First published Thu Aug 30, 2018

The concept of alienation identifies a distinct kind of psychological or social ill; namely, one involving a problematic separation between a self and other that properly belong together. So understood, it appears to play a largely diagnostic role, perhaps showing that something is awry with liberal societies and liberal political philosophy. Theories of alienation typically pick out a subset of these problematic separations as being of particular importance, and then offer explanatory accounts of the extent of, and prognosis for, alienation, so understood. Discussions of alienation are especially, but not uniquely, associated with Hegelian and Marxist intellectual traditions.

The present entry clarifies the basic idea of alienation. It distinguishes alienation from some adjacent concepts; in particular, from ‘fetishism’ and ‘objectification’. And it elucidates some conceptual and normative complexities, including: the distinction between subjective and objective alienation; the need for a criterion by which candidate separations can be identified as problematic; and (some aspects of) the relation between alienation and ethical value. The empirical difficulties often generated by ostensibly philosophical accounts of alienation are acknowledged, but not resolved.

1. The Basic Idea

1.1 Introduced

There are limits to what can usefully be said about the concept of alienation in general; that is, what can usefully be said without getting involved in the complexities of particular accounts, advanced by particular authors or associated with particular intellectual traditions. However, there is a basic idea here which seems to capture most authors and traditions, and which is not unduly elusive or difficult to understand.

This basic idea of alienation picks out a range of social and psychological ills involving a self and other. More precisely, it understands alienation as consisting in the problematic separation of a subject and object that properly belong together.

1.2 Elaborated

That formulation of the basic idea is perhaps too abbreviated to be easily intelligible, and certainly benefits from a little elaboration. The characterisation of alienation offered here—as a social or psychological ill involving the problematic separation of a subject and object that properly belong together—involves three constituent elements: a subject, an object, and the relation between them. It will be helpful to say a little more about each of these in turn.

First, the subject here is a self; typically, but not necessarily, a person, an individual agent. ‘Not necessarily’ because the subject could also be, for instance, a group of some kind. There seems to be no good reason to deny that a collective as well as an individual agent might be alienated from some object. For instance, as well as Anna being alienated from her government, it might be that women or citizens find themselves alienated from their government.

Second, the relevant object can take a variety of forms. These include: entities which are not a subject; another subject or subjects; and oneself. The object here might be an entity which is not a subject; for example, Beatrice might be alienated from the natural world, from a social practice, from an institution, or from social norms, where none of those entities are understood as agents of any kind. In addition, the object might be an entity which is another subject, another person or group; for example, Beatrice might be alienated from her childhood friend Cecile, and Beatrice might also be alienated from her own family. Lastly, the object here might be the original subject; that is, there might be reflexive variants of the relation, for example, in which Beatrice is alienated from herself.

Third, the relation is one of problematic separation between a subject and object that properly belong together. On the present account, all of these elements are required: there has to be a separation; the separation has to be problematic; and it has to obtain between a  subject and object that properly belong together.

The idea of separation is important. Not all problematic relations between relevant entities involve alienation. For instance, being overly integrated into some other object might also be a problematic or dysfunctional relation but it is not what is typically thought of as alienation. Imagine, for instance, that Cecile has no life, no identity, finds no meaning, outside of her family membership. It is tempting, at least for modern individuals, to say that she has an ‘unhealthy’ relationship with her family, but it would seem odd to say that she was alienated from it. Alienation is typically a problematic separation from something.

What I am calling problematic separations might be indicated by a wide variety of words and phrases. No particular vocabulary seems to be required by the basic idea. The linguistic variety here might include words suggesting: breaks (‘splits’, ‘ruptures’, ‘bifurcations’, ‘divisions’, and so on); isolation (‘indifference’, ‘meaninglessness’, ‘powerlessness’, ‘disconnection’, and so on); and hostility (‘conflicts’, ‘antagonism’, ‘domination’, and so on). All these, and more, might be ways of indicating problematic separations of the relevant kind. Of course, particular authors may use language more systematically, but there seems little reason to insist that a specific vocabulary is required by the basic idea.

The idea of the relevant separation having to be, in some way, problematic, is also important. Separations between a subject and object do not appear necessarily problematic. Relations of indifference, for example, might or might not be problematic. For an unproblematic instance, consider Daniela, a distinguished Spanish architect, who—when it is brought to her attention—discovers that she is unconcerned with, and apathetic towards, the complex constitutional relationship between the Pacific islands of Niue and New Zealand. Her indifference in this case looks unproblematic. Less obviously perhaps, the same might be true of relations of hostility; that is, that hostility also might or might not be problematic. For an unproblematic instance, consider Enid and Francesca, two highly competitive middleweight boxers competing in the Olympics for the first time. It may well be that a certain amount of antagonism and rancour between these two individual sportswomen is entirely appropriate; after all, if Enid identifies too closely with Francesca—imagine her experiencing every blow to Francesca’s desires and interests as a defeat for her own—she is not only unlikely to make it to the podium, but is also, in some way, failing qua boxer.

The suggestion here is that to be appropriately problematic—appropriate, that is, to constitute examples of alienation—the separations have to obtain between a subject and object that properly belong together (Wood 2004: 3). More precisely, that the candidate separations have to frustrate or conflict with the proper harmony or connectedness between that subject and object. Imagine, for instance, that both the indifference of Daniela, and the hostility of Enid, also takes appropriately problematic forms. Perhaps we discover that Daniela has become increasingly indifferent to her lifelong vocation, that she no longer cares about the design and construction issues over which she had previously always enthused and obsessed; whilst Enid has started bullying her domestic partner, not only behaving in an aggressive and intolerant way, but on occasion even threatening physical violence. What makes these examples of separation (indifference and hostility) appear appropriately problematic is that they violate some baseline condition of harmony or connectedness between the relevant entities. (A baseline condition that does not seem to obtain in the earlier examples of unproblematic separation.) Alienation obtains when a separation between a subject and object that properly belong together, frustrates or conflicts with that baseline connectedness or harmony. To say that they properly belong together is to suggest that the harmonious or connected relation between the subject and object is rational, natural, or good. And, in turn, that the separations frustrating or conflicting with that baseline condition, are correspondingly irrational, unnatural, or bad. Of course, that is not yet to identify what might establish this baseline harmony as, say, rational, natural, or good. Nor is it to claim that the disruption of the baseline harmony is all-things-considered bad, that alienation could never be a justified or positive step. (These issues are discussed further in sections 5.1 and 6.2, respectively.)

