Supplement to Anomalous Monism

Related Issues

Davidson’s philosophy is extraordinarily systematic and innovative, and Anomalous Monism is only one of his fundamental contributions to the philosophical landscape. In this supplement, we look at issues that have arisen in considering how Anomalous Monism relates to two of the other pillars of his work: the rejection of conceptual relativism and its underlying dualism between conceptual scheme and uninterpreted empirical content, which Davidson refers to as the “third dogma of empiricism”, and the semantic externalist thesis that the determinants of linguistic meaning and mental content lie in the external world rather than on the surfaces of, or even further within, persons’ bodies. There are interesting questions about the relationship between each of these doctrines and Anomalous Monism.

1. Anomalous Monism and Scheme-Content Dualism

Davidson (1974a) argued against a traditional distinction underlying modern and much contemporary philosophy between concepts or conceptual schemes and empirical content—intuitions or uninterpreted sensory events. The argument turns largely on the connection between those ideas and the notion of an untranslatable language. Davidson argued that this notion must be rejected, and that doing so largely eliminated the threat of conceptual relativism, providing a sort of guarantee that our most fundamental beliefs are by and large true. The details of the argument will not concern us here. However, a number of critics have claimed that Davidson’s rejection of conceptual relativism and its underlying dualism between conceptual scheme and empirical content is inconsistent with one or another premise in his argument for anomalous monism. McDowell suggested that the cause-law principle was in tension with it. Manuel di Pinedo has more recently argued that both the cause-law principle as well as Davidson’s related extensionalism about events—and therefore his token-identity theory of mind—are inconsistent with it. And Solomon early on suggested that mental anomalism conflicts with it (Solomon 1974). In this section we look briefly at these issues.

McDowell suggested that Davidson’s commitment to the cause-law principle was in tension with Davidson’s rejection of scheme-content dualism—the so-called “third dogma” of empiricism (McDowell 1985; Davidson 1974a)—and in effect constituted a fourth dogma of empiricism. McDowell does not think the cause-law principle is needed for a minimal version of materialism, and claims that without the need to justify materialism there is no rationale for it in Davidson’s framework.

One way of parsing McDowell’s idea is that the only plausible rationale for the requirement of strict covering laws for singular causal relations is based on the Humean claims, first, that we can’t perceive singular causal relations, and, second, that therefore the only way to distinguish between events that are causally related and those that stand in a relation of mere temporal succession is to bring in the concept of regular succession, with its close ties to the notion of a strict covering law. Scheme-content dualism supposedly enters into Hume’s argument with the idea that the concept of necessary connection stands distinct from the content of the experience of singular events (McDowell 1985, 398). As we have already seen (3.2–3), however, Davidson’s argument in support of the cause-law principle does not appeal to any such claim, and so while it may well be true that this principle bears some relation to the third dogma, how it does isn’t apparent in Davidson’s actual thinking. The mere fact that Davidson is arguing in favor of the cause-law principle does not itself entail a commitment to the Humean view of the content of the experience of singular events that invites the worry. As McDowell himself notes, Davidson is not offering a reduction or analysis of singular causal statements in terms of the principle, but is merely stating a necessary condition for such statements. It is not at all obvious that insisting on such a condition forces a position either way on scheme-content dualism.

De Pinedo (2006) offers one way to clarify the supposed relation between the cause-law principle and the third dogma, by focusing on Davidson’s metaphysics of events. In particular, de Pinedo emphasizes that Davidson’s argument for monism depends upon the extensionalist view that the same event can be described in different vocabularies. As we saw in 1, Davidson had pointed out that Hume’s covering law requirement is not committed to the idea that the vocabulary in which the singular events are picked out must be the vocabulary in which the covering law is formulated, and from this together with the extensionalist assumption moved to the monistic conclusion that anomic mental events have physical descriptions that instantiate strict laws. De Pinedo argues that this extensionalism is in direct conflict with Davidson’s rejection of the third dogma, because it entails that the events variously described are “noumenal” (di Pinedo 2006, 86–90, using Kant’s term for things in themselves, independent of conceptualization), and that positing them depends upon a “schemeless method” for individuating events (de Pinedo 2006, 87)—one that “allows us to say that the same event is both the one described by the nomological vocabulary of physics and by the normative vocabulary of psychology”. And he claims that Davidson’s criterion for event-individuation—that two events are identical if and only if they share all causes and effects—is precisely an attempt to provide such a method (de Pinedo 2006, 83–84). Since the ideas of “noumenal” events and “schemeless” individuation methods seem so intimately caught up with the third dogma, di Pinedo claims that their source—extensionalism—and bounty—token-identity—must both be rejected.

