Notes to William Heytesbury

1. This is Kaye’s interpretation derived from Olga Weijers (1998: 34–36). Some sources interpret it as a recipient of a scholarship (cf. Wilson 1960: 7 and Spade’s introduction to Heytesbury 1979: 1).

2. For more bibliographical information concerning Heytesbury, see Longeway's previous entry on Heytesbury in the SEP and Longeway 2011.

3. The treatise De veritate et falsitate propositionis ascribed to Heytesbury in the incunabula editions is currently ascribed to Henry Hopton (the debate on the authorship is summarized by Maierú 1993: 103). Also, the authenticity of Probationes conclusionum (a collection of sophisms thematically similar to Regulae solvendi sophismata) is spurious.

4. In the absence of a modern critical edition, this entry will, for practical reasons, use the 1494 printed edition and English translations (if any) as the primary reference point. Other sources will be referenced only in case of significant deviations.

5. For a general information about obligationes, see Spade and Yrjönsuuri 2014.

6. “A man is a donkey” could be a false essential predication. Paul of Venice, who seems to develop the same theory, assumes that “you are a human” and “you are not an animal” cannot be imagined to hold at the same time, while “you are a human” and “you are not able to laugh” can (Paul of Venice PV-LM: 92–93).

7. But as is clear from Heytesbury’s treatise on insolubilia, respondents are advised to reject even the covert inconsistencies generated by semantic paradoxes.

8. These principles occur by Walter Burley who claims that an impossible casus can be admitted only if it is not explicitly inconsistent and reports the position that such casus must be “tenable”. Burley insists that the logic of such games must be based on “natural implication”, where the consequent is conceived in the antecedent (Burley Bu-DC: 128–129) and the rules “ex impossibili quodlibet” and “necessarium ad quodlibet” are to be rejected to secure the reasonable properties of relevance (Burley Bu-DO: 83–84; a similar position was presented by thirteenth-century logicians, cf. William of Sherwood [WS] and de Rijk 1974). Heytesbury does not discuss the logic of imaginable casus explicitly, but has the necessary means for introducing the relevance view of validity.

9. For an analysis of one of these sophisms, see Sylla 1981 and Biard 1983.

10. See King 1991, Yrjönsuuri 1993, Franklin 2012. Other applications of “positio impossibilis” include Trinitarian theology (Yrjöonsuuri 2000).

11. Cf. Sylla 1982: 558–560 and Jung 2004: 507–508.

12. Heytesbury’s fifteenth-century followers and commentators relate this theory to the rule “conceding and denying is not to be altered due to the change of the meaning”; see Manfredus de Medici 1542: fol. 106vb, for the debate of this principle, cf. Spade 1982, 339–340. Also, different forms of sentential meaning are discussed in this context; cf. Paul of Venice PV-LP: 149–150; Paul of Pergula PP-LT: 147–148; Cajetan of Thiene 1494: fol. 9va.

13. De Rijk 1962 and 1967 is the seminal work on the topic. For a recent overview of the topic, see Read 2015. Dutilh Novaes 2007 examines this relation on the example of Heytesbury’s contemporary Ockham.

14. Heytesbury also speaks of “discrete” signification in contrast to “confused signification” in [RSS] 1494: fol. 20rb (the checked manuscripts support this version). Also, he uses the distinction between “discrete” and “common” objects ([SCD] 1494: fol. 3va [1988: 428].

15. Whether the entire category of immobile distributive supposition is meaningful is another question. If Heytesbury were to develop a general theory of supposition, he would have to define supposition independently of descensus.

16. Weisheipl claims that Heytesbury accepted Ockham’s view of simple supposition based on indirect evidence (Weisheipl 1968: 198). See Read 2015 for more details concerning scholastic views of simple supposition.

17. Courtenay mentions that Heytesbury is often listed among the members of “the English school of nominalism” (2008: 107).

18. To be sure, proprietates terminorum is not the only solution to these problems available in the fourteenth-century logicians. As opposed to the bottom-up theories of suppositio, the top-down quasi-inferentialist approach (which Heytesbury adopts in, e.g., [SophAs] 402) resulted in the genre of “probationes terminorum” (cf. de Rijk 1982).

19. See also [Soph] soph. 5 [1494: fol. 92va] and 26 [1494: fol. 147ra].

20. See also [RSS] 1494: fol. 5rb [1979: 30].

21. Walter Burley’s De consequentiis is a likely source (for terminological reasons); see Burley Bu-DC: 129.

22. For a comparative overview of the fourteenth-century accounts, see Pironet’s introduction to Sophismata asinina (Heytesbury 1994: 94), where, additionally, a counterpart to material implication (the so-called “consequentia bona ut nunc”) is included.

23. For a historical overview of these traditions, see Dutilh Novaes 2016.

24. Different forms of late medieval epistemic logic are analyzed in Boh 1986; Heytesbury is among the authors who introduced epistemic logic to solve sophisms (as did, for instance, Buridan). At the same time, his treatise is a starting point for the analysis of the necessary and sufficient conditions of knowledge (Boh 2000).