1.3 Modesty Of

This basic idea of alienation appears to give us a diverse but distinct set of social and psychological phenomena; picking out a class of entities which might have little in common other than this problematic separation of subject and object. The problematic separations here are between the self (including individual and collective agents) and other (including other selves, one’s own self, and entities which are not subjects). So understood, the basic idea seems to play largely a diagnostic role; that is, the problematic separations might indicate that something is awry with self or social world, but do not, in themselves, offer an explanation of, or suggest a solution to, those ills.

On this account, the basic idea of alienation looks conceptually rather modest. In particular, this idea is not necessarily committed to certain stronger claims that might sometimes be found in the literature. That all these social and psychological ills are characterised by a problematic separation, for example, does not make alienation a natural kind, anymore than—to borrow an example associated with John Stuart Mill—the class of white objects is a natural kind (Wood 2004: 4). Nor, for instance, need there be any suggestion that the various forms of alienation identified by this account are necessarily related to each other; that, for example, they are all explained by the same underlying factor. Of course, particular theorists may have constructed—more or less plausible—accounts of alienation that do advance those, or similar, stronger claims. For instance, the young Karl Marx (1818–1883) is often understood to have suggested that one of the systematic forms of alienation somehow explains all the other ones (Wood 2004: 4). The claim here is simply that these, and other, stronger claims are not required by the basic idea.

That said, the basic idea appears to require only a few additions in order to extend its critical reach significantly. Consider two further suggestions often made in this context: that alienation picks out an array of non-trivial social and psychological ills that are prevalent in modern liberal societies; and that the idea of ‘alienation’ is distinct from that of ‘injustice’ on which much modern liberal political philosophy is focused. These familiar claims are not extravagant, but, so understood, the concept of alienation would appear to have some critical purchase on both contemporary liberal societies (for containing alienation) and contemporary liberal political philosophy (for neglecting alienation). The implied critical suggestion—that the concept of alienation reveals that something significant is awry with both liberal society and liberal understandings—looks far from trivial. (Of course, establishing that those purported failings reveal fundamental flaws in either liberal society, or liberal political philosophy, is rather harder to accomplish.)

Particular theories of alienation typically restrict the range of problematic separations that they are interested in, and introduce more explanatory accounts of the extent and prognosis of alienation so characterised. They might, for instance, focus on social rather than psychological ills, and maintain that these are caused by certain structural features—particular aspects of its economic arrangements, for instance—of the relevant society. Such explanatory claims are of considerable interest. After all, understanding the cause of a problem looks like a helpful step towards working out whether, and how, it might be alleviated or overcome. However, these explanatory claims are not readily open to general discussion, given the significant disagreements between particular thinkers and traditions that exist in this context. Note also that introducing these various restrictions of scope, and various competing explanatory claims, increases the complexity of the relevant account. However, these complexities alone scarcely explain the—somewhat undeserved—reputation that the concept of alienation has for being unduly difficult or elusive. It might be that their impact is compounded—at least in the intellectual traditions with which the concept of alienation is most often associated (Hegelianism and Marxism)—by language and argumentative structures that are unfamiliar to some readers.

2. Disclaimers

At this point, two related, and broadly methodological, disclaimers—acknowledging the limitations of this entry—may be appropriate. They concern intellectual history and textual exegesis.

Although reference is made to past authors and traditions, very little is said here about the historical development of the concept of alienation. The term is usually thought to have comparatively modern European origins. In English, the term had emerged by the early fifteenth century, already possessing an interesting cluster of associations. ‘Alienation’, and its cognates, could variously refer: to an individual’s estrangement from God (it appears thus in the Wycliffe Bible); to legal transfers of ownership rights (initially, especially in land); and to mental derangement (a historical connection that survived into the nineteenth-century usage of the term ‘alienist’ for a psychiatric doctor). It is sometimes said that ‘alienation’ entered the German language via English legal usage, although G.W.F. Hegel (1770–1831), for one, typically uses ‘Entäusserung’, and not ‘Entfremdung’ to refer to property transfer (Hegel 1991a: §65). (It is, of course, the latter term which has an etymological link to ‘fremd’ or ‘alien’.) Moreover, perhaps the first philosophical discussion of alienation, at least of any sophistication, was in French. In the Second Discourse, Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1712–1778) diagnoses ‘inflamed’ forms of amour propre—a love of self (which is sometimes rendered as ‘pride’ or ‘vanity’ in older English translations)—whose toxicity is amplified by certain social and historical developments, as manifesting themselves in alienated forms of self; that is, in the actions and lives of individuals who have somehow become divided from their own nature (Rousseau 1997).

Similarly, despite reference here to various texts, the exegetical dimensions of the present discussion are also limited, and might be treated with a certain caution. Not least, the descriptions of the views of particular authors and traditions function, at least in part, as somewhat schematic place holders for particular views about alienation. Exegetical accuracy is not abandoned lightly, but the messy reality of inconsistency, chronology, textual detail, and contested interpretation, is not the focus. Those interested in more accurate and sophisticated accounts of the authors and traditions mentioned here might usefully consult, in the first instance, the appropriate entries elsewhere in this Encyclopaedia.

3. Adjacent Concepts

3.1 Introduced

It may be helpful to say something about the relation of alienation to what can be called ‘adjacent’ concepts. The two examples discussed here are both drawn from Hegelian and Marxist traditions; namely, the concepts of fetishism and objectification. Disambiguating the relationship between these various concepts can help clarify the general shape of alienation. However, they are also discussed because particular accounts of alienation, both within and beyond those two traditions, are sometimes said—more or less plausibly—to conflate alienation either with fetishism, or with objectification. On the present account, even if some particular treatments of alienation do equate the relevant concepts with each other, alienation is better understood as not synonymous with either fetishism or objectification.

3.2 Fetishism

The first of the adjacent ideas discussed here is fetishism. ‘Fetishism’ refers here to the idea of human creations which have somehow escaped (inappropriately separated out from) human control, achieved the appearance of independence, and come to enslave and oppress their creators. (The parenthesis in the previous sentence is intended to help identify a suggestive connection with the concept of alienation.)