Extensionalist criteria (whether it is Davidson’s earlier causal or later spatiotemporal version) are supposed to be a “schemeless” method because they apply indiscriminately to all events, no matter how they are described. Davidson needs such an indiscriminate criterion in order to derive monism, but according to de Pinedo is not entitled to it precisely because of the basis for mental anomalism—that the constitutive criteria for the mental and the physical are distinct. de Pinedo asks:

From where does Davidson get his token-identities then? What area of our picture of reality can simultaneously capture nomological and anomalous features of the same event? …the identities…do not fit any of our conceptual devices. Davidson is defenseless against the accusation that that such identities are noumenal. (de Pinedo 2006, 89)

De Pinedo’s objection seems to be that any particular claim that this mental event is token-identical to that physical event cannot be made from the perspective of either the mental or the physical explanatory schemes, and there is no other explanatory scheme from which to make such a claim. So it can only be made from a schemeless perspective—which makes it noumenal and thus in conflict with Davidson’s rejection of the third dogma. As de Pinedo says,

which entities get related to which other entities cannot be postulated independently of the conceptual framework needed to make sense of such relations. But, famously, that framework excludes laws connecting mental and physical predicates. (di Pinedo 2006, 83)

This presumably is behind de Pinedo’s related point that Davidson’s distinction between causal relations and causal explanations is also in conflict with his rejection of the third dogma because of its basis in the extensionalist view of events (di Pinedo 2006, 83).

Three points need to be addressed in response to di Pinedo. First, extensionalism by itself does not entail that there are possible correct descriptions of events that are radically different from the familiar descriptions of our current scheme or some conservative extension of it. It is only if such descriptions—ones that are not translatable—are possible that the conclusion might follow that the events are “noumenal”. And, most importantly, there is nothing in the extensionalist picture itself that entails this, and Davidson’s own argument that tells against their possibility. This shows that Davidson’s extensionalism and rejection of the third dogma are fully consistent with each other.

Second, de Pinedo appears to think that for something to be an explanatory framework it must issue in strict laws. If this were true, then the most basic sorts of event-identity claims—for instance, between the most newsworthy event of the day and the bridge’s collapse—would have to be rejected because belonging to distinct frameworks. Furthermore, an explanatory scientific framework relating specific physical and mental properties does exist (see the supplement on Explanatory Epiphenomenalism). The fact that it can’t issue in exceptionless laws relating the two does not mean it is illusory—Davidson himself is clear on this in allowing for ceteris paribus relations between the mental and physical schemes. And while there may be philosophical and empirical problems concerning how to justify particular claims of token-identities, we have seen that they don’t affect Davidson’s considered view of monism (5.2).

Third, as we have seen, Davidson’s monism is not in any case based in particular identifications of mental and physical events, but rather in an a priori argument. So de Pinedo’s questions above must be understood to be concerned with the perspective from which such a priori philosophical claims generally are made, because they typically are made about explanatory frameworks and not within them—for instance, the question of how the mental and physical frameworks relate to each other, and the question whether we can make sense of alternative conceptual schemes. These sorts of questions arise from within our general conceptual scheme, when we look at its various commitments and explore their consistency. One of philosophy’s central tasks has always been to probe the foundations and relations between explanatory frameworks.

Davidson made a related point to a related concern expressed early on by Robert Solomon, who asked how Davidson’s rejection of conceptual relativism could be squared with his assertion of mental anomalism and its claim that the mental and physical schemes are incommensurable (Solomon 1974, 66). Solomon assumed that Davidson’s rejection of conceptual relativism entailed that all explanatory schemes must be commensurable—inter-translatable—and thus mutually reducible. Davidson replied by pointing out that his rejection of conceptual relativism and incommensurability concerns an entire language—

nothing… can be left out that is needed to make sense of the rest….Psychological concepts…cannot be reduced…to others. But they are essential to our understanding of the rest. (Davidson 1974c, 243–44)

Davidson’s point is that the incommensurability posited by mental anomalism holds between subparts of one full-blown language, not between two such languages. Psychological concepts are essential to understanding language because of the ineliminable role they play in communication and interpretation. One key point Davidson is making here, which is relevant to the previous discussion of de Pinedo, is that our conceptual scheme already contains ceteris paribus laws relating the mental and the physical that we rely upon in understanding each other. Scientific investigation into the relation between mental and physical events is a refinement of an already existing framework—limited, according to mental anomalism, but nonetheless explanatory and fruitful.

2. Mental Anomalism and Semantic Externalism

Semantic externalism holds that the meanings of linguistic expressions and/or the contents of mental states and events are constituted, at least in part, by objects and events in the external world. In this section we look at Davidson’s commitment to this doctrine and its relationship to mental anomalism. In some ways, formulating the issues in terms of mental content and thoughts makes the philosophical stakes clearer: according to semantic externalism, without an external world, there would be no mental content to thoughts. And mental anomalism is in the first instance formulated in mental rather than linguistic terms. However, the issues carry over without significant remainder for Davidson. For ease of exposition, our discussion will, depending on context, be alternately framed in terms both of meaning, utterances or expressions and in terms of content and thoughts. As we have seen (4.3), the causal definition argument interprets mental anomalism as flowing from Davidson’s independent commitments concerning the casual nature of mental concepts. Semantic externalism is essentially a thesis about the casual constitution of mental content by external objects and events. So it provides additional support for the causal definition argument’s approach to mental anomalism.

Davidson argues that mental contents are determined by their external, environmental causes—“water” refers to H2O because H2O is the systematic cause of tokenings of “water” during its period of acquisition by an agent. Another agent could mean, and therefore think, something different by “water”—the substance XYZ instead—because of differences in the environment and history of acquisition of their concept. Davidson claims that this entails psychophysical anomalism. He argues that two agents could be in identical internal physical conditions while thinking different thoughts expressed by “water”, and thus realizing different mental properties, because their respective histories of causal interaction and acquisition of the relevant concepts are different. If this is the case, then semantic externalism rules out the possibility of strict laws of the form ‘P1 → M1’ (Davidson 1987a, 1995b).

