Supplement to Self-Consciousness

Evans on First-Person Thought

The account of first-person thought put forward in Evans (1982: ch.7) has been highly influential. He understands our ideas of ourselves—our I-Ideas—in terms of both their relation to certain inputs and outputs, and also the way in which they connect to our conception of an objective world through which we trace a path.

On the output side, as is familiar from the discussion of Perry in §2.1, “I”-Ideas feed into our dispositions to act in a special way: my belief that I am about to be attacked by a weasel disposes me to act in a way that a belief that Smith is about to be attacked by a weasel does not, unless I also believe that I am Smith. Similarly, if I believe there is a weasel here, I will be disposed to react appropriately. On the other hand, if I believe that there is a weasel in the Wild Wood, I will only be so disposed if I also believe that the Wild Wood is here.

On the input side, according to Evans, “I”-thoughts, like “here”-thoughts, are disposed to be controlled by information gained in certain special ways. In the case of “here”-thoughts, if I see a weasel, I will be disposed to think “there is a weasel here”. My “here”-thoughts will be determined by the information I receive via the perception of my immediate environment, with no need for me to identify the place at which the weasel is as here. So, “here”-thoughts are disposed to be controlled by information gained via the perception of the immediate environment. Evans’ claim about “I”-thoughts is that they behave in a similar way, except that the information channels by which they are disposed to be controlled differ. One such information channel is introspection (see entry on introspection). So, for example, if I have a headache, I will be disposed to think “I have a headache”, with no requirement that I identify the person who has the headache as me.

Such thoughts are “identification free”. A de re thought “\(a\) is \(F\)” is identification dependent, in Evans’ sense, if knowledge of it can be seen as the result of knowledge of the truth of a pair of propositions “\(b\) is \(F\)” and “\(a = b\)”. The judgement “\(a\) is \(F\)” is identification-free, on the other hand, if it does not rest on such an “identification component” and, as a result, cannot be an error of misidentification. They are immune to error through misidentification of the first-person pronoun, or IEM (see §2.3 of the main entry). Those sources of information that ground identification free, IEM judgements are just those sources of information that directly control one’s “I”-Ideas. On this picture, an account of first-person thought will be incomplete without a specification of exactly which information sources serve to ground IEM thoughts.

On Evans’ view, then, a functional account of the first-person concept modelled on “here” rather than on “this” offers a compelling response to Anscombe’s (1975) sensory deprivation argument since neither “here”-thoughts nor “I”-thoughts require the actual presentation of their object (one’s location and oneself respectively) at the time of their use. Rather, according to Evans, they require only dispositional links between one’s thoughts and both incoming information and outgoing action. On Evans’ view, one’s conception of oneself (one’s I-Idea) of necessity involves one’s grasping that one is an object among many, located in an objective world, an idea deriving from P.F. Strawson’s (1966) discussion of Kant and further investigated by Cassam (1997) (also see Evans 1980; for a critical discussion, see Burge 2010: ch. 6). On this account, the objective conception that one has of oneself means that one can think of oneself in ways that are not immediately dependent on identification-free information channels. And one can think about oneself in the sensory deprivation tank because one’s “I”-Idea is disposed to be controlled by relevant incoming sensory information, even though there is no actual input available at that time (Evans 1982: 215–216 and 153, n.20; for critical discussion, see O’Brien 1995b).

Whilst the position that Evans articulates does involve the rejection of Anscombe’s claim that “I” never refers, it does allow that “I”-thoughts can, on occasion, fail to refer. Evans allows that there are a number of ways in which thoughts, including “I”-thoughts, can fail to refer (1982: §5.4 & §7.6). One example would be a case in which the inputs, those special ways of gaining information that control one’s “I”-thinking, derive from a variety of different objects. If, say, one’s introspective information derives from one person but one’s bodily experience derives from another, then one’s “I”-Idea would fail to pick out a unique object and would therefore lack a referent. On Evans’ view, then, one may suffer from the illusion of first-person thought. That is, it may seem “from within” as though one is thinking about oneself, yet one is, in fact, failing to do so (for discussion, see Peacocke 2008: §3.3; de Gaynesford 2003).

Copyright © 2017 by
Joel Smith <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.
[an error occurred while processing this directive]