Within Hegelian and Marxist traditions, a surprisingly wide range of social phenomena—including religion, the state, and private property—have been characterised as having the character of a fetish. Indeed, Marx sometimes treats the phenomenon of fetishism as a distinguishing feature of modernity; where previous historical epochs were characterised by the rule of persons over persons, capitalist society is characterised by the rule of things over persons. ‘Capital’, we might say, has come to replace the feudal lord. Consider, for instance, the frequency with which ‘market forces’ are understood and represented within modern culture as something outside of human control, as akin to natural forces which decide our fate. In a famous image—from the Communist Manifesto—Marx portrays modern bourgeois society as ‘like the sorcerer, who is no longer able to control the powers of the nether world whom he has called up by his spells’ (Marx and Engels 1976: 489).

In order to elaborate this idea of fetishism, consider the example of Christian religious consciousness, as broadly understood in the writings of Ludwig Feuerbach (1804–1872). (Feuerbach was a contemporary of, and important influence on, the young Marx, amongst others.) The famous, and disarmingly simple, conclusion of Feuerbach’s philosophical analysis of religious consciousness is that, in Christianity, individuals are worshipping the predicates of human nature, freed of their individual limitations and projected onto an ideal entity. For Feuerbach, however, this is no purely intellectual error, but is rather ripe with social, political, and psychological consequences, as this ‘deity’ now comes to oppress and enslave us. Not least, the Christian God demands real world sacrifices from individuals, typically in the form of a denial or repression of their essential human needs. For instance, the Christian idea of marriage is portrayed as operating in a way that represses and punishes, rather than hallows and satisfies, the flesh of humankind (Leopold 2007: 207–210).

Religious consciousness, on this Feuerbachian account, looks to be a case where alienation takes the form of fetishism. That is, there is both a problematic separation here between subject and object (individuals and their own human nature), and it takes the form of a human creation (the idea of the species embodied in God) escaping our control, achieving the appearance of independence, and coming to enslave and oppress us. The same looks to be true, on Marx’s account, of production in contemporary capitalist societies. Capital takes on the appearance of an independent social power which determines what is produced, how it is produced, and the economic (and other) relations between producers. Marx himself was struck by the parallel, and in the first volume of Capital, offers the following analogy: ‘As, in religion, man is governed by the products of his own brain, so in capitalistic production, he is governed by the products of his own hand’ (Marx 1996: 616). However, rather than equating alienation and fetishism, fetishism is better thought of as a particular form that alienation might take. (To be clear, there looks to be no reason to think that Marx would, or should, disagree with this claim.)

Note, in particular, that although Marx’s discussions of alienation often utilise the language of fetishism, not all of them take that form. Consider, for instance, the problematic separation sometimes said to exist between modern individuals and the natural world, as the former think of themselves and behave as if they were isolated, or cut off, or estranged, from the latter. The idea here is reflected in the less ‘Promethean’ moments of Marx’s work, for example, in the suggestion that the appropriate relation between humankind and nature would involve not our instrumental domination of ‘the other’, but rather a sympathetic appreciation of our complex interdependence with the natural world of which we are, in reality, a part. Those moments are perhaps most evident in Marx’s discussion of contemporary ‘ecological’ threats—including deforestation, pollution, and population growth—and typically involve his ‘metabolic’ account of the appropriate relation between humankind and nature (Foster 1999). The inappropriate modern relation between humankind and nature here looks like an example of alienation—there is a problematic separation of self and other—but certain central characteristics of fetishism would appear to be absent. Most obviously, the natural world is not a human creation which has escaped our control; not least, because it is not a human creation. Moreover, the impact on humankind of this particular separation does not suit very comfortably the language of enslavement and oppression. Indeed, if anything, our inappropriate separation from the natural world seems to find expression in our ruthlessly instrumental treatment of nature, rather than in nature’s tyranny over us.

3.3 Objectification

The second of the adjacent ideas discussed here is objectification. Some preliminary disambiguation may be helpful here. In particular, the concept in question is not the idea of objectification—familiar from certain feminist and Kantian traditions—which concerns the moral impropriety of systematically treating a human being as if she were an object, thing, or commodity (Nussbaum 1995). That is a distinct and important phenomenon, but it is not the one that is relevant here. In the present context, objectification refers rather to the role of productive activity in mediating the evolving relationship between humankind and the natural world. This association is most familiar from certain Hegelian and Marxist traditions, with Marx sometimes using the German term ‘Vergegenständlichung’ to capture it (e.g., 1975: 272).

Humankind is seen as being part of, and dependent upon, the natural world. However, nature is initially somewhat stingy with its blessings; as a result, human beings confront the natural world from an original position of scarcity, struggling through productive activity of various kinds, to change the material form of nature—typically through making things—in ways that make it better reflect and satisfy their own needs and interests. In that evolving process, both the natural world and humankind come to be transformed. Through this collective shaping of their material surroundings, and their increasing productivity, the natural world is made to be, and seem, less ‘other’, and human beings thereby come to objectify themselves, to express their essential powers in concrete form. These world transforming productive activities, we might say, embody the progressive self-realisation of humankind.

On this account, all productive activity would seem to involve objectification. However, Marx insists that not all productive activity involves alienation. Moreover, some other forms of alienation—unrelated to productive activity—have no obvious connection with objectification.

Marx maintains that productive activity might or might not take an alienated form. For instance, productive activity in capitalist societies is typically said to take an alienated form; whereas productive activity in communist societies is typically predicted to take an unalienated or meaningful form. Schematically, we might (a) characterise alienated labour as: being forced; not involving self-realisation (not developing and deploying essential human powers); not intended to satisfy the needs of others; and not appropriately appreciated by those others, while (b) unalienated or meaningful work might be characterised as: being freely chosen; involving self-realisation (the development and deployment of essential human powers); being intended to satisfy the needs of others; and being appropriately appreciated by those others. Productive activity mediates the relationship between humankind and the natural world in both of these societies, but alienation is found only in the capitalist case.