A natural response to this argument is that if the environments of the two agents are different, and this is responsible for their semantic divergence, then that environmental difference simply needs to be folded into the relevant laws, which are of course massively underdescribed anyway (clearly more than P1 by itself is needed to guarantee any effect, and thus M1). Thus, in the H2O world, ‘P1 & P2 → M1’ would hold, while in the XYZ world, ‘P1 & P3 → M2’ would hold, with ‘P1’ and ‘P2’ in each law representing the semantically relevant environmental differences of the two worlds. This maneuver would effectively block counterexamples of the kind suggested by Davidson’s argument by preventing the same antecedents of laws—which only as a set guarantee the consequent—from being met by two individuals with different histories of acquisition, and thus different concepts. This response would thereby do away with any exceptions to the laws based on semantic externalism. It would thereby block Davidson’s argument from semantic externalism to mental anomalism.

However, there are externalist thought experiments intended to show that two individuals could be in globally physically indiscernible circumstances and yet still be mentally distinct—either with different thoughts, or with one thinking thoughts and the other having no thoughts at all. Davidson develops the latter sort of case (1987a, 443–44), in which a creature is imagined emerging ex nihilo, with no causal history at all, yet physically identical to another individual. In this case, Davidson claims that the new creature would simply lack all thought content because of lack of any history of acquisition. In the former sort of case (see Boghossian 1989), an agent from one world is transported to the other world, retaining her original thought contents because of the history of acquisition condition, and therefore constituting a counterexample to that new world’s laws. Both cases would effectively prevent the maneuver of folding environmental differences into the relevant laws so as to block the counterexamples, because the global physical indiscernibility of the imagined worlds (essentially amounting to the two creatures inhabiting the same world) provides nothing on which to pin the semantic divergence. If such cases are convincing, then no strict psychophysical laws with mental consequents would be possible, because of the possibility of such counterexamples to any laws relating physical antecedents to mental consequents. (For discussion of these issues, see Shea 2003.)

Many questions arise concerning these thought experiments, primarily regarding the nature of or need for a history of acquisition condition and its bearing across worlds. But many other aspects of these cases are controversial, not the least of which is the basic externalist doctrine that the contents of thoughts and meanings of expressions derive essentially from distal environmental causes, as opposed to sensory surface stimulations or even internal brain processing. But we have at least seen how Davidson conceives of the relation between mental anomalism and semantic externalism, and how it illustrates the causal definition argument’s key claim that it is due to the causal nature of mental states that strict psychophysical laws are impossible.

A different connection between semantic externalism and mental anomalism in Davidson’s thinking has been explored by Yalowitz (1998a,b), who lays out the framework of an extended debate between Davidson and Quine over the nature of language and thought and the scientific status of psychology. According to Yalowitz’s reading, they share three key assumptions in that debate. First, that the scientific status of an explanatory framework depends upon its potential for delivering strict laws (this is largely definitional). Second, that the most promising approach to semantics is a causal theory, which in broad stroke holds that the objects or events that cause an utterance to be tokened by an agent determine the meaning of that utterance. And third, that there is a puzzle about whether strict causal laws are consistent with a coherent semantic theory. The puzzle is that any adequate semantic theory must be able to make sense of the notion of mistaken usage of an expression or tokening of a mental content, because meanings/contents are individuated by their conditions of correct usage—what makes “water” mean or apply to what it does is determined by conditions under which “water” is correctly tokened. A first pass at a strict semantic-determining law might say something like the following: ‘for all x’s, if x causes y to be tokened, then y means x’. And in holding that whatever causes a y to be tokened determines the meaning of y, no room would be made for cases of error—cases where some z causes y to be tokened, but y nonetheless counts as mistakenly applied to z. The point is that all sorts of things stand in causal relations to tokenings. There is a considerable problem of determining which of these myriad causes constitutes the conditions of correctness, rather than occasions of mistaken usage. Without such a distinction, the most basic condition of adequacy for a semantic theory will not have been met.

According to Yalowitz, Quine and Davidson diverge in how to deal with this problem of error. Quine, committed to providing a scientific framework for semantics, holds on to the requirement that semantics issue in strict semantic-determining laws, and responds to the problem of error by holding that mistaken utterances of an individual can be identified only relative to a norm established by the usage of other speakers of the same language. Individuals considered in isolation, then, cannot be assigned meanings. Individuals must share a language with others, relative to which their usage can gauged for correctness, in order for the utterances to mean something—to have conditions of correctness. Further, according to Quine, in order for semantic laws to be strict the conditions of correctness must be located proximally rather than distally, in the sensory stimulations on the bodily surfaces of individuals’ bodies rather than in the external environment of objects and events shared by them. As Davidson observes, the further out one goes in the causal chain extending beyond a person’s skin, the greater chance there is that the chain can be interfered with, with the result that the appropriate behavior is not triggered (Davidson 1992, 262). The proximal cause thus

has the best claim to be called the stimulus, since the more distant an event is causally the more chance there is that the causal chain will be broken. (Davidson 1989, 197)

Here Yalowitz identifies a fourth key assumption shared by Quine and Davidson: that degree of distance between cause and effect bears directly on the possibility of strict lawful relations (on which see further below). Quine therefore deals with (1) the problem of accounting for the possibility of error (2) within a scientific semantic framework by requiring both that individuals share languages with others (which responds to (1)), and that meaning is determined by proximal as opposed to distal causes (which responds to (2)).