25. For the analysis from the point of view of obligationes, cf. Stump 1989, Read 2013, and Johnston 2013.

26. For a comprehensive analysis of [SCD], see Maierú 1966.

27. For a comparative analysis of Heytesbury and the Parisian tradition represented by John Buridan and Albert of Saxony, see Biard 1989.

28. See Sinkler 1989 for Heytesbury’s word-order theory of sentential meaning and Maierú 2004: 35–39 for the underlying theory of mental language.

29. For the motivation, sufficiency, and reception of this definition, cf. Boh 1993, Pasnau 1995, Martens 2010.

30. (T) is also more explicitly utilized in [IHT] arg. 28.

31. This passage is explicitly related to the treatise on paradoxes. See also [CO] soph. 2, where the “primary and adequate” signification is denied to be closed under entailment (which Read 2013 and Johnston 2013 interpreted as a criticism of Bradwardine). The more comprehensive account of the same sophism in [RSS] introduces the category of implied meaning coherent with Bradwardinian semantics (cf. Bradwardine B-I with Read’s introduction). The relation to Bradwardine is more complicated. While Heytesbury seems to agree with Bradwardine’s sentential semantics, he does not seem to apply it to the treatment of semantic paradoxes.

32. As a weaker consequence, signification distributes over implication (meaning is closed under modus ponens):

  • (SC*) \( \textrm{sig}(a,A\Rightarrow B)∧ \textrm{sig}(a,A)\vdash \textrm{sig}(a,B) \)

The exact nature of “\(\Rightarrow\)” cannot be determined by textual evidence.

33. Assuming that knowledge requires active consideration (as before), this principle does not imply that an agent is an automatic knowledge-generator, but rather that knowledge grows step-wise, as an agent makes inference-steps.

34. Note, as Heytesbury does, that this is an instance of the de re/de dicto ambiguity.

35. In the Kripkean semantics for epistemic logic where models only include logically possible worlds, (O) and (K) are equivalent (via “necessitation”: every tautology is known), as a result of identifying beliefs with possible worlds. If one were to view beliefs simply as facts among other facts, as medieval authors are prone to, such problem would disappear.

36. For general overview, see Bottin 1976: 91–107; Spade 1975: 116–118; Pironet 2001 and 2008.

Other contexts include [IHT] arg. 11. Also, disjunctive and conditional form of Curry’s paradox are discussed in [SophAs] 413–414 and 424–425 (see Pironet 1993 for the authenticity-problem), where, alongside with the [RSS] position, the treatment of paradoxes in terms of banishing self-reference is presented.

37. Heytesbury’s sarcastic remark “…si inter contradictoria sciverit secunda opinio mediare…” ([RSS] 1494, fol. 5ra [1979; 26] resembles Bradwardine’s “…nisi medians velit contradictoria mediare…” (B-I: 90).

38. Pozzi’s edition is based on Vatican Vat. lat. 2138 and 2138) and supported by other mss, including Erfurt Amplon. F. 135, Leipzig UB 1360 and 1370 and Prague NK III.A.11.

39. Such reductio occurs in Leipzig UB 1360, fols. 110vb–111ra, but in no other sources used here. The representativeness of this insertion needs more study, but it is in accord with a fourteenth-century Pseudo-Heytesburian treatise (Pironet 2008: 292) and the fifteenth-century developments by Paul of Pergula (PP-LT: 136) and Cajetan of Thiene (1494, fol. 9ra–rb). Finally, such interpretation was coined by Spade (Heytesbury 1979: 85) and recently Strobino (2012: 491). Alternatively, Yrjönsuuri 2008 suggests that the falsity of (s) is implied by the tacit assumption that Heytesbury subscribes to Bradwardine’s view that meaning is closed under entailment and (s) claims its own truth. That option may be correct, but not supported by textual evidence. Pironet suggests an interpretation supported by [SophAs] and a Heytesburian treatise authored by “Magister Ioannes Eclif”: (s) is false based on its primary signification (and regardless of its secondary signification), for it implies that (s) is both true and false, which is impossible (Pironet 2001: 97–105 and 2008: 264).

40. [RSS] 1494, fol. 6ra [1979: 40]. For a possible connection between Heytesbury’s insolubilia and the thirteenth-century obligationes, see Spade 1976.

41. Cf. Bottin 1985 and Yrjönsuuri 2008; for a systematic overview of scholastic treatment of paradoxes, cf. Dutilh Novaes 2008; for a historical overview cf. Spade and Read 2013.

42. Commentaries in Heytesbury’s insolubilia were written by Cajetan of Thiene and Paul of Pergula (Spade 1975: 53–54 and 80 and 80–81), Manfred of Medici’s commentary on Paul of Venice’s Logica parva is admitted to be Heytesburian (cf. de Medici 1542, fol. 104ra). Another commentary is contained in ms BAV Vat. lat. 3058, fol. 122–129va. Part of the ms was attributed to Thomas of Udine O.P. by Weisheipl (1969 (General Biographical Sources): 216), Spade (1989: 307–308) considers this attribution unverified. In the manuscript, only the adjoined “Regule proportionum” are attributed to “magistri Thome de Utino” (BAV Vat. lat. 3058, fols. 128va–129rb), but not the disputed questions.

43. At least John Mair’s catalogue of solutions to paradox displays influences of the Italian tradition (cf. Mair 1505).

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