For an example of a view which might be said to equate objectification with alienation, consider what is sometimes called the ‘Christian’ view of work. On this account, work is seen as a necessary evil, an unpleasant activity unfortunately required for our survival. It owes its name to its embrace of the claim that it was only after the Fall that human beings were required to work by the sweat of their brows (see Genesis 31:9). On Marx’s account, or something like it, one might characterise this Christian view as mistakenly equating objectification and alienation, confusing productive activity as such with its stunted and inhuman forms. Indeed, one might go further and suggest that this kind of confusion reflects the alienated social condition of humankind, embodying an emblematic failure to understand that material production is a central realm in which human beings can express, in free and creative ways, the kind of creatures that they are.

In addition, according to the basic idea defended here, equating alienation and objectification fails to appreciate that certain forms of alienation might have nothing at all to do with productive activity. Their mutual hostility and undisguised contempt confirm that Gillian and her sister Hanna are alienated from each other, but there seems little reason to assume that their estrangement is necessarily related to the world of work or their respective place in it. The sisters’ engagement in productive activity and the forms that it takes, might well have nothing to do with the problematic separation here. Imagine that the latter arose from a combination of sibling rivalry, stubbornness, and a chance misunderstanding at a time of family crisis involving the death of a parent. This possibility gives us another reason not to equate alienation and objectification. (Again, for clarity, there seems to be no obvious reason why Marx would, or should, deny the intelligibility or utility of this suggestion.)

In short, on the present account, neither fetishism, nor objectification, are identical with alienation. Rather than being synonymous, these concepts only partially overlap. Fetishism can be understood as picking out only a subset—on some accounts perhaps a large subset—of cases of alienation. And there are forms of objectification which do not involve alienation (the meaningful work in communist societies, for instance), as well as forms of alienation—outside of productive activity—with no obvious connection to objectification.

4. Subjective and Objective Alienation

4.1 Distinction

The concept of alienation may not be unduly elusive or difficult to understand, but it obviously doesn’t follow that there are no complexities or slippery issues here. Perhaps especially once we get beyond the basic idea, or venture further into the relevant literature.

Three interesting complexities are introduced here. Respectively, they concern: the distinction between subjective and objective alienation; the need for a criterion identifying candidate separations as problematic; and the relationship between alienation and value.

This section provides an introduction to, and some initial reflections on, the first of these interesting complexities; namely, the division of alienation into subjective and objective varieties (Hardimon 1994: 119–122). Not all theorists or traditions operate with this distinction, but it can be a great help in understanding the diagnosis of particular authors and particular cases.

First, alienation is sometimes characterised in terms of how subjects feel, or think about, or otherwise experience, the problematic separation here. This can be called subjective alienation. For instance, Ingrid might be said to be alienated because she feels estranged from the world, because she experiences her life as lacking meaning, because she does not feel ‘at home [zu Hause]’ in it—to adopt the evocative shorthand sometimes used by Hegel—and so on (e.g. 1991a: §4A, §187A, and §258A).

Second, alienation is sometimes characterised in terms which make no reference to the feelings, thoughts, or experience, of subjects. This can be called objective alienation. For instance, Julieta might be said to be alienated because some separation prevents her from developing and deploying her essential human characteristics, prevents her from engaging in self-realising activities, and so on. Such claims are controversial in a variety of ways, but they assume alienation is about the frustration of that potential, and they make no reference to whether Julieta herself experiences that lack as a loss. Maybe Julieta genuinely enjoys her self-realisation lacking life, and even consciously rejects the goal of self-realisation as involving an overly demanding and unattractive ideal.

Subjective alienation is sometimes disparaged; treated, for example, as concerning ‘merely’ how an individual ‘feels’ about ‘real’ alienation. On the present account, that is a mistake. Subjective alienation is better understood as a full-blown, meaningful, variety of alienation, albeit not the only one. If you genuinely feel alienated, then you really are (subjectively) alienated. (‘[G]enuinely’ in order to disallow, not least, certain situations in which individuals might simply be mistaken about what it is that they feel; for example, perhaps until very recently Ingrid systematically confused estrangement with indigestion, leading her to misidentify instances of both.)

4.2 Diagnostic Schema

This distinction between subjective and objective alienation can give us a useful diagnostic schema. Let us assume—no doubt controversially—that all combinations of these two forms of alienation are possible. That gives us four social outcomes to discuss:


Where: ◻ = Absent and ◼ = Present

4.3 Applications

These various alternative combinations—numbered (i) to (iv) above—correspond, very roughly, to the ways in which particular authors have characterised particular kinds of social arrangement or types of society. Consider, for example, the different views of modern class-divided society taken by Hegel and Marx.

Marx can be characterised as diagnosing contemporary capitalist society as corresponding to situation (i); that is, as being a social world which contains both objective and subjective alienation. On what we might call his standard view, Marx allows that objective and subjective alienation are conceptually distinct, but assumes that in capitalist societies they are typically found together sociologically (perhaps with the subjective forms tending to track the objective ones). However, there are passages where he deviates from that standard view, and—without abandoning the thought that objective alienation is, in some sense, more fundamental—appears to allow that, on occasion, subjective and objective alienation can also come apart sociologically. At least, that is one way of reading a well-known passage in The Holy Family which suggests that capitalists might be objectively but not subjectively alienated. In these remarks, Marx recognises that capitalists do not get to engage in self-realising activities of the right kind (hence their objective alienation), but observes that—unlike the proletariat—the capitalists are content in their estrangement; they feel ‘at ease’ in, and even feel ‘strengthened’ by, it (Marx and Engels 1975: 36).

In contrast, Hegel maintains that the modern social world approximates to something more like situation (iii); that is, as being a social world not containing objective alienation, but still containing its subjective form. That is, for Hegel, the social and political structures of the modern social world do constitute a home, because they enable individuals to realise themselves, variously as family members, economic agents, and citizens. However, those same individuals fail to understand or appreciate that this is the case, and rather feel estranged from, and perhaps even consciously reject, the institutions of the modern social world. The resulting situation has been characterised as one of ‘pure subjective alienation’ (Hardimon 1994: 121).

That Hegel and Marx diagnose modern society in these different ways helps to explain their differing strategic political commitments. They both aim to bring society closer to situation (iv)—that is, a social world lacking systematic forms of both objective and subjective alienation—but, since they disagree about where we are starting from, they propose different routes to that shared goal. For Marx, since we start from situation (i), this requires that the existing world be overturned; that is, that both institutions and attitudes need to be revolutionised (overcoming objective and subjective alienation). For Hegel, since we start from situation (iii), this requires only attitudinal change; that is, that we come to recognise that the existing world is already objectively ‘a home’, and in this way ‘reconcile’ ourselves to that world, overcoming pure subjective alienation in the process.