According to Yalowitz’s reading, Davidson’s general approach to semantics and to the possibility of a scientific psychology is formulated largely in response to these positions of Quine’s. The key divergence comes in Davidson’s rejection of Quine’s solution to the problem of accounting for error and thus conditions of correctness. For Davidson, this specific sort of communal solution to the problem of error leads to an objectionable sort of relativism which is inadequate for a genuinely objective notion of error (Davidson 1984, xix; 1990, 309). The possibility of error cannot be due merely to the relationship between different individuals’ overlapping linguistic dispositions. Otherwise, the notion of truth will be reduced to mere agreement. It thus must be reflected directly in semantic-determining laws governing individuals’ usage. The issue, then, is how to do this. Davidson goes on to reject Quine’s location of the conditions of correctness that determine meaning proximally, on individuals’ bodily surfaces, in response to this problem. Instead, he insists that conditions of correctness must be located in the shared external environment of individuals. We have seen that this increase in distance, according to Davidson, allows for greater possibility of interference in the chain between cause (condition of correctness) and effect (utterance). This interference thus allows for a more slack relation between conditions of correctness and utterances that in turn allows Davidson to make sense of the notion of error without appealing to a shared language community. Since, then, strict semantic laws cannot account for error, and are tied to proximal conditions of correctness, Davidson insists on distal conditions of correctness and the subsequent anomic—ceteris paribus—semantic laws expressing them, which have the slackness necessary for accounting for the possibility of error. Semantic externalism is thus motivated in large part by the key condition of adequacy for semantic theory—accounting for the possibility of error and thus conditions of correctness for meanings and concepts. And mental anomalism is claimed to be necessary for accounting for error and thus meaning and content.

Yalowitz’s reading of how semantic externalism and mental anomalism are related is largely historical and reconstructive. While it makes clear contact with some of Davidson’s statements concerning these issues, and highlights the significant and longstanding philosophical (and, indeed, personal) relationship between Davidson and Quine going back to Davidson’s graduate study at Harvard, there is much that it doesn’t account for, and many points of detail that require fleshing out. Further, as Yalowitz himself notes, it commits Davidson to a rather unconvincing argument for both mental anomalism and semantic externalism. It is clearly false that degree of distance between cause and effect is tied to the distinction between strict and ceteris paribus laws. The greater possibility of interference by itself doesn’t force an anomalous relation between cause and effect. It simply requires a broadening of the conditions in the antecedent of the law, leaving wide open the question of whether this broadening can be completed—fully articulated—to the point of providing a strict law. If that is not possible, and such laws are essentially ceteris paribus, this has nothing especially to do with the possibility of interference by itself. Therefore, the connection between the possibility of error, mental anomalism and semantic externalism is not as straightforward as Yalowitz’s reading suggests. However, Yalowitz’s framing of the debate between Davidson and Quine on these issues and its bearing on Davidson’s views concerning semantic externalism and mental anomalism does have the virtue of providing for a kind of bridge between the two very different readings of the argument for mental anomalism (4.2–4.3). While it locates concerns about the causal definition of mental concepts as fundamental to that argument, its focus on the normative notion of error—mistaken usage—is intimately related to concerns about rationality. For Davidson, to be rational requires applying concepts, and concepts require conditions of correctness. Assuming a causal approach to determining such conditions, the line of argument Yalowitz reconstructs holds that both mental anomalism and semantic externalism are needed in order to make sense of concepts and therefore rationality. While perhaps not as tightly related as this reconstruction portrays, these several theses are clearly absolutely central to Davidson’s philosophy of mind generally, and therefore Anomalous Monism.

3. Anomalous Monism and Freedom

In this section we explore the relationship between anomalous monism and the nature and possibility of human freedom. Initially, the connection seems to be clear. Human freedom intuitively seems to be threatened by the existence of strict predictive psychological and psychophysical laws, since if our actions can be exceptionlessly predicted ahead of time it seems that we lack choice or control over them. And since mental anomalism denies the existence of such laws, it should thus be considered (and Davidson claims it to be) a necessary condition of human freedom. However, this intuitive connection is complicated by the monism component of anomalous monism, since monism, as understood by Davidson, entails that every event – including human actions – is covered by a strict physical law. It is also complicated by the existence of conceptions of compatibilism about freedom and determinism that explicitly allow for the possibility of strict psychological and psychophysical laws. The intuitive connection between anomalous monism and human freedom therefore needs some sorting out. The literature on freedom and determinism has gotten extremely complex since Davidson’s remarks on them and their relation to anomalous monism, so the following can be no more than a brief and selective overview, in order to better place Davidson’s position within both historical and contemporary discussions (see also Related Views: Spinoza’s Parallelism). We will focus on two key issues: the connection to Kant’s theory of freedom, which Davidson claims bears a close relation to anomalous monism, and the more general claim that anomalous monism is a necessary condition for human freedom. As we shall see, both claims are more complex and problematic than Davidson’s brief remarks recognize.

