Notes to Spinoza's Physical Theory

1. Leibniz famously criticized Descartes on this point, arguing that what is preserved in interactions is a function not of speed and bulk, but of velocity and what we now think of as mass; that is, it is momentum that is preserved. Leibniz took this to entail that there are powers of bodies that are not reducible to or accountable for in terms of their extensive quantities; this essentially entails a rejection of the Cartesian idea that the essence of body is exhausted by extension. Spinoza was unaware of Leibniz's criticism of Descartes' conservation law. Given the experimental basis of Leibniz's argument, it is a fair question whether Spinoza would have accepted Leibniz's reasoning even if he had been aware of it.

2. Of course, there could be no general laws covering interactions between bodies initially moving along the same line either, since extra-physical influence could cause a deviation from that line. But in that case it would be clear, given the laws Descartes in fact gives, that the deviation arose from external influence. But in cases involving no change of direction at all, we can be sure that either no extra-physical influence was brought to bear, or that the net effect of non-physical influences was null.

3. On at least one occasion Spinoza does claim that no ground is required where Descartes supposes one is. He claims that truth is its own standard (IIp43s), and therefore needs not be certified by some grounding criterion, such as Descartes' non-deceiving God. However, this is not a close parallel to the case of the principle of inertia. A fundamental capacity to distinguish truth from error is required in order that we be entitled to recognize any rational demonstration at all as an indication of the being of things. This can certainly not be generalized to the claim that we can recognize the truth of any every idea without attending to its grounds; indeed, the very notion of an adequate idea is of one that includes its grounds. There is no evident reason that an adequate, true, conception of the law of inertia should be exempt from this demand.

4. That he regards this discussion as inadequate is suggested by his closing remark that, to set these matters out fully, he would have had to “expand [his] explications and demonstrations.”

5. Bennett's interpretation attaches to “motion and rest” as it figures, not in the PI, but in connection with the eternal and infinite modes mentioned in E1P21, of which letter 64 says that “motion and rest” is an example. On Bennett's view, the PI is simply incoherent in light of the basic commitment to an adjectival account of bodies.

6. PCPIId5n.2 perhaps leaves more room to maneuver: here what PCPIIP22 later calls “motion” is characterized as “the force or actions which moves” an individual body in local motion; what gets later called “rest” is “the force required to take away those certain degrees of motion from the body so that it is wholly at rest”. This, at least, does not explicitly ascribe these forces to bodies; but nor does it ascribe them to regions of extension.

7. This approach seems to be taken in Bennett (1984), and perhaps Deuleuze (1990) as well.

8. A complication prohibits us from inferring straightaway that essences are particular to individuals, and adequate on their own to individuate them. There is some apparent support to be found in Spinoza's text for the claim that distinct individuals may share essence. In Ip17s Spinoza says, “a man is the cause of the existence of another man, but not of his essence, for that latter is an eternal truth. Hence they can agree entirely according to their essence. But in existing they must differ.” But while not in outright contradiction with IId2, the idea that two distinct individuals might agree entirely in their essences has quite implausible and embarrassing consequences when taken in concert with it. For suppose I conceive Peter, who has a given essence, through being caused to have an idea of him by interacting with him. Suppose further that Paul shares that essence, though I have never interacted with him. Nonetheless, in conceiving Peter I conceive Paul. Worse yet, if two distinct individuals may have the same essence, then IId2 would imply that any two individuals that share the same essence must co-endure, i.e., must exist determinately at precisely the same times, since if one of them exists, its essence does, and that essence cannot exist without that of which it is the essence existing. Not only is this implausible on its face, it also directly conflicts with the very example IIp17s exploits in allegedly showing how two individuals might share an essence: a man sharing entirely the essence of another man whom he causes. It makes more interpretive sense to suppose that Spinoza regards essences as particular to the individuals to which they belong.

But we need not read the remark in Ip17s as actually endorsing in full voice the view that two individuals can have the same essence. Spinoza makes this remark in the context of explaining how the intellect and will of God must differ in kind from ours. He prefaces the remark by saying that “what is caused differs from its cause precisely in what it has from the cause.” Thus the fact that a man causes the existence of another ensures that they must disagree as to existence. However, since he does not cause the other's essence, the fact that he is that other's cause does not require that they differ in essence. This is not to imply absolutely that they may have the same essence, but only that the causal relationship between them, as opposed to that between God and ourselves, does not itself prohibit this.

9. See MacKeon (1987), Klever (1990) and Gabbey (1996) for discussions of Spinoza's attitude towards observation and experiment, and Deleuze (1990) on Spinoza's attitude notions of quantity, time measure and number.

10. Gabbey (1996) presents strong arguments in support of the view that for Spinoza “randomness” or “vagueness” in experience is not a matter of the disorderliness with which it occurs, but of the logical status of the individual experiences on which a judgment is based. If this is right, then we may have a conception of experientia non-vaga, or determinatio, but not one on which such experience could be the basis of adequate ideas.

11. It is an interesting question the extent to which developments in the theory of transfinite numbers vitiates the reasons Spinoza had to be suspicious of numerical treatments of the continua that are space, time, and the limited extensive magnitudes that characterize the existence and duration of bodies. It is also an interesting question to what extent Spinoza's own thinking about the infinite contained glimmers of the central insights behind those developments. See Ariew (1990), for discussion.

Copyright © 2012 by
Richard Manning <>

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