Situation (ii) consists of a social world containing objective, but not subjective, alienation; a situation that can be characterised as one of ‘pure objective alienation’. (Hardimon 1994, 120.) It is perhaps not too much of a stretch to think of this situation as corresponding, very roughly, to one of the Frankfurt School’s more nightmarish visions of contemporary capitalist society. (The Frankfurt School is the colloquial label given to several generations of philosophers and social theorists, in the Western Marxist tradition, associated—more or less closely—with the Institute for Social Research founded in 1929–1930.) For example, in the pessimistic diagnosis of Herbert Marcuse (1898–1979), articulated in One-Dimensional Man (1964), individuals in advanced capitalist societies appear happy in their dysfunctional relationships—they ‘identify themselves’ with their estranged circumstances and gain ‘satisfaction’ from them (2002: 13). Objective alienation still obtains, but no longer generates social conflict, since the latter is assumed—not implausibly—to require agents who feel, or experience, some form of hostility or rebelliousness towards existing social arrangements.

That latter assumption raises the wider issue of the relation between alienation and, what might be called ‘revolutionary motivation’. Let us assume that radical social change requires, amongst other conditions, an agent—perhaps a collective agent—with both the strength and the desire to bring that change about. The role of alienation in helping to form that latter psychological prerequisite—the desire to bring about change on the part of the putative revolutionary agent—looks complicated. First, it would seem that objective alienation, as such, cannot play the motivating role, since it does not involve any feeling, or thinking about, or otherwise experiencing, the problematic separation here. (‘[A]s such’ in order to allow the possibility that a subject’s knowledge of that alienation might—depending, not least, on one’s views on the connections between reasons and motivations—provide an appropriately psychological incentive to revolt.) Second, the relation between subjective alienation and motivation looks more complex than it might initially seem. Note, in particular, that some of the experiential dimensions of subjective alienation look less likely than others to generate the psychological prerequisites of action here. Feelings of ‘powerlessness’ and ‘isolation’, for instance, might well generate social withdrawal and individual atomism, rather than radical social engagement and cooperative endeavour, on the part of the relevant agents. In short, whether subjective alienation is a friend or an enemy of revolutionary motivation would seem to depend on the precise form that it takes.

Interestingly, situation (ii)—that is, the case of ‘pure objective alienation’—might also be thought to approximate to the social goal of certain thinkers in the tradition of existentialism (the tradition of Jean-Paul Sartre (1905–1980), Albert Camus (1913–1960), and others). Some interpretative generosity may be needed here, but I take it that existentialists think of (something like) objective alienation as a permanent feature of all human societies. Rejecting both substantive accounts of essential human nature, and the ethical embrace of social relations that facilitate the development and deployment of those human characteristics, they rather maintain that the social world will always remain ‘other’, can never be a ‘home’. However, although this ‘otherness’ can never be overcome, there do look to be better and worse ways of dealing with it. What is essential to each individual is what they make of themselves, the ways in which they chose to engage with that other. The preferred outcome here seeming to involve individuals embodying a norm of ‘authenticity’, which amongst other conditions—such as choosing, or committing, to their own projects—may require that they have the ‘courage’ to ‘grasp, accept, and, perhaps even affirm’ the fact that the social world is not a home for them (Hardimon 1994: 121).

This also clarifies that situation (iv)—which contains systematic forms of neither objective or subjective alienation—is the social goal of some but not all of these authors (of Hegel and Marx, for instance, but not the existentialists). Of course, (iv) might also be a characterisation of the extant social world according to a hypothetical, and over-optimistic, apologist for the present.

5. What Makes a Separation Problematic?

5.1 Criteria of ‘Impropriety’

The second of the interesting complexities broached here concerns what we can call the need for a criterion of ‘impropriety’; that is, a criterion by which candidate separations might be assessed as problematic or not. Recall the earlier suggestion that accounts of alienation require some benchmark condition of harmony or connectedness against which separations might be assessed as problematic or not.

Historically, this role—identifying whether candidate separations are problematic—has often been played by accounts of our essential human nature. However, motivated by suspicion of that latter idea, theorists of alienation have sometimes sought alternatives to fulfil that role.

5.2 Essential Human Nature

To see how the appeal to human nature works, imagine two hypothetical theorists—Katerina and Laura—seeking to assess whether alienation exists in a particular society. We can stipulate that the institutions and culture of this particular society are individualistic—in the sense that they systematically frustrate cooperation and sociability—and that the two theorists share many, but not all, of the same views. In particular, assume that our two theorists agree: that alienation is a coherent and useful concept; that the account of alienation given here is, broadly speaking, plausible; that the only serious candidate for a problematic separation in this particular society are those arising from its individualism; and that our essential human nature provides the benchmark of ‘propriety’ for assessing separations. Simply put, separations are problematic if they frustrate, and unproblematic if they facilitate, ‘self-realisation’. Self-realisation being understood here as a central part of the good life, and as consisting in the development and deployment of an individual’s essential human characteristics. However, assume also that Katerina and Laura disagree about what comprises human nature. In particular, they disagree about whether cooperation and sociability are essential human characteristics; with Katerina insisting that they are, and Laura maintaining that they are not. It seems to follow that Katerina will conclude, and Laura will deny, that this society is one containing alienation. For Katerina, the widespread lack of cooperation and sociability confirm that the basic social institutions here frustrate our self-realisation. Whereas, for Laura, the very same widespread lack of cooperation and sociability confirm that the basic social institutions facilitate, or at least do not frustrate, our self-realisation.

(Note that in sub-section 1.2, where the basic idea of alienation was elaborated, various relations between subject and object were distinguished, only one of which was characterised as reflexive. However, in the light of the present discussion, we might now think it more accurate to say that—on this kind of account, using essential human nature to identify alienation—only one of them was directly reflexive, because there is some sense in which all of those dimensions of alienation involve a separation from some aspect of our own human nature. After all, this is precisely what picks out the relevant separation as problematic. For example, the separation of individuals from each other is, for Katerina, indirectly also a separation from human nature, from the cooperation and sociability that characterises our essential humanity.)