To begin, consider the basic picture of action offered to us by anomalous monism. Monism entails that strict physical laws determine that one’s arm will go up on a particular occasion, and this bodily movement can, in principle, be exceptionlessly predicted. However, mental anomalism entails that whether that rising of the arm is token-identical to a raising of one’s arm – an intentional action – is not something that can be predicted exceptionlessly. Complete knowledge of physical law cannot decide whether the rising of an arm is an arm-raising. Two immediate points come up here. First, one sort of freedom made room for by anomalous monism appears to be freedom with respect to whether one’s arm going up is an instance of one’s intentionally raising one’s arm. One’s arm is determined to go up; this leaves it as an open question whether this event can be described as an intentional action. By itself, this is not an intuitively adequate conception of what freedom consists in. While interpretative considerations of rationality and Davidson’s basic theory of action address this gap to some extent, they don’t provide a theory of what freedom consists in. Davidson nowhere provides this further theory. Second, this is not a picture where alternative possible actions or choices in any clear sense play a role – the alternative isn’t an action or choice at all, it’s a non-intentional bodily movement. As we will see below, Davidson in fact rejects the intuitive requirement that freedom entails the ability to do or choose otherwise. And we will see that this point stands in some tension with Davidson’s claim that mental anomalism is necessary for freedom.

3.1 Anomalous Monism and Kant’s Theory of Freedom

Davidson opens and closes his definitive statement of anomalous monism (Davidson 1970) with remarks concerning Kant’s views on human freedom. He starts by expressing sympathy with claims of Kant’s concerning the need to eradicate any appearance of contradiction between the ideas of human freedom and natural necessity, noting that the same need exists if “anomaly” is substituted for freedom, and that for Kant freedom entails anomaly (as we shall see below, this last point is more complicated than Davidson seems to recognize). He likens these to his own attempt to make consistent the interaction, cause-law, and anomalism principles. And he ends by first emphasizing the point that psychological explanation operates in a very different conceptual framework than physical explanation, and that mental anomalism is a necessary condition for viewing actions as free. But he then quotes approvingly of Kant’s claim that not only can these different conceptual frameworks co-exist, they must also be thought “as necessarily united in the same subject” (Davidson 1970, 225). And he likens this latter thought to the monism he has used to resolve the apparent tension between those principles. Davidson goes no further in relating his views to Kant’s, but some Kant commentators have followed up on these remarks with extended treatments of the relation between the two views.

Anomalous monism has been claimed, by Ralf Meerbote (Meerbote 1984) and Hud Hudson (Hudson 1994, 2002), to be an appropriate framework for articulating Kant’s account of freedom. In claiming this, Meerbote and Hudson understand Kant to be a compatibilist about freedom and determinism, rather than the incompatibilist he has usually been labeled. According to both, Kant’s notion of the “causality of reason” and how it fits into his deterministic account of the natural world is best understood along the following lines. Reasons are token identical to physical (brain) states, and the causality of reason is to be understood as the casual interaction of reasons under their physical descriptions. Under their mental descriptions, reasons only bear a rationalizing relationship to the actions that they explain. Kant’s key notion of “spontaneity”, which is generally thought to be the foundation for both his view of freedom and subsequent incompatibilism, is understood in terms of a belief-desire model of deliberation on which agents choose freely when they have epistemic autonomy – they are able to stand back from their beliefs and desires, decide which are rationally defensible, and act in accordance with this decision. On Meerbote’s and Hudson’s views, such spontaneity is compatible with determinism (see further below).

Meerbote and Hudson read Kant’s transcendental idealism, and in particular Kant’s key distinction between the phenomenal and the noumenal (things as they appear to us and things as they are in themselves), according to the “two-descriptions” view, which has been articulated and defended most recently and thoroughly by Henry Allison (Allison, 1983). And they (unlike Allison – see below) relate that distinction closely to the distinction between physical and mental descriptions of singular events. On the two-descriptions view, we can consider the objects and events of human experience in two distinct ways: as they appear to us and as they are in themselves. Things as they appear must conform to the conditions that are necessary for us to experience and represent them. In particular, they must appear within space and time, and must conform to the causal principle that every event has a cause and is determined to occur, which is established in the Second Analogy (Allison 1990, 2–4). Things in themselves can be thought of independently of the conditions under which we must experience them, though they cannot be known because of the limitations imposed by our cognitive apparatus. This two-descriptions view contrasts with the two-worlds interpretation of Kant’s distinction, according to which appearances and things in themselves constitute two ontologically distinct sets of entities (Allison 1990, 4). Here we set aside the two-world view, since none of the participants in the debate about the relation between Kant’s theory of freedom and anomalous monism hold it.

On both Meerbote’s and Hudson’s view of Kant (Meerbote 1984,155; Hudson 2002, 247), description types used in describing things as they appear to us are law-like and thus deterministic, while descriptions types used for things in themselves are not.

The general picture they share can be summarized as follows: action explanations are compatible with the determinism of the physical realm because such explanations are not causal but instead are rationalizations. Since they aren’t causal, they aren’t law-like – this is the Kantian analogue to mental anomalism. However, because psychological descriptions pick out physical events – monism – we can make sense of a “causality of reason” in terms of the causal powers of psychological events under their physical descriptions. The resulting Kantian compatibilism about freedom and determinism is established by denying that mental events can be deterministically predicted or explained in the language of psychology (mental anomalism) but maintaining that mental events are part of nature and are determined and determining (i.e. have causal powers in accordance with the strictures of the Second Analogy) under their physical descriptions as events in the brain. There are many interesting issues that arise in considering the details of this interpretation which we cannot investigate here. In considering the relationship between this interpretation of Kant’s theory of freedom and anomalous monism, we will focus on the general picture, and in particular the role that causality plays in it.

