state (Kaminski et al. 2008). In this study, two chimpanzees take turns pointing at one of three opaque buckets in order to gain food rewards that may be hidden inside. In one condition, the subject chimpanzee observed two buckets being bated, and the competitor chimpanzee only observed one bucket being bated. When the subject chimpanzee was permitted to choose first, the subject showed no preference for either of the baited buckets. However, when the subject chimpanzee had to choose second (without having the opportunity to observe the choice of the competitor chimpanzee), the subject more often chose the bucket that the competitor had not seen baited. The authors conclude that chimpanzees sometimes know what others know. They then used a variation of this experiment to test for false belief. The subject saw the competitor chimpanzee being mislead about the actual location of the food, but was not able to make use of this information to predict the competitor’s first choice. This suggests that the chimpanzees were unable to distinguish between others’ true and false beliefs. While the authors claim, “These results suggest that, at least in some situations, chimpanzees know what others know, in the sense of have seen” (Kaminski et al. 2008, 229).

4.2.2 The logical problem and parsimony

Various worries have been raised about the design of the studies testing for belief and perceptual attribution in great apes. Daniel Povinelli and his colleagues have challenged the paradigms by arguing that in each case the subjects’ performance can be explained by their having a theory of behavior, rather than a theory of mind, and this has been come to be known as "the logical problem" (Povinelli & Vonk 2004). They claim that in all the studies that have been done so far, chimpanzees could use a complementary behavior-reading rule S -> B to predict behavior, rather than a mindreading rule S -> Ms -> B (where S is the situational cue, B is the predicted behavior, and Ms is the mental state). Povinelli and Vonk suggest that both humans and chimpanzees have a theory of behavior, but humans also have a theory of mind, in that being a mindreader requires also being a behavior reader.

One response to this challenge is to suggest that since mindreading allows one to make predictions of behavior in novel situations, we can find evidence of mindreading when we see that a predictor makes a prediction from their personal experience, rather than from their experience observing others’ action. This ability to make novel predictions is the added value of mindreading over mere behavior-reading. Taking this position, Povinelli and Vonk suggest that Cecilia Heyes’ proposed experience projection paradigm would avoid the logical problem, because it involves asking a chimpanzee to realize that a novel situation (i.e. wearing a red bucket over the head) was associated with a particular mental experience (i.e. not being able to see). This test would require the subject make an inference not from observed behavior to new behavior, but from introspected experience of the self to the mental experience of the other. A chimpanzee who passed this test would be able to predict that another chimpanzee who wore the red bucket would not be able to see. That is, the chimpanzee would have to infer some intervening variable between observed behavior and action, and for Povinelli and Vonk this is sufficient evidence for mindreading (Buckner 2014). More recently, researchers have run versions of the goggles test on chimpanzees (Karg et al. 2015) and ravens (Bugnyar et al. 2016), and in both cases found that the animals are able to pass the task.

In the raven study, subjects are given the experience of seeing into an adjoining room through a peephole, and watching food being cached. They are then released into the room at which point they retrieve the food. After having this experience, researchers investigated the ravens’ caching behavior in the room under three conditions: with a transparent window, without a transparent window and no peephole, and without a transparent window and a peephole. They found that ravens’ caching behavior was the same in the transparent window and the peephole conditions, and significantly different in the conditions without the transparent window. The study authors conclude that this study provides evidence of theory of mind in ravens (Bugnyar et al. 2016). In the chimpanzee study, subjects are exposed to food boxes having lids with different transparent properties, and chimpanzees are given an experience in which they learn that a lid that looks opaque is in fact transparent from another perspective. When chimpanzees compete for food with a human agent, they prefer taking food from opaque boxes over transparent boxes, and from boxes that are opaque over than boxes that appear to be opaque but which the subject had prior experience with, so they know that from the human agent’s view they are transparent (Karg et al. 2015). Given the findings from these two studies, it appears that the logical problem has been overcome.