5.3 Alternatives

As already noted, this benchmark—by which candidate separations are assessed as problematic or not—is often, but not always, played by accounts of our essential human nature. Given the widespread contemporary suspicion of such accounts—not least, by those opposed to what is sometimes called ‘essentialism’ about human nature—it might be helpful to sketch an account of alienation which is not dependent on such assumptions (or, at least, consciously strives to avoid them). There is also a potential benefit here for those of us who are less suspicious; namely, that such an example might also provide a better sense of the diversity of available theories of alienation.

Rahel Jaeggi offers an account of alienation of this kind, and situates it explicitly in the tradition of Critical Theory; that is, the kind of emancipatory theory associated with the Frankfurt School. On this account, the idea of alienation has the potential to help us understand and change the world, but only if it receives some significant conceptual reconstruction. Alienation is still associated with the frustration of freedom, with disruptions to something like ‘self-realisation’. However, this account—unlike its forerunners and associates—is said not to be fatally compromised by a commitment to either ‘strongly objectivistic’ theories of the good life, or ‘essentialist’ conceptions of the self (Jaeggi 2014: 40).

The crucial term of art here is ‘appropriation’, which Jaeggi uses to refer to the capacity for, and process of, relating to our own actions and projects in ways which engage ‘something like self-determination and being the author of one’s own life’  (2014: 39). Appropriation is successful—and alienation is absent—when ‘one is present in one’s actions, steers one’s life instead of being driven by it, independently appropriates social roles and is able to identify with one’s desires, and is involved in the world’ (Jaeggi 2014: 155). In contrast, appropriation is unsuccessful—and alienation is present—when there is ‘an inadequate power and a lack of presence in what one does, a failure to identify with one’s own actions and desires and to take part in one’s own life’ (Jaeggi 2014: 155). Alienation is thus identified with systematic disruptions of the process of appropriation; in particular, in those systematic disruptions which lead us to fail to experience our actions and projects as our own. These disruptions are said typically to take one of four forms: ‘powerlessness’ or the experience of losing control over one’s own life; ‘loss of authenticity’ especially when one is unable to identify with one’s own social roles; ‘internal division’ where one experiences some of one’s own desires and impulses as alien; and ‘indifference’ or a detachment from one’s own previous projects and self-understandings.

This model fits happily enough with our basic idea of alienation as consisting in a  problematic separation between self and other that properly belong together. However, the conditions for identifying the relevant dysfunctional relation here are intended to be less demanding and controversial than those involving claims about our essential human nature. There is a kindred notion of freedom as self-realisation, but it is said to be the realisation of a thin kind of self-determining agency, and not the actualisation of some thick ‘pre-given’ identity of an essentialist sort. A normative dimension remains, but it is presented as expansive and broadly procedural. It is expansive in that a wide range of actions and projects might be included within its remit. And it is procedural in that the benchmark for judging the success of these various actions and projects is that they were brought about in the right kind of self-determination delivering way, and not that their content reflects a narrow and controversial account of what human beings are ‘in essence’.

Modern culture is said to recognise and value the kind of freedom at the heart of this picture of appropriation. As a result, this account of alienation can be presented as a form of immanent critique; that is, as utilising a standpoint which judges individuals and forms of life according to standards that those individuals have themselves propounded, or which those forms of life presuppose. At the individual level, this critique might involve identifying potential tensions between the conditions for treating people as responsible agents, and the obstructions to such agency that characterise alienated selves; for instance, the feelings of powerlessness that prevent individuals from directing and embracing their own lives. And at the social level, this critique might involve identifying potential discrepancies between modern ideals of freedom and their actual realisation in the contemporary world; for instance, the existence of social or political roles that an individual can never make their own (Jaeggi 2014: 41–42).

Of course, difficult questions remain. Questions not only about whether the notion of appropriation successfully avoids the perceived spectre of perfectionism, but also about the ground of the normativity here. That the kind of subjectivity or self-determination which appropriation embodies is recognised and valued in modern culture, does not in itself establish its ethical worth. It is perhaps easier to dismiss Hegelian teleology, or Marxist perfectionism, than it is to find satisfactory replacements.

6. Alienation and Value

6.1 Negative Element

The third of these interesting complexities concerns the ethical dimension of alienation. The connections between alienation and ethics are many and diverse, and there is no attempt here to sketch that wider landscape in its entirety. Instead, attention is drawn to two topographical features: the claim that alienation is necessarily a negative, but not a wholly negative, phenomenon, is elaborated and defended; and the suggestion that morality itself might encourage or embody alienation is briefly outlined.

The claim that alienation is necessarily a negative, but not a wholly negative, phenomenon, can be addressed in two parts. Defending the first part of that claim looks straightforward enough. Alienation, on the present account, consists in the separation of certain entities – a subject and some object—that properly belong together. As a result, alienation always involves a loss or lack of something of value; namely, the loss or lack of the ‘proper’—rational, natural, or good—harmony or connectedness between the relevant subject and object. (The slightly clunky formulation ‘loss or lack’ is required since these terms are not synonymous, and alienation can be elaborated in either way. One central difference is that having once possessed the proper connectedness seems to be a necessary condition for losing it, but not, of course, for lacking it.)

6.2 Positive Element

It is the second part of the claim which looks less obvious. Namely, that alienation is not a wholly negative phenomena; that is, that the loss or lack here may not always be the whole story, ethically speaking. Note, in particular, that some well-known accounts also locate an achievement of value in the moment of alienation. (No suggestion is made here about whether, and how, the resulting ethical ‘gains’ and ‘losses’ might be weighed and judged overall.)

In order to illustrate this possibility—that alienation can involve the achievement of something of value—consider the nuanced and critical celebration of capitalism found, but not always recognised, in Marx’s writings. One pertinent way of introducing this account involves locating the moment of alienation within a pattern of development that we might call ‘dialectical’ in one sense of that slippery term.

The dialectical pattern here concerns the developing relationship between a particular subject and object; the individual, on the one hand, and their social role and community, on the other. By a dialectical progression is meant only a movement from a stage characterised by a relationship of ‘undifferentiated unity’, through a stage characterised by a relationship of ‘differentiated disunity’, to a stage characterised by a relationship of ‘differentiated unity’. ‘[O]nly’ in order to clarify that there are no further claims made here about the necessity, the naturalness, or the prevalence, of such progressions (Cohen 1974: 237).

