Notes to Epistemological Problems of Perception

1. The respective theories of perception (rather than of perceptual experience) will include an additional relatum, so that intentionalism will see perception as a three-place relation among perceiver, object, and inner representation of that object, adverbialism as a two-place relation between subject and object, etc.

2. There is a purely psychological sense of “evidence” according to which one’s evidence is whatever one bases a belief on, even if that basis does nothing to justify the belief. I am using “evidence” in a normative sense, so that if e is evidence for h, then e confers at least some prima facie justification on h. Similarly with “ground”, “reason” and the like; we sometimes say that a consideration may be S’s reason for doing/believing x but that it is not a reason to do/believe x. “S”s reason’ here uses “reason” in the psychological sense, while “not a reason” uses it in the normative sense.

3. There are complicated issues here, but as a gloss sufficient for the present purposes: to say that it has propositional content is to say that it involves predication and thus has truth conditions; to say that it has conceptual content is, roughly, to say that its content is the same as some belief or thought that the agent is capable of having (the “content view” of conceptual/nonconceptual content: see entry on nonconceptual mental content); to say that it has assertive force is to say that it has a mind-to-world direction of fit, like beliefs, and unlike desires, hopes, and imaginings.

4. The question should not be whether experiences have a nonconceptual content in addition to their conceptual content, but whether any nonconceptual element is taken to do the relevant epistemological work.

5. Pollock (1986) addresses this worry with his epistemological theory of concepts, according to which it is part of the concept of, e.g., red that a certain sense experience is a prima facie reason for the belief that x is red. Most recent proponents of seemings internalism have not embraced this part of Pollock’s view.

6. I am glossing over complexities here regarding the type of reliability relevant to justification (i.e., actual world reliability, normal world reliability, reliability in situ, transglobal reliability, etc.). For details, see the entry on reliabilist epistemology.

Copyright © 2016 by
Jack Lyons <>

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