Notes to Bayesian Epistemology

1. Most authors (e.g., de Finetti) take unconditional probabilities as primitive. Following ideas of Popper and Réyni, it is possible to take conditional probabilities as primitive. The Popper-Réyni strategy avoids the problem of the non-existence of probabilities conditional on statements with unconditional probability of zero.

2. The assumptions are those necessary to assure that gambles are ranked by their expected monetary value. The idea of explaining rational behavior in terms of maximizing the expected value of gambles led to the 20th century development of Bayesian Decision Theory. See, for example, Ramsey, de Finetti, Savage, and Jeffrey.

3. Van Fraasen's Special Reflection Principle is: P(A|pt(A) = x) = x (where t ≥ 0). His General Reflection Principle is that one's current opinion about an event E must lie in the range spanned by the possible opinions (based on one's present opinion) that one may come to have about E at later time t. Van Fraassen provides diachronic Dutch Book Arguments for both, though he downplays the significance of Dutch Book Arguments generally.

4. Lewis's (Reformulated) Principal Principle relates Chance for a world w at time t (Ptw) to Credence (C) as a function of the complete history of world w up to time t (Htw) and the complete theory of chance for world w (Tw) as follows: Ptw(A) = C(A/HtwTw).

Copyright © 2008 by
William Talbott

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