However, there is a stronger interpretation of the logical problem which may not be met by those studies. On the stronger interpretation, there needs to be evidence that the intervening variable is properly mental, rather than behavioral (Lurz 2011). Raising a concern along these lines, Kristin Andrews (2005) argued that in the proposed goggles test the chimpanzee can pass the test by understanding that the red bucket is the bucket that hinders one’s ability to do things, rather than the bucket that hinders one’s ability to see things; the chimpanzee’s behavior is consistent with a behavior-reading rule as well as a mindreading one. Since the prediction that the chimpanzee participant would be asked to make would be about the other chimpanzee’s behavior (such as begging from a person with food), the chimpanzee participant may solve this task by realizing that the red bucket hinders individuals’ abilities to achieve the specific goal. Rather than generalizing from one’s own mental experience, the successful chimpanzee subject may be generalizing from their own physical experience. Andrews goes on to argue that this stronger reading of the logical problem makes the issue of chimpanzee mindreading not one that is subject to scientific investigation, and turns the logical problem into the general skeptical problems of other minds (Andrews 2015).

In an attempt to avoid these sorts of alternative explanations (which Lurz calls "complementary behavior-reading hypotheses") Lurz attempts to invent new research paradigms for nonhuman animals, such that passing them wouldn’t be subject to a complementary behavior-reading hypothesis. He suggests that ape mindreading can be directly tested using a version of the appearance-reality test. Lurz points out that by considering the way an object appears to an individual, one can better predict that individual’s future behavior toward that object than by considering the actual properties of the object. Following on this insight, he suggests that researchers ought to examine whether chimpanzees take into consideration how objects appear to others. In a review of this book, Andrews (2012b) argues that Lurz’s proposed experiments also fail to avoid the logical problem, as there are behavioral descriptions that can be offered for successful performance on those tasks as well.

Povinelli and colleagues also suggest another added value to mindreading is that the mental state can be used to reinterpret the observed behavior. The Reinterpretation Hypothesis states that representing others’ mental states has the primary function not of predicting new behavior, but rather of providing a causal description of behavior that can be predicted without appeal to mental states (Povinelli et al. 2000). They write, "...the evolution of second-order intentional states may have allowed humans to reinterpret existing, extremely complicated social behaviors that evolved long before we did...once this new representational device was in place, there may well have been cascading effects on larger aspects of the system — in this case, material and social culture including pedagogy and ethics..." (Povinelli et al. 2000, 533). Given this commitment, one may also examine the existence of these cascading effects in other species in order to gain evidence of mindreading. However, Povinelli is convinced that nonhuman great apes cannot reason about unobservables, and do not understand causation (Povinelli & Dunphy-Lelii 2001). This explains Povinelli and colleagues’ pessimism that chimpanzees are mindreaders.

Rather than thinking a single experiment can serve as evidence for chimpanzee mindreading, other philosophers have moved to considering a larger body of evidence. Elliot Sober suggests that we can gain evidence of a mentalistic intervening variable in animals by conducting a two winged study using two different sorts of stimuli that elicit two different types of behavior, which are unified for a mentalizing subject but not for a behavior-reading subject. He asks us to consider running a version of Melis et al.’s (2006) studies in which chimpanzees are invited to steal food from humans in two related conditions. In one condition chimps can reach through opaque or transparent tubes to gain food, and in the other conditions chimps can lift a noisy or silent trap door. Reaching through opaque tubes and lifting quiet doors results in a successful theft. Sober argues that according to the mindreading hypothesis passing one wing of this task should increase the probability of passing the other wing of this task, whereas for the behavior reading hypothesis there should be a screening off of the two conditions, with no correlation between the tasks (Sober 2015). Other objections to the logical problem challenge come from from Marta Halina (2015), who argues that the logical problem is a form of skepticism that doesn’t enter into empirical investigation. Fletcher and Carruthers (2013) argue that the behavior reading hypothesis is unfalsifiable.