What is notable about this picture is the claim that causality plays no role in psychological explanation itself, and its centrality in connecting Kant’s theory with anomalous monism. We are being presented with a picture almost identical to one that Davidson criticized from his earliest writings, according to which psychological explanations are non-causal and therefore anomalous rationalizations, while physical explanations are causal and therefore law-like. As we have seen in 2.2, Davidson insists on the need for causal descriptions within psychological explanations in order to solve the “because” problem: we can’t pick out the actual reasons that explain an action (as opposed to reasons that the agent has available and that could rationalize the action but that don’t actually play a role in explaining it) unless we see the explanatory reason as causing the action (so that causality is essential to articulating a distinction between active and dormant reasons). This, together with the key point that singular causal relations between psychologically described events don’t entail law-like psychological relations, allowed Davidson to unify the two competing theories of action – the hermeneutical and the causal theories. Hudson (Hudson 2002, 261) shows some awareness of this issue, in expressing sympathy with the interaction principle, which plays a key role in Davidson’s argument for monism. But he fails to recognize that this principle is independent of and prior to Davidson’s monism, since it figures in an argument for it. For Hudson, the interaction principle can only be made sense of by assuming monism and then claiming that mental events cause physical events by virtue of being identical with the physical events that play the truly causal role. For Davidson, this gets things backwards: the interaction principle is assumed, and it is then shown that it, together with the anomalism and cause-law principles, entails monism.

It therefore is not plausible to present Kant’s theory of freedom, as understood by Meerbote and Hudson, as a precursor to anomalous monism. Henry Allison has also disputed the interpretative claims of Meerbote and Hudson concerning Kant’s theory itself. Though we can’t settle that interpretative dispute here, it is worth noting two key points involved in it. First, Allison strongly emphasizes a distinction that Kant draws between empirical and intelligible character. What is important in this distinction is that reason has both an empirical, phenomenal character as well as an intelligible, noumenal character. The empirical character of reason seems to get lost in Meerbote’s and Hudson’s accounts – reason explanations are pushed purely into the noumenal realm. Second, and related to the first point, Allison sees the notion of the causality of the will as absolutely central to Kant’s conception of freedom, and therefore finds the compatibilist picture presented by Meerbote and Hudson, on which there is no psychological causation per se but only by virtue of identity with physical events, unable to account for Kant’s picture. One way of thinking about this point relates to our previous criticism of Meerbote’s and Hudson’s removal of the concept of causality from psychological explanations. On both Allison’s interpretation of Kant and the interpretation of Davidson offered here, there must be causation within the psychological realm itself in order to account for all of our commitments about the mental.

However, this doesn’t mean that there is a convergence between Allison’s own view of Kant and anomalous monism. For one thing, the causation internal to the psychological takes place at the empirical level for Davidson, while it crucially must take place at the noumenal level according to Allison in order to account for freedom. Allison holds that the spontaneity in deliberation required for genuine freedom – involving the capacity to stand back from one’s reasons and evaluate them for justification – is not possible empirically but only noumenally. And as Allison emphasizes in his reading, Kant actually allows for empirical, strict psychological laws. Here Allison points to potentially conflicting claims that Kant makes: first, Kant appears to insist on psychological or psychophysical determinism – the view that all human actions are determined and predictable by the person’s empirical character (the causality of reason, and thus of beliefs, desires, and other psychological states) together with other contributing casual factors (Allison 1990, 31). Yet Kant appears to deny that there can be empirical psychological or psychophysical laws (Allison 1990, 31–34, 43). It isn’t easy to see how these two claims can be made consistent, though Allison tries to do so within Kant’s framework. In any case, Davidson’s position is that psychological and psychophysical determinism are both ruled out at the empirical level by mental anomalism. As we’ve seen, Meerbote and Hudson both emphasize Kant’s denial of empirical psychological and psychophysical laws in trying to connect his views with anomalous monism. And in one sense that is the right direction to go in aligning Kant with Davidson, since the thesis of mental anomalism is concerned with empirical reality. However, as noted earlier, Meerbote and Hudson can’t make full sense of Davidson’s position on this since they push psychological explanation entirely into the noumenal realm. Meerbote in fact claims that, for Kant, psychological events are not locatable in space or time except in so far as the physical token events that they are identical to are – the categories of causality, space, and time are not applicable to the noumenal realm, and therefore to psychological events (Meerbote 1984, 157; see also Hudson 2002, 247). It is worth noting, on this latter issue, that Davidson famously has rejected the very idea of a noumenal realm (Davidson 1974a), making Meerbote’s and Hudson’s alignment project even more implausible.

We began this discussion by noting Davidson’s own invocation of Kant on the thesis of mental anomalism, its status as a precondition for freedom, and monism. On the two-descriptions view of transcendental idealism, it initially can seem plausible to see in Davidson’s monism and mental anomalism a model for making sense of Kant’s picture: described physically, a person is subject to strict physical laws, and his behavior can be deterministically predicted; described mentally, a person’s thought and actions are not subject to strict psychological or psychophysical laws and thus can be seen as free. However, as we have seen, this initial appearance of isomorphism masks over difficult issues, in particular about the role of psychological causation in Davidson’s and Kant’s pictures and the place of psychology more generally in the empirical world for each. And, as we are about to see, there are other questions about the connection between mental anomalism and freedom that further complicate initial appearances concerning the relation between them.

