Notes to Principle of Sufficient Reason

1. The common formulation of the Identity of Indiscernibles—\(\forall F(Fx \leftrightarrow Fy) \rightarrow x=y\)—seems to assume identity as such a default position. Thus, if both \(x\) and \(y\) were to have no properties at all, the above formulation of the Identity of Indiscernibles would deem them identical.

2. Yet, see Garber 2015 for a critique of the ascription of the Principle to Spinoza, and Della Rocca 2015 for a defense of such ascription.

3. Notice that in this text, non-existence does not require a reason. Unless otherwise marked, all quotes from Spinoza’s works and letters rely on Curley’s translation. We have relied on Gebhardt’s critical edition for the Latin text of Spinoza. We use the following standard abbreviations for Spinoza’s works: TIE—Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect [Tractatus de Intellectus Emendatione], TTP—Theological-Political Treatise [Tractatus Theologico-Politicus], Ep.—Letters. Passages in the Ethics will be referred to by means of the following abbreviations: a(-xiom), c(-orollary), p(-roposition), s(-cholium) and app(-endix); ‘d’ stands for either ‘definition’ (when it appears immediately to the right of the part of the book), or ‘demonstration’ (in all other cases). Hence, E1d3 is the third definition of part 1 and E1p16d is the demonstration of proposition 16 of part 1.

4. In §97 of the TIE, Spinoza discusses the requirements for a proper definition of an “uncreated thing [res increata]”. The first requirement states that the definition “should exclude every cause, i.e., that the object should require nothing except its own being [esse] for its explanation”. Thus, it seems that in this early period Spinoza allowed for an uncaused being, though not for one that is unexplained.

5. Along the same lines, E1a3 can be read as stating that everything must have a sufficient cause (see Lin 2011).

6. See, however, Newlands (2010) for an intriguing attempt to explain conceivability and intelligibility in Spinoza as not bound to the attribute of thought. While this is an original and enticing reading, it is not well supported by Spinoza’s text.

7. Notice that on Spinoza’s view, things that are not necessitated by their nature, are still necessitated by their cause.

8. This is not Leibniz’s only account of contingency but the one that is most suited for dealing with the challenge that his containment theory of truth leads to necessitarianism.

Copyright © 2016 by
Yitzhak Y. Melamed <ymelame1@jhu.edu>
Martin Lin <mlin@philosophy.rutgers.edu>

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