The move to consider a body of research as evidence of mindreading is sometimes couched in terms of parsimony (Whiten 1995). For example, Logan Fletcher and Peter Carruthers (2013) review the evidence for successes and failures in chimpanzee mindreading tasks, and, appealing to considerations of parsimony, conclude that the evidence suggests that apes mindread desires, perceptions, and knowledge. The hypothesis that chimpanzees mindread unified a large body of evidence. However, considerations of parsimony have been used both to conclude that animals do, and to conclude that animals do not, mindread. This had led to an investigation that focuses on the role of parsimony in the mindreading debates. Sober investigates both evolutionary parsimony and black box parsimony, and offers suggestions about the kind of evidence we need to move ahead in the debate (2015). Other investigations into the role of parsimony in investigating animal mindreading comes from Hayley Clatterbuck (2015), who argues that it is simpler for chimpanzees to mindread than to behavior-read because a mindreading model has fewer adjustable parameters given that mental state attribution can unify multiple inputs and outputs, and Simon Fitzpatrick (2009), who offers an analysis of the role simplicity plays on both sides of the debate.

4.2.3 Beyond chimpanzees: Mindreading in other species

Recent developments in the study of mindreading in human infants provide additional methods for studying false belief in other species. Despite the widely held claim that children do not develop a theory of mind until about four years old (Wellman et al. 2001), researchers using spontaneous response tasks claim that false belief understanding develops in infancy (see Baillargeon et al. 2010 for a review). Preliminary research using the same methods as the ones used in infant studies has found no evidence of false belief understanding in macaque monkeys (Ruiz 2010; Martin & Santos 2014). However, using a similar method, Claudia Uller found that chimpanzees respond like human infants to stimuli adult researchers interpret as example of goal directed behaviors (Uller 2004, following Gergely et al. 1995)

A number of studies suggest that corvids demonstrate social cognitive abilities similar to those of apes (Bugynar et al. 2007; Dally et al. 2006; Emery & Clayton 2004). For example, research on scrub-jay caching behavior shows that individuals who have pilfered another’s cache in the past will privately recache food when a conspecific observes the original caching, but not if the original caching was unobserved (Emery & Clayton 2004). Naive scrub jays did not recache. Emery & Clayton suggest that the jays who do recache are engaging in experience projection: “they relate information about their previous experience as a pilferer to the possibility of future stealing by another individual, and modify their recovery strategy appropriately” (Emery & Clayton 2004, 1905).

Studies on perceptual understanding have been conducted on rhesus monkeys (Flombaum & Santos 2005). Similarly to the chimpanzee and the scrub-jay studies, these experiments set up a naturalistic competitive situation in which the subject has to predict the behavior of a competitor. In one version of this study, rhesus macaques from the island of Cayo Santiago were pitted against human competitors in a foraging task; two experimenters would approach a lone monkey, and each would situate himself differently so that the monkey was visible to one experimenter but not the other. Both experimenters had one grape. Flombaum and Santos found that monkeys were more likely to steal grapes from the experimenter who couldn’t see them. They found similar results for audibility; when given the choice of stealing a grape in a transparent box covered with bells, or a grape in a transparent box that was free of noisemakers, the monkeys preferred the silent food when no one was looking at them. However, when it was obvious that the monkey was observed, there was no preference for stealing quiet over noisy grapes (Santos et al. 2006).

While chimpanzees show some sensitivity to intentions and goals, domestic dogs may be even more attuned to the intentions of humans. Dogs are able to use the gaze of a human in order to determine where food is hidden, an ability not demonstrated in the chimpanzee (Hare et al. 1998; Hare & Tomasello 1999; Miklosi & Topal 2004; Brauer et al. 2006; see Hare & Woods 2013 for a summary of the research on dog cognition). Dogs appear to be sensitive to eye gaze in humans, and often make eye contact before initiating play. One explanation for dogs’ social acuity is that in selecting for traits that make dogs better human companions, humans inadvertently bred dogs who are better able to pass theory of mind tasks (Hare et al. 2002).

Some researchers who have worked closely with bottlenose dolphins think that the overall body of research on dolphins suggest that they mindread. Captive dolphins are able to pass object choice tasks, in which a human informant points to indicate where food is hidden. Dolphins can use this cue to access the food (Herman et al. 1999; Tschudin et al 2001). Dolphins also pass mirror self-recognition tasks, and Diana Reiss thinks this offers evidence that dolphins also have some mindreading capacity related to empathy, because human children develop empathy around the same time they recognize themselves in mirrors (Reiss 2012).

