Notes to Yeshayahu Leibowitz

1. In an eightieth birthday tribute to Leibowitz published in Hebrew translation as “The Conscience of Israel” in the newspaper Ha'aretz, 4 March 1983, 18.

2. See Sihot, 54. Leibowitz states here that he believed Levinas' work was significantly shaped by his Judaism, as much in his general philosophy as in his Jewish writings.

3. These remarks only appear in the original Hebrew version of this piece—“Mitzvot Ma'asiyot,” in Torah u-Mitzvot. Though I have generally tried to refer to the English translations from Judaism throughout, on the few occasions when quotations from Leibowitz's Hebrew texts are required, the translations are my own.

4. This comparison assumes Steven Nadler's view that Spinoza's pantheism is reductive and thus “extensionally equivalent to atheism,” Nadler 2006, 119. Notably, this is a point that Leibowitz himself often makes, defining atheism as the view that “the world is the totality of being, or, in other words, that it is God” (Accepting the Yoke, 14).

5. The Temple, for example, does not have any intrinsic property of holiness—“holiness” is a function of religious acts as we will see, and does not exist independently of those actions. Only activity directed to God is holy and the holiness of the Temple thus consists only of the holy actions performed there. See Judaism, 46–47.

6. See for example his statement at the beginning of “Lishmah and Not-Lishmah,” in Judaism, 61–78.

7. Additional reasons for Leibowitz's denial that the Torah is a work that contains cognitive information are detailed in Sagi 1997, 432ff.

8. Of the various sources of rabbinic authority in the Torah, the most oft cited is Deuteronomy 17: 8–11, which tells of coming for judgment to the “priests, the Levites and the judge that shall be in those days,” and to not deviate from their judgment. Rabbinic interpretation and comment on this is voluminous. Particularly relevant to this discussion is Moses Maimonides, Mishneh Torah, “Laws of Rebels,” 1: 1–2.

9. For example, “The acceptance of the yoke of Torah and Mitzvoth is the love of God, and it is this that constitutes faith in God.” (Judaism, 44–45, emphasis added).

10. Leibowitz does note the possibility of exceptions where individuals arrive at practice based on “faith,” rather than practice, though he believes that it must indicate a prior religious propensity. See Judaism, 7. The phenomenon within Judaism of Ba'alei Teshuvah—the term used to describe Jews who decide to turn to Jewish practice without having been practitioners to that point, might fall into this category for him.

11. He is often a little evasive on this. When asked, he does not directly say no. He merely implies that the question is irrelevant to religious faith since what matters is the commitment of faith. See Leibowitz, Yahadut, 344.

12. The source for this in Maimonides is in his Guide of the Perplexed, tr. S. Pines (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1963), II: 40, 381–385. This is not, however, Leibowitz's interpretation of Maimonides, though many scholars deem his reading of Maimonides to be rather idiosyncratic.

13. See, for example, Judaism, 20 and 22 for the view that such worship is idolatrous. In contrast, Judaism, 40 and 66 speak of it as permitted.

14. Further parallels to Kierkegaard are scattered throughout Sagi 2009.

Copyright © 2011 by
Daniel Rynhold <>

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