The dialectical progression here involves three historical stages:

First, past pre-capitalist societies are said to embody the stage of undifferentiated unity. Here individuals are buried in their social role and community, scarcely conceptualising, still less promoting, their own identity and interests as distinguishable from those of the wider community.

Second, present capitalist societies are said to embody the stage of differentiated disunity. Here independence and separation predominate, and individuals care only for themselves, scarcely thinking of the identity and interests of the wider community. Indeed, they are typically isolated from, and indifferent or hostile towards, the latter.

Third, future communist societies are said to embody the stage of differentiated unity. Here desirable versions of community and individuality flourish together. Indeed, in their new forms, communal and individual identities, and communal and individual interests, presuppose and reinforce each other. It is sometimes said that the contents of the first two stages (community and individuality, respectively) have thereby been ‘sublated’—that is, elevated, cancelled, and preserved—in this third stage. ‘Sublated’ being an attempted English translation of the German verb ‘aufheben’, and its cognates, which Hegel occasionally uses to suggest this elusive combination of ideas (e.g. Hegel 1991b: §24A3, §81A1).

In the present context, the crucial stage is the second one. This is the stage of alienation, the stage of disunion which emerges from a simple unity before reconciliation in a higher (differentiated) unity (Inwood 1992: 36). This is the stage of present capitalist societies involving the problematic separation of individuals from their social role and community. In the first stage (of past pre-capitalist societies) there is a problematic relation, but no separation. And in the third stage (of future communist societies) there is a separation but it is a healthy rather than problematic one. In this second stage of alienation, there is a loss, or lack, of something of value; roughly speaking, the loss or lack of the individuals’ attachment to their social role and community. (More precisely, we might say that they have lost a sense of, and connection to, the community, and that they lack a healthy sense of, and connection to, the community.)

However, this disvalue is not the whole of the story, ethically speaking. In comparison with the first stage, the second stage also involves a liberation of sorts from the object in which subjects were previously ‘engulfed’ (Cohen 1974: 239). The ‘of sorts’ is a way of acknowledging that this is a rather distinctive kind of liberation. The individual here is not necessarily rid of the constraints of the other (of their social position and community), but they do now at least identify and experience them as such—that is, as constraints on the individual—whereas previously the individual was engulfed by them, and failed to think of themselves as having any identity and interests outside of their social position. In short, the loss or lack of something of value is not the only feature of the second stage of alienation. There is also an important gain here; namely, the achievement of what we can call ‘individuality’. This significant good was missing in the first pre-capitalist stage, and—freed from its distorting capitalist form—it will be preserved and developed in the communist future of the third stage.

This claim goes beyond the familiar suggestion that alienation forms a necessary stage in certain Hegelian and Marxist developmental narratives. The suggestion here is that internal to the second stage, the stage of alienation, there is both a problematic separation from community and a positive liberation from engulfment. Those who see only the negative thread in alienation, and fail to see ‘what is being achieved within in and distorted by it’, will miss an important, albeit subtle, thread in Marx’s account of the progressive character of capitalism (Cohen 1974: 253).

There is a lot going on in this schematic discussion of historical stages. The point emphasised here is that theorists—even critics—of alienation need not assume that it is a wholly negative phenomena, ethically speaking. Marx, for example, recognises that the moment of alienation, for all its negative features, also involves the emergence of a good (individuality) which, in due course (and freed from the limitations of its historical origins), will be central to human flourishing in communist society.

6.3 Morality as Alienation

This claim—that alienation might not be a wholly negative phenomenon—concerns the normative dimensions of alienation. However, it is sometimes suggested that the concept of alienation might provide a standpoint from which morality itself, or at least some part of it, can be criticised. This looks to be a very different kind of thought.

The broad suggestion is that certain conceptions of morality might embody, or encourage, alienation. More precisely, that certain conceptions of morality might embody or encourage a problematic division of self, and a problematic separation from much that is valuable in our lives. Consider, for example, accounts of the moral standpoint as requiring universalisation and equal consideration of all persons (Railton 1984: 138). It could seem that adopting such a standpoint requires individuals to disown or downplay the relevance of their more personal or partial beliefs and feelings. The picture of persons divided into cognitive and affective parts, with the partial and personal relegated to the downgraded sphere of the latter (perhaps conceptualised as something closer to mere sentiment than reason) is a familiar one. In addition to that problematic bifurcation of the self, such accounts might seem to cut us off from much that is valuable in our lives. If these impersonal kinds of moral consideration are to dominate our practical reasoning, then it seems likely that an individual’s particular attachments, loyalties, and commitments, will have, at best, a marginal place (Railton 1984: 139). In aspiring to adopt ‘the point of view of the universe’—to use the well-known phrase of the utilitarian Henry Sidgwick (1838–1900) – there can sometimes seem to be precious little security or space remaining for, say, friendship, love, and family (Sidgwick 1907: 382). Morality, so understood, is charged with embodying and encouraging alienation, in the form of both a divided self, and the separation of self and world.

The weight and scope of these kinds of concerns about alienation can obviously vary; that is, they might be thought to have more or less critical purchase on a wider or narrower range of targets. First, they might be viewed variously as weaknesses that can be overcome by more adequate formulation of the theories in question, or as foundational objections that help render the relevant theories unattractive and implausible. Second, that varied critical weight might be thought to count against a wide range of potential targets, as varied, for example, as—in order of expanding scope—act utilitarianism, certain forms of consequentialism, all impartial moral theories, or ‘the peculiar institution’ of morality itself (Williams 1985: 174). Given both that variety, and the subject matter of this entry, it may not be helpful to generalise much more here. However, the point is hopefully made that the ethical dimensions of the topic extend beyond the normative assessment of the relevant separations. Indeed, taking alienation seriously might lead us to think more critically about some familiar moral standpoints and theories.