4.3 Mirror Self-recognition

Some research aims to explore what individuals know about their own minds. One area of much attention has been mirror self-recognition (MSR). In this paradigm, developed by psychologist Gordon Gallup, subjects are surreptitiously marked and then given a mirror. “Passing” the MSR test involves touching the mark more frequently when there is a mirror available than when there is not. Gallop argued that passing MSR entails that the animal has a concept of self (Gallup 1970), though others dispute this claim. While it was once thought to be a rare behavior, limited to some of the great apes, today many species have been studied and at least some positive results have been reported for the following species:

Species Study
Chimpanzees Lin et al. 1992; Swartz & Evans 1991
Gorillas Shumaker & Swartz 2002
Orangutans Swartz et al. 1999
Bottlenosed dolphins Marino et al. 1994; Reiss & Marino 2001
Asian elephant Plotnik et al. 2006
Magpies Prior et al. 2008
Rhesus Monkeys Rajala et al. 2010

Many other species failed to show mirror directed behavior, including some monkey species, which suggests to some that there is a corresponding cognitive mechanism that the above species, but not others, enjoy. However, it has been pointed out that there are ecological and biological constraints on this test; not all species are visually oriented, and some find eyes aversive (this was the explanation for studies that failed to show MSR in gorillas). For a discussion of these issues, see the collection of articles in Self-awareness in Animals and Humans (Parker et al. 1994).

4.4 Metacognition, Memory, and Uncertainty Monitoring

Research on metacognition is another area of research that aims to investigate the understanding of one’s own mental state (Beran et al. 2012; Crystal and Foote 2009; Shettleworth & Sutton 2006; see also Proust 2013 for a discussion of metacognition in primates). Metacognition is related to self-knowledge as well as to consciousness (see self-consciousness and metacognition in the Animal Cognition entry.

For example, those who knows what they do and do not know demonstrate metacognition about their epistemic states. Several nonverbal tests for uncertainty monitoring have been developed for use with different species. The paradigm might go as follows: subjects are trained to indicate whether a stimulus is the same as or different from a sample. When the subjects respond correctly, they are rewarded with food, but food is taken away when they give incorrect responses. Once the subjects are trained on this task, the paradigm is modified to introduce a “bail out” key with the function of starting a new trial without supplying either reward or punishment. Interspersed with the easy stimuli are ambiguous stimuli that the subject is unable to accurately categorize above a chance level. If the subjects learn to choose the “bail out” key when they are uncertain, it is thought to indicate that the subjects are aware of their epistemic state. It has been reported that many species choose the “bail out” key in such a way as to maximize rewards, including dolphins (Smithe et al. 1995), rhesus monkeys (Hampton 2001), great apes (Call & Carpenter 2001), and human infants (Call & Carpenter 2001). Mixed results have been reported with pigeons (Sole et al. 2003).

Memory monitoring can also be involved in some metacognitive tasks. The psychologist Robert Hampton found that rhesus macaques know whether or not they can remember seeing an image. After training monkeys on a simple delayed match to sample task, Hampton (2001) allowed monkeys to decide whether or not to take the test. If they took the test and passed, they received a valuable treat, but if they failed the task they received nothing. If, on the other hand, they decided not to take the test they were given a lesser value food reward. Hampton found that the frequency with which the monkey chose not to take the test increased with the duration of the delay since the presentation of the sample, and that monkeys were able to maximize their rewards by correctly judging when they could pass the task. In a more recent set of studies, Hampton and his students tested seven alternate hypotheses, and concluded that the best explanation of their findings is that the monkeys are monitoring their memory states (Basile et al. 2015).

Though such tests have been designed to test for metacognition, Peter Carruthers argues that animals can come to solve the problems without engaging in second-order reasoning. He suggests that the animal could be operating over beliefs and desires of different strengths, and that standard practical reasoning systems can be used to output different responses to the different permutations of weak and strong beliefs and desires (Carruthers 2008). Alternatively, animals might base their choices on their affective states rather than metacognitive representational states (Carruthers and Ritchie 2012). However, such responses may be based on different conceptions of the nature of metacognition. Strength of belief and affective feelings are both commonly discussed as instances of metacognition in the psychology literature. For example, psychologists have created metacognitive models to show that the strength of response traces can be used to solve metacognitive problems (Smith et al. 2008). In addition, research on human metacognitive capacities study the feeling of rightness as a metacognitive judgment. For example, Valerie Thompson finds that the feeling of rightness of an initial answer predicts both response time and likelihood of switching from the original answer (Thompson et al. 2011).

