Notes to Public Health Ethics

1. For example, the Institute of Medicine defines public health as “what we, as a society, do collectively to assure the conditions in which people can be healthy” (IOM 1988; IOM 2003).

2. Parts of this SEP entry draw heavily on Powers and Faden, particularly in the sections so identified.

3. See also Kenny et al. (2010) for a relational perspective on public health ethics, and Lee (2012) for a review of models of public health ethics.

4. This entry does not address ethical issues in the conduct of public health research; see, for example, Hyder, Pratt, Ali, Kass & Sewankambo (2014) and Pratt & Hyder (2014). See also The Ethics of Clinical Research.

5. Consider, for example, public health interventions to reduce cigarette consumption or promote exercise, where the benefits of heart disease and cancer reduction may not be realized for decades.

6. See, for example, Baicker, Cutler & Song (2010); Bolnick, Millard & Dugas (2013); and Schmidt, Stock & Doran (2012).

7. Infant immunizations, for example, prevent diseases that can be experienced well past infancy and only among a sub-set of the babies who receive them. By contrast, influenza immunizations have a more immediate effect, preventing disease during the same flu season in which they are administered. However, here again, influenza is prevented in only a sub-set of the people who are immunized.

8. The 2014-2015 Ebola outbreaks in multiple West African countries are some of the many examples illustrating the limitations of national efforts in the control of infectious disease.

9. This line of reasoning is also comparable to the “set ground-rules for the sciences, then go where they take you” approach to the question of how to set limits for scientific inquiry.

10. Again, this is similar to the case of the free market: yes, by and large it is preferable to have free markets than not to have them, but this does not render specific aspects of its operations immune to criticism and reform from an ethical point of view.

11. A classic example is when an outbreak of measles can be traced to the intentional under-vaccination of children by their parents (Omer, Salmon, Orenstein, deHart & Halsey 2009; Thompson et al. 2007; Sugarman et al. 2010).

12. The claim that smokers impose economic harms on the rest of us, and thus that reducing smoking saves society money, is empirically questionable. Within the health care system there may be some cost savings, but people who would have died in late middle age of smoking-related illnesses are likely now to live into their 70s and beyond, with ailments that will continue to impose costs on the health care system, perhaps exceeding the costs of what would have been their smoking-related causes of death. Similarly, costs to the social security system increase (because non smokers live longer), while revenues from taxes on smoking products decrease. (Cohen, Neumann, & Weinstein 2008; Russell 2009; Russell 1986).

13. Consider, for example, the debate in the United States about the appropriateness and necessity of isolating asymptomatic health professionals returning from providing care to Ebola patients in West Africa.

14. Ignorance and false beliefs are not usually sufficient to make a preference subject to interference, and generally require supplementing by stronger considerations such as age or cognitive disability or harm to others (e.g. one’s child) on the basis of one’s own ignorance or false beliefs. In the normal course of things, we all have at least some preferences based on ignorance and false beliefs that proponents of soft paternalism nonetheless do not think can legitimately be interfered with unless there is some compelling reason to impute impairment of rationality beyond, say, weakness of will.

15. A humorous but poignant illustration of this is Aesop’s fable about the fox and the grapes: upon realizing he cannot jump high enough to reach the grapes he desperately wants, the fox decides he did not want the grapes to begin with. Notwithstanding the lightness of this example, the real significance of adaptive preferences is when they are formed in tragic circumstances of poverty and discrimination, where individuals convince themselves that they do not want the benefits of health or education or equal treatment and so on because of the excruciating difficulty of continuing to prefer what is out of one’s reach. Thus, individuals modify their preferences to their circumstances. In such cases, one arguably cannot take those preferences to indicate underlying values or decisions that ought not be interfered with.

16. This is often accompanied by a much stronger view of the legitimacy of external judgments about what is really in a person's interest, and a stronger likelihood to question individuals' own assessment of their best interests than alternative, softer versions of paternalism.

17. Philosophers disagree about the significance of the distinction between justice and mere humanitarian duties. Typically, duties of justice are viewed as more stringent, corresponding to someone's rights, and hence not simply matters of charity for which the donor has wide discretion about whom to assist, how much, and in what manner; see Barry (1982).

Copyright © 2015 by
Ruth Faden <>
Sirine Shebaya <>

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