Notes to Isaac Polqar
1. For Polqar’s name in Hebrew and in foreign languages, see Jonathan Hecht 1993: 50, n.1. Hecht indicates that in MS Parma 2440, in which Polqar’s work, Teshuvot Apikoros, appears, his Hebrew name is written פולקר. See also Jacob Levinger, ʿEzer ha-Dat (1984: 9, especially n.1); Isador Loeb (1889: 18, p. 63, n. 2); Moritz Steinschneider (1931: v. 2, p. 2537). In ʿEzer ha-Dat Polqar’s name is written פלקאר. See ʿEzer ha-Dat: 98.
2. We cannot decisively determine where Polqar lived. Yitzhak Baer argues that Polqar resided in Burgos and “other Castilian cities”. See his History of the Jews in Christian Spain, v. 1, p. 331 [English]; History of the Jews in Christian Spain, p. 194 [Hebrew]. According to Graetz, Polqar lived in Avila. See H. Graetz 1894: 91.
3. Sefer be-Hakḥashat ha-ʿiẓtagninot and Iggeret ha-Tiqvah are both mentioned in Abner’s Teshuvot la-Meḥaref, 14a.
4. Sefer be-Hakḥashat ha-ʿiẓtagninot is also mentioned in Abner’s Minḥat Qenaot, chapters 1–2. Polqar himself refers to this work in his ʿEzer ha-Dat: 123.
5. Hecht published this letter in his dissertation. See Hecht 1993: 93–115 [English]; 326–338 [Hebrew].
6. In the Parma manuscript (2440), Polqar’s letter is untitled. However, Abner, in his reply Teshuvot la-Meḥaref, referred to this letter as Iggeret ha-ḥarafot (Epistle of the Blasphemies); see for example pp. 8a; 12b. Polqar refers to his letter in ʿEzer ha-Dat as Teshuvat Apikoros (see ʿEzer ha-Dat: 30; 76). Aaron Hughes (2008: 83) mistakenly maintains that Teshuvat Apikoros is not extant. J. Hecht published both Teshuvat Apikoros and Iggeret ha-ḥarafot as part of his dissertation in 1993.
7. The philosopher presented in this treatise is not the same philosopher as in the previous section. As we shall see later, the young philosopher enthusiastically represents Aristotelian philosophy, without giving much space to his opponent. The philosopher in this section is, by contrast, older, mature, and very much aware of his opponent’s theories.
8. Polqar’s position clearly goes against Aquinas’ position. According to Aquinas, Christianity contains doctrines such as the Trinity and the Incarnation that neither contradict reason nor are truly accessible to human reason. See, for example, Thomas Aquinas, Summa Contra Gentiles (Chapter 3:2):
There is a twofold mode of truth in what we profess about God. Some truths about God exceed all the ability of the human reason. Such is the truth that God is triune. But there are some truths which the natural reason also is able to reach. Such are that God exists, that He is one, and the like. In fact, such truths about God have been proved demonstratively by the philosophers, guided by the light of the natural reason.
9. Here Abner adds some verses that mention the triune nature of God: Exodus 20:5 “for I The Lord Your God” and Josh. 22:22 “God The Lord God”. Hecht notes that Abner utilizes the verse in Exodus because of the pronoun “I” at the beginning, followed by the other two names; see Hecht 1993: 145, n. 254.
10. Abner connects the Hebrew words tevunah (understanding) and binah (sagacity), whose root is b.n.h, with the word Ben (son). The resemblance between the three words serves Abner’s purpose in connecting God’s second attribute to “son”.
11. Here Polqar is referring to Maimonides’ Mishneh Torah and stresses that this work systematically and apodictically presents all practical laws, leaving out the Talmudic discussions. It seems that Polqar tends to agree with Samuel ibn Tibbon, implying that studying the Mishneh Torah is sufficient and that there is no need to study the Talmudic text.
12. If these texts are in harmony with scientific truths, we must accept them. However, if they contradict scientific truths, we must claim that “they are true, however, we are unable to understand them”. See ʿEzer ha-Dat: 63.
13. ʿEzer ha-Dat: 57: “And although these sayings [this is the king messiah] are the sayings of Bilʿam who was not a prophet but praising himself for seeing the sight of Shaddai”.
14. Teshuvat Apikoros: 6a: “Now the matter ‘imitating one in the center’ is a wonderful allusion to those who sanctify themselves by the cross [Sheti va-ʿerev] who are the ones that eat the flesh of the swine and the reptile. And the matter of those who purify themselves to enter the groves”—that is, the ‘basins’—“is also an allusion to that nation, well known to us, who purify themselves in this way, and they are the Ishmaelites”. (The emphasized words are missing in ʿEzer ha-Dat.)