4.5 Moral Practice

Recently there has been a resurgence of interest in examining whether other species share with humans any of the faculties involved in morality or normative engagement.

The view that animals can be full blown moral agents is defended by Bekoff & Pierce (2009) who argue that some species have a distinct form of morality that is not a precursor to human morality. Because they take ‘morality’ to mean “a suite of other-regarding behaviors that cultivate and regulate complex interactions within social groups” (Bekoff & Pierce 2009, 82), they take the complexity of animal behavior, social organization, and cognitive flexibility to demonstrate that other species have morality in this sense. Central to the view is that different species have different norms, and that this makes animal morality species-relative. Despite the differences, they claim that the important similarities between species include the capacities for empathy, altruism, cooperation and perhaps a sense of fairness. Whether or not such claims about animal capacities are true is a matter of much current research.

Others are more circumspect. Mark Rowlands (2012) argues that because animals can be have moral emotions, and that those moral emotions provide moral reasons for an animal’s actions, animals can engage in moral practice by being moral subjects. Moral subjects are able to act for moral reasons, but they are not moral agents who are responsible for their actions, because they can’t consider those moral reasons, or act to change them. Animals can act for reasons whose content includes moral emotions, so on his view we can seek evidence for animal morality by looking to see if animals can emotionally, and reliably, respond to morally salient features of their situations.

Frans de Waal (1997, 2006, 2009) also takes emotion and empathy to play a key role in human morality, and he takes the evidence of empathy and reciprocity in other animals to indicate that morality evolved, such that human moral behavior is a development of older capacities we see in other species. We see empathy in other animals when they offer help to another that is different from the sort of help the actor needs themselves. De Waal gives a number of examples that are discussed in the next section. Reciprocity is seen in other animals when they treat others differently depending on the way they treat us. He interprets his empirical research on economic games in chimpanzees (Proctor et al. 2013) and fairness in capuchin monkeys (de Waal & Brosnan 2003) as evidence of reciprocity and empathy in other primates.

Furthermore, Gary Varner (2012) argues that while animals are not full-fledged persons, some animals hold the moral status of near persons. Persons have cognitive capacities Varner thinks all animals lack: a narrative sense of self, which requires rationality, self-consciousness, and autonomy in the sense of having second-order desires, and the ability to think about one’s self, birth, death, and personality. To have these capacities, Varner argues, one needs language. Instead of being persons, animals such as chimpanzees, dolphins, elephants and scrub jays are near-persons; rats, monkeys and parrots might be near-persons, too. Near-persons can engage in past and future thinking, so they can consciously re-experience events and make plans. This ability gives near-persons additional opportunity for happiness, because they can re-experience pleasurable experiences, and unhappiness, because they can dread an unpleasant future. In addition, a near-person has a present sense of self insofar as they can mindread, and Varner concludes that monkeys, apes elephants, dolphins, and scrub jays have the ability to attribute perceptual states to others.

4.5.1 Emotion and Empathy

Social cognition isn’t limited to knowing the reasons another has for acting; it can include understanding the emotions of others. Among social species, awareness of others’ emotions can play a role in regulating social interactions, coordinating behavior, forming bonds between mothers and infants, as well as in forming short-term coalitions and long lasting relationships.

At least since Darwin’s The Expression of the Emotions in Man and Animals, facial expressions have been of interest because they can indicate individuals’ affective states. Research from both the field and the lab suggests that facial expressions have the same kinds of functions for chimpanzees and humans (e.g. van Hoof 1967, 1972; Goodall 1986; Parr 2001). Just as Paul Ekman argued for universality in emotional expressions among humans across cultures (Ekman et al. 1969), animal researchers have argued that at least some human emotions are also found in chimpanzees, and that chimpanzee facial expressions are homologous to human facial expressions in morphology and function. For example, van Hoof has argued that the bare-teeth display of chimpanzees is homologous to the human smile (van Hoof 1973).