3.2 Anomalous Monism and Contemporary Compatibilism

Within contemporary discussions of compatibilism there are several competing positions concerning the relationship between mental anomalism and freedom. As noted earlier, there is the very strong intuition, which Davidson claims to share, that anomalism is necessary for freedom. Now, typically this intuition is based on the thought that if one’s action or choice is exceptionlessly predictable, then one lacks control over it: it will occur no matter what, and is thus inconsistent with the idea that one could have done or chosen otherwise. There are two distinct claims involved here. The first is that the ability to do or choose otherwise is necessary for freedom. The second is that strict laws are inconsistent with the ability to do or choose otherwise. However, there are compatibilist positions that highlight the denial of one or the other of these claims. As discussed below, Davidson himself rejects the first claim for reasons deeply connected to his views on action explanation, agreeing with Harry Frankfurt’s well-known views (Davison 1973b, 75; Frankfurt 1969). This would seem to make the second issue irrelevant in a discussion of anomalous monism, since it depends on a notion that Davidson rejects. And Davidson has taken no position on the debate, generated by Lewis 1981, van Inwagen 1984, Fischer 1986 and others concerning whether determinism is inconsistent with the ability to do or choose otherwise. However, as we will see, Davidson’s embrace of Frankfurt’s view actually calls into question Davidson’s claim that mental anomalism is required for freedom. Though there has been no clear recognition of this point in the literature on either anomalous monism or freedom, we will see that it cuts to the very heart of the most central issue in the metaphysics of freedom. As argued below, in order to make sense of the intuition that the status of strict psychological and psychophysical laws is relevant to freedom, one must hold that the ability to do or choose otherwise is necessary for freedom. This doesn’t decide the compatibilism question, but it does push to the fore the second issue distinguished above: whether and how the ability to do or choose otherwise is consistent with determinism.

Compatibilists starting with Hume and more recently Frankfurt have argued that the ability to do otherwise is not necessary for the sort of freedom that we care about, which tracks moral responsibility (Hume 1748 [1993], section VIII; Frankfurt 1969). Frankfurt discusses cases where agents lack the ability to do otherwise than A because a coercive force will kick in if the agent chooses or begins to choose to do otherwise than A, guaranteeing that the agent A’s. He argues that our intuitions show that such an agent nonetheless can be held morally responsible for her actual action of A’ing. These intuitions derive from the fact that the agent performed the action because she wanted to and so wasn’t in fact coerced in any relevant sense. Davidson shares these intuitions, and notes that they flow directly from his account of rationalizing explanations, which highlight actions as intentional – as described from the agent’s point of view in terms of his reasons (Davidson 1973b, 75). He notes that in the kinds of cases Frankfurt imagines, there is overdetermination of a certain kind (a certain result A is causally guaranteed), but this overdetermination masks over an important, freedom-relevant distinction between intentionally and non-intentionally described actions. If the coercive force were to in fact kick in, the resulting action wouldn’t be intentional. It is intentional only under the description of doing it because one wants to. It is this intentionality that ascriptions of responsibility, and thus freedom, are tracking (here Davidson anticipates the discussion in Fischer 1994, chapter 7).

Incompatibilists have responded to this line of argument against the requirement of alternative possibilities for responsibility-relevant freedom. They claim that the case that Frankfurt imagines isn’t a counterexample to a properly formulated version of the alternative possibility requirement that drives incompatibilist intuitions: an agent freely A’s if they could have chosen, or begun to choose, not to A (Widerker 1995; Fischer 1994, chapter 7). The point is that the basic incompatibilist intuition about determinism is that it rules out the possibility of alternative possible actions. In the Frankfurt example, there is the actual action and then a counterfactual result that is not an intentional action because it’s coerced. Many philosophers now believe, and Frankfurt 2003 appears to have conceded, that there is no clear counterexample to this formulation of the incompatibilist intuition. However, Frankfurt insists that a distinction underlying his example, between causation and explanation, is sufficient to show that the incompatibilist requirement of alternative possibilities is nonetheless mistaken. There is a key conceptual difference between making an action unavoidable (which causal determinism appears to guarantee) and bringing it about that an action is performed. Ascriptions of responsibility-relevant freedom track the latter – they track how an agent was led to perform the action they performed, and this concerns whether the action was or was not intentional. This is a point that goes back to Hume’s classic presentation of compatibilism and rejection of the need for alternative possible actions: it is not whether, but instead how an action is determined that is relevant to responsibility-relevant freedom. If the action is determined by the agent’s wants (or, as with later compatibilist views, endorsed wants (Frankfurt 1971), or wants consistent with his values (Watson 1975), then the agent acts intentionally, and thus with responsibility-relevant freedom. Davidson would certainly agree with this general point, subject to the difficulties, discussed in 2.2 and 4, concerning spelling out being caused in the right way.