7. Some (Unresolved) Empirical Issues

7.1 Content

The above discussion of the concept of alienation—clarifying its basic shape, sketching some of its theoretical forms, and introducing a few complexities—still leaves many issues unresolved. Those issues include many of the empirical dimensions of the topic. Note that the present section is not directly concerned with the extensive social scientific literature on alienation. That literature is typically interested in ‘operationalising’ the concept—for instance, treating job satisfaction or absenteeism as proxies of alienated work—in order to engineer predictive models in disciplines (including education, psychology, sociology, and management studies) dealing with a variety of real world contexts (e.g. Chiaburu et al 2014). This section is rather concerned with the various empirical, and quasi-empirical, assumptions and claims that appear in broadly philosophical accounts of alienation of the kind discussed above.

Consider, for example, Marx’s characterisation of alienation in terms of separations which frustrate self-realisation, especially self-realisation in work. To come to a considered judgement about the plausibility of his views on this topic, one would have to be in a position to assess, amongst other issues, whether work in capitalist societies is necessarily alienated. One would need to judge, not only whether existing work is rightly characterised as alienated (as forced, frustrating self-realisation, not intended to satisfy the needs of others, and not appropriately appreciated by those others), but also, if so, whether it could be made meaningful and unalienated without undermining the very features which made the relevant society a capitalist one. (There are also, of course, many more normative-looking issues here regarding that account of human flourishing; whether, for example, it overemphasises creative and fulfilling work, and underestimates the importance of, say, leisure and intellectual excellence.) Reaching anything like a considered judgment on these empirical and quasi-empirical issues would clearly require some complicated factual assessments of, amongst other issues, the composition and functioning of human nature and the extant social world.

7.2 Extent

A range of complex empirical and quasi-empirical issues also look to be woven into Marx’s views about the extent of alienation. Consider the various unsystematic claims about the historical location and comparative intensity of alienation that can be found in his writings (and, less ambiguously, in certain secondary interpretations of those writings). These various claims include: first, that certain systematic forms of alienation—including alienation in work—are not a universal feature of human society (not least, they will not be a feature of a future communist order); second, that at least some systematic forms of alienation—presumably including religious alienation—are widespread in pre-capitalist societies; and third, that systematic forms of alienation are greater in contemporary capitalist societies than in pre-capitalist societies.

Take the last of these assorted claims; that is, the comparative verdict about the extent or intensity of alienation in capitalist societies. Its plausibility is scarcely incontrovertible, given the amount of sheer productive drudgery, and worse, in pre-capitalist societies. Nor is it obvious how one might attempt to substantiate the empirical dimensions of the claim. The empirical difficulties of measuring subjective alienation look considerable enough (especially given the limitations of historical data), but alienation for Marx is fundamentally about the frustration of objective human potentials, those separations that prevent self-realisation, perhaps especially self-realisation in work. One suggestion, made in this context, is that the scale of alienation in a particular society might be indicated by the gap between the liberating potential of human productive powers, on the one hand, and the extent to which that potential is reflected in the lives actually lived by producers, on the other (Wood 2004: 44–48). The appeal of this proposed measure—not least in the potential support it offers to Marx’s comparison between capitalist and pre-capitalist societies—is clear enough, but the social scientific details of how one might actually apply that kind of measure in particular historical cases remain obscure.

7.3 Prognosis

Related worries might also apply to claims about the prognosis for alienation, in particular, about whether and how alienation might be overcome. Consider, for instance, Marx’s view that communist society will be free of certain systematic forms of alienation, such as alienation in work. (The reference to ‘systematic’ is included because there seems no good textual or theoretical reason to lumber Marx with the view that the alienation of Gillian from her sister Hanna—whose hypothetical estrangement, you will recall, arose from sibling rivalry, stubbornness, and a chance misunderstanding at a time of family crisis—could never exist under communism.) Marx’s view about communism rests crucially on the judgement that it is the social relations of capitalist society, and not its material or technical arrangements, which are the cause of systematic forms of alienation. For instance, he holds that it is not the existence of science, technology, and industrialisation, as such, which are at the root of the social and psychological ills of alienation, but rather how those factors tend to be organised and operated in a capitalist society; that is, a society based on a particular class division – in which producers can only access means of production by selling their labour power—and in which production, and much else, is driven by a remorseless search for profit. In volume one of Capital, Marx writes approvingly of workers who, through time and experience, had learnt ‘to distinguish between machinery and its employment by capital, and to direct their attacks, not against the material instruments of production, but against the mode in which they are used’ (1996: 432). If this had not been his view, Marx could not have, consistently, also suggested that communist society – which, on his account, is similarly technologically advanced and industrial—could avoid this kind of alienation. This suggestion is strikingly sanguine. Marx is confident, for instance, that the considerable gulf between the gloomy results of adopting machinery in the capitalist present (where it increases the repetitiveness of tasks, narrows talents, promotes ‘deskilling’, and so on) and the bright promise of its adoption in the communist future (where it will liberate us from uncreative tasks, create greater wealth, develop all-round abilities, and so on) is easily bridged. However, Marx’s ‘utopophobia’—his reluctance to say very much, in any serious detail, about the future shape of socialist society – prevents him from offering any serious discussion about how precisely this might be done (Leopold 2016). As a result, even the mildest of sceptics could reasonably worry that a range of difficult empirical, and other, questions, are evaded rather than answered here.

(This issue—whether, and to what extent, alienation can be overcome—is sometimes conflated with the issue of whether, and to what extent, alienation is a historically universal phenomena. To see that they are distinct questions, imagine that alienation only emerges in economically developed societies, that it is a necessary feature of economically developed societies, and that economically developed societies never revert voluntarily to economically undeveloped ones. These are not implausible claims, but together they seem to entail that, although only a subset of historical societies are scarred by alienation,  if you happen to live in an economically developed society, then—involuntary Armageddon apart – alienation will be the continuing fate of you and your successors.)

My aim here is not to make significant progress in resolving any of these empirical issues, but rather to mark their existence and extent. Since the concept of alienation diagnoses a complex range of social ills involving self and other, it is perhaps not surprising that a variety of empirical issues are implicated in these various accounts of its proper characterisation, its historical scope, and the possibilities for overcoming it. Nonetheless, it remains important to acknowledge the existence and complexity of these empirical threads, in addition to those conceptual and normative ones discussed above.


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


I am grateful to Jan Kandiyali, Paul Lodge, Lucinda Rumsey, and an anonymous SEP referee, for comments on a previous version of this entry.

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David Leopold <>

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