Lisa Parr’s research demonstrates that chimpanzees, like human infants, are able to categorize facial expressions associated with different emotional responses. Using a match-to-sample paradigm, Parr and colleagues have shown that chimpanzees recognize at least five different facial expressions: bared-teeth display, scream, pant-hoot, play face, and relaxed-lip face (Parr et al. 1998). Given the salience of these facial expressions to chimpanzees, Parr and colleagues have argued that facial expressions are important behaviors for regulating social relations (Parr & de Waal 1999; Parr et al. 2000). Current research in Parr’s lab is focused on the development of ChimpFACS (Facial Action Coding System − see Other Internet Resources) modeled after Ekman’s work in emotion in human facial expressions. They are using the ChimpFACS to construct models of chimpanzee expressions in order to determine the configuration of muscle movements that the chimpanzees find salient in their perception of emotion.

Another area of study in animal emotion focuses on stress. As a response to potentially dangerous situations, stress is thought to be an adaptive emotion in the short term for humans and other animals. Stress is measured physiologically via levels of glucocorticoid hormones such as cortisol. In humans,cortisol levels are correlated with stress levels, and researchers have studied stressors such as dominance and status ranking in a number of different species (Sapolsky 2005; Abbott et al. 2003). For example, among baboons stress in the form of elevated glucocorticoid levels has been documented in females for about a month after the death of a close relative, in nursing mothers when a potentially infanticidal immigrant male arrives, in females when the female ranking system is undergoing instability, and in males when the male ranking system is unstable (Cheney & Seyfarth 2007). However, baboons do not appear to experience stress in the face of another’s stress. Females are not concerned about male rank instability, and the death of a cohort’s infant does not raise stress levels in anyone but the mother. It is suggested that for the baboon, stress is personal and egocentric, and the lack of sensitivity to the stress of others might be indicative of a lack of empathy as well (Cheney & Seyfarth 2007).

Emotion in other animals is being studied using brain imaging techniques such as fMRI and PET. Researchers interested in PTSD and stress study the brains of monkeys, rats, and mice (Marzluff and Angell 2012); using PET scans, John Marzluff and colleagues can see that different parts of the crow brain are active when that crow sees a known dangerous person compared to seeing a known kind person, and that these brain regions are homologous to the regions of the brain that are active in human in the same types of emotional situations. Marzluff concludes that birds feel fear in a way similar to the way humans experience fear (Marzluff et al. 2012).

Some research in moral psychology suggests that empathy is a necessary component of moral agency, and animal cognition researchers have been examining whether any other species share this ability with humans. Empathy is thought to require the same cognitive sophistication as does understanding another’s mental state or intention, but, in addition, it requires an affective response to that mental state. While the terms ‘empathy’ (sharing the mental state of another) and ‘sympathy’ (a friendly feeling in response to another’s mental state) have distinct meanings in the history of psychology, folk psychology, and ethical theory, in animal cognition research the senses are often blurred and the terms are used interchangeably.

Early reports of chimpanzee empathy came from Russian comparative psychologist N. N. Ladygina-Kohts, who raised a chimpanzee named Joni in the early 20th century (Ladygina-Kohts 2002). More recently, Sanjida O’Connell analyzed thousands of qualitative reports of primate responses to the distress of others, and her results suggest that apes give complex responses in the face of others’ emotions, compared to the responses of monkeys in similar situations (O’Connell 1995). Studies of chimpanzee behavior performed by Frans de Waal and his colleagues suggest that chimpanzees understand emotions, and respond to different emotional states with different behavior, e.g. consoling the loser of a fight, helping, etc. De Waal takes these behaviors to be evidence of empathy in chimpanzees (de Waal 2006).

4.5.2 Cooperation

Much of the research on empathy and altruism in other species examines helping behavior. Cooperation and helping between humans is ubiquitous, even when it requires that the actor suffer a cost, and even when the recipient is a stranger. However, because helping can be engaged in without empathy, and empathic helping requires additional cognitive resources (e.g. knowledge about how to help someone achieve their goal and the motivation to act on that knowledge), it is important to understand the limitations of the data.