To the objection that one’s wanting to A may itself be determined in coercive fashion, compatibilists in this tradition have developed, in different ways, the core thought that what matters to freedom is the agent’s relationship to his wants. If the agent endorses those wants, or they are consistent with his values, then the fact that the wants might be determined is simply irrelevant to freedom considerations. Frankfurt himself has gone so far as to argue that a creature that was designed and created to have wants would be freely acting on them to the extent that he was designed to wholeheartedly endorse them (Frankfurt 1998, section III). On this view, the history of a creature’s mental properties is irrelevant to assignments of freedom; what matters is the agent’s mental structure at the time of action. Watson 2004, section III heavily emphasizes this point, arguing that a defensible compatibilism ultimately depends on rejecting any freedom-relevant distinction between purposeful determination (deriving from other agents) and merely natural determination. Otherwise, a door is left open that inevitably leads to incompatibilism, because only a concern about control could drive such a distinction, and determinism is ultimately incompatible with control. And control is precisely what is at issue in requiring alternative possible actions of choices for freedom. The important point here is that the existence of strict psychological or psychophysical laws, on Frankfurt’s and Watson’s views, is not only entirely consistent with freedom; a defensible compatibilism actually depends on holding this. And this point is closely tied to rejecting the requirement of alternative possibilities for freedom. On their view, Davidson’s position ultimately is incoherent.

Given Davidson’s rejection of the requirement of alternative possibilities, where do things stand with his claim that mental anomalism is required for freedom? It is clear that mental anomalism is required, on Davidson’s view, for intentional actions, because these are structured by rationalizing explanations and rationality is, as we’ve seen, integral to the argument for mental anomalism. But there is no necessary connection between intentional action and free action, except perhaps derivatively in that free action is action. It thus appears that mental anomalism has nothing directly to do with the status of actions as free. This is the cost of rejecting the requirement for alternative possibilities for freedom. Insofar, then, as one takes seriously the intuition that the status of strict psychological and psychophysical laws is relevant to the issue of freedom – as Davidson clearly does, and Frankfurt does not – one must accept some version of the principle of alternative possibilities: free action depends on the existence of alternative possible actions or choices. It is then necessary to confront the issue of how and whether strict physical laws are incompatible with such alternative possibilities.

Another way to put this criticism of Davidson’s attempt to maintain the relevance of mental anomalism to freedom while rejecting the requirement of alternative possibilities is to ask the following question: why should one care if one’s actions or choices are or are not exceptionlessly predictable by strict laws if one holds that alternative possibilities aren’t required for freedom? There is no clear answer to this question, and it certainly isn’t self-evident that it should matter. The fact that one’s action or choice is inevitable is threatening to one’s sense of freedom only if one thinks that one thereby cannot do or choose otherwise. Interestingly, this same point can be made about the Derk Pereboom’s striking claim that the “fundamental incompatibilist intuition” which makes determinism threatening to freedom in its morally relevant sense isn’t the forward-looking claim that determinism (i.e. the existence of strict laws) rules out alternative possibilities, but rather the backward-looking claim that determinism entails that one’s actions trace back to causal factors in the distant past beyond one’s control (Pereboom 1995, 257). Pereboom, like Davidson, aims to support Frankfurt’s rejection of the need for alternative possible actions or choices for freedom while nonetheless maintaining the relevance of the existence of deterministic laws for our sense of freedom. And Pereboom provides no answer to the question of why one should care about the fact that one’s actions trace back to causal factors in the distant past beyond one’s control, why this would seem to threaten our sense of freedom. He appears to take its significance as self-evident. But it is not. The conclusion to be drawn is that if one takes mental anomalism (and, more generally, the status of determinism) to be relevant to freedom, than one must accept some version of the principle of alternative possibilities rejected by Frankfurt, and thus one must take a stand on how or whether that principle is compatible with the cause-law principle, which is the expression of determinism within anomalous monism. There are a number of options for articulating a compatibilist conception of the ability to do or choose otherwise, including acting or choosing otherwise in relevantly similar circumstances, or in a world with slightly different laws or pasts (Lewis 1981, Fischer 1986.) The point here is simply that one owes some such account if one holds that mental anomalism is relevant to freedom. One can, alternatively, go Frankfurt’s full route and reject both the relevance of determinism to freedom and the need for alternative possibilities.

Finally, let us return to the basic picture of action offered to us by anomalous monism. As already noted, on Davidson’s view, strict physical laws determine that one’s arm will go up on a particular occasion, and this bodily movement can, in principle, be exceptionlessly predicted. However, mental anomalism entails that whether that rising of the arm is token-identical to a raising of one’s arm – an intentional action – is not something that can be predicted exceptionlessly. Complete knowledge of physical law cannot decide whether the rising of an arm is an arm-raising, and a free one at that. Whatever the factors are that go into deciding this, Davidson is clear that they don’t require the ability to do or choose otherwise. The sort of freedom made room for by anomalous monism, by itself, appears to be freedom with respect to whether one’s arm going up is an instance of one’s intentionally raising one’s arm. At the very least, this is not an intuitive or adequate conception of what freedom consists in. Finally, there needs to be some explanation provided of why it is that what we intend to do so often coincides with the occurrence of appropriate bodily movement that is determined by physical law and so going to happen anyway. (See Pereboom 1995, section III for related discussion.) Without some such explanation, free action can only appear to be an inexplicable miracle. This is a manifestation of the miraculous coincidence problem discussed in Supervenience and the Explanatory Primary of the Physical.

Copyright © 2019 by
Steven Yalowitz <yalowitz@umbc.edu>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.
[an error occurred while processing this directive]