Reports of naturalistic animal behavior suggest that many nonhuman animal species engage in prosocial behavior that may be empathic or proto-empathic in nature (de Waal 1996). De Waal often presents the famous example of Binti-Jua, a female gorilla at the Brookfield zoo in Chicago, who made the news when she rescued a 3-year-old human boy who fell into her habitat. Binti-Jua cradled the boy in her arms before handing him to a zookeeper. However, critics of the prosocial interpretation of Binti-Jua’s behavior suggest that given her early exposure to doll play, an associative learning explanation is also possible.

Others claim that what may look like prosocial behavior may instead be a way of eliminating aversive stimuli. For example, research on rats and rhesus monkeys has shown that both species will cease eating when doing so causes shocks to a conspecific in an adjoining cage (Masserman et al. 1964). Masserman reports that one rhesus monkey almost starved himself to death to avoid shocking another. Alternatively, helping behavior among kin may be explained noncognitively as biological altruism. To determine whether other species engage in helping behavior that cannot be explained by other mechanisms, researchers have developed paradigms to determine whether chimpanzees display helping behavior to unrelated individuals. Chimpanzees are thought to be an especially good species to examine, given the range of cooperative behaviors they naturally perform, such as hunting (Boesch 2002), border patrolling (Mitani 2002), and coalition building (de Wall 1982). Cooperation among chimpanzees (Hirata 2003; Melis et al. 2006) and bonobos (Hare et al. 2007) has been demonstrated in a food-sharing task, but chimpanzees are thought to cooperate only when the dyads are generally tolerant of one another (Hare et al. 2007).

In the last few years, a host of experimental studies have investigated the contexts in which chimpanzees will act to help others, and compared chimpanzee behavior with human behavior. Differences and similarities have been found, suggesting to some that the evolutionary roots of helping behavior may be different in chimpanzees and humans (Brosnan & Bshary 2010; Greenberg et al. 2010; Melis and Semmann 2010; Yamamoto & Tanaka 2009). In one set of studies, Warneken and colleagues compared the helping behavior of human infants and chimpanzees in a social setting. The experimenter made nonverbal requests for help, thus achieving a goal such as picking up a dropped object or opening a box. While both 18 month-old children and chimpanzees respond to simple requests (e.g. picking up a dropped object), children are able to respond to more complex requests (Warneken & Tomasello 2006, video from these studies is available here). Other studies found that chimpanzees help humans or conspecifics open doors to acquire food (Warneken et al. 2007; Melis et al. 2008), and respond to conspecific requests to bring a needed tool (Yamamoto et al. 2009). Chimpanzees even help a conspecific gain food after they have already been rewarded, without the need for a request for assistance (Greenberg et al. 2010).

Other experiments failed to elicit any helping behavior, even when helping required no additional effort on the actor’s part (Silk et al. 2005; Jensen et al. 2006; Vonk et al. 2008). In one study, the experimental setup allowed the actor to pull one of two ropes, one of which delivered food to only the actor, and the other of which delivered food to an adjacent chimpanzee as well as the actor (Silk et al. 2005). No preference was found for pulling the rope that rewarded both animals, even though the actor could see and hear the other chimpanzee. There was no significant correlation between another animal being present and which rope was pulled. Silk and colleagues conclude that “The absence of other-regarding preferences in chimpanzees may indicate that such preferences are a derived property of the human species, tied to sophisticated capacities for cultural learning, theory of mind, perspective taking and moral judgment” (Silk et al. 2005, 1359).

Several explanations have been offered for the negative result. Some suggest the chimpanzees may have been distracted by the presence of food (Warneken & Tomasello 2006), or that they are more likely to help in response to a request for help (Yamamoto 2009). However, additional experimental results find that chimpanzees will help conspecifics acquire food even when there isn’t a request for assistance; instead, the design of the studies may have elicited chimpanzee’s competitive nature (Greenberg et al. 2010).

The conclusion that some primate species will cooperate in some contexts has led to a wider investigation into the situations the lead to cooperation. Byrnit and colleagues (2015) found that chimpanzees and bonobos tended to share high value food more than low value food. Suchak et al (2014) found that chimpanzees spontaneously engage in joint action, and particularly prefer to cooperate with kin or nonkin of similar rank. Molesti and Majolo (2016) found that wild Barbary macaques are more likely to cooperate with a partner they are known to affiliate with. And, in a large study of 15 primate species, researchers found that cooperative breeding is the best predictor for increased prosocial behavior. They conclude that human hyper-cooperation we see today most likely evolved from the hominid move toward cooperative childcare (Burkart et al 2014). In response to studies and observations that great apes and other primates do cooperate in some cases, Michael Tomasello insists that for chimpanzees, "the key to understanding their cooperation is this same overarching matrix of social competition" (2016, 23).

4.5.3 Punishment

Punishment might be considered the flipside of helping. Like altruistic behaviors, acts of punishment may lower individual fitness, so the existence of animal punishment is a puzzle for biologists. Across many species, individuals engage in aggressive acts in response to violations of their interests. However, game theoretical analysis suggests that punishment is an adaptive strategy for individuals living in stable social groups, and that punishment can help establish or secure dominance in a social group (Clutton-Brock & Parker 1995).

Experimental studies of primate responses to violations of their interests (or of group norms) have uncovered mixed results. For example, while capuchin monkeys will withdraw and stop participating in a task if they observe another monkey getting a better reward for the same task (Brosnan & de Waal 2003), chimpanzees do not reject an unequal division of resources in an ultimatum game (Jensen et al. 2007) (see philosophy of economics). Jensen and colleagues suggest that chimpanzees may not be concerned with fairness, and are instead rational maximizers of resources. In response it has been argued that just as what counts as fair differs among human communities, what is unfair to humans may not be unfair to another species; researchers should consider natural behavior in order to uncover potential fairness norms (Bekoff & Pierce 2009; Brosnan & Bshary 2010).

Other studies have directly tested punishment in chimpanzees. While there is evidence that chimpanzees will punish a thief who stole food from him (Jensen et al. 2007), currently there are only negative findings on the issue of third party punishment (Jensen et al. 2007; Riedl et al. 2010); in an experimental setting, even mothers will not retaliate against an individual who steals food from their offspring. However, since some field researchers report incidents of third party punishment in the wild, further research is required.

Experiments designed to examine the evolutionary roots of social norms are also suggestive. Chimpanzees look longer at video clips of infanticide than at other clips with striking stimuli but lacking norm violations (von Rohr et al. 2010). Whether such findings suggest that normative elements are present in animal communities is an issue that requires further investigation. Many questions remain to be answered (and asked). The mechanisms of altruism, cooperation and punishment, the existence of social norms, the affective requirements of moral reasoning are all issues that require conceptual analysis as well as empirical investigation of prosocial behavior in humans and other animals.

5. Animal Cognition and Philosophy: What Next?

Today we are in a kind of golden era when it comes to animal cognition research. Different species are being studied in the field and in the lab, and the results of these studies may be relevant to areas of philosophy including action theory, agency, belief, concepts, consciousness, culture, epistemology, ethics, folk psychology, imagery, language, memory, mental causation, mental content, modularity of mind, perception, personal identity, practical reason, rationality, and so forth. It seems that every day a new report is released, and many of these seem to have some theoretical implications.

Of course, scientific reports must be examined carefully to distinguish between methodologically solid findings and unwarranted interpretations, and it goes without saying that popular media reports of these studies are sometimes misleading. The epistemology of animal cognition research has been one area with much recent activity (see e.g. Buckner 2013; Clatterbuck 2015; Fitzpatrick 2008; Halina 2015; Meketa 2014; Sober 2015; Starzak 2016).

Philosophy of animal cognition, as a subfield of philosophy of science, is one place where such methodological questions can be examined. For further reading in this area, see Kristin Andrews’ (2015) The Animal Mind: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Animal Cognition, Colin Allen and Marc Bekoff’s book Species of Mind: The Philosophy and Biology of Cognitive Ethology, and the collection The Philosophy of Animal Minds edited by Robert Lurz. For an introduction to an evolutionary psychological approach to studying animal cognition, see Sara Shettleworth’s Cognition, Evolution, and Behavior. For an introduction to the ethological approach to studying animals, see Philip Lehner’s Handbook of Ethological Methods.


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