Notes to Social Institutions

1. The fact that a society might engage in trade with other societies and, as a consequence, rely on other societies for certain purely physical resources does not affect this point. However, if it came to rely on cultural or educational resources then matters would be different. Moreover, increased economic interdependence and integration with other societies certainly puts pressure on the concept of a society. As far as political independence is concerned, perhaps a society which is temporarily politically subsumed by another society, e.g. in an empire, might nevertheless remain a society if it maintained a degree of integrity and distinctiveness in relation to its governance structures.

2. One way of drawing the distinction is as follows. Having an end is some form of mental state; but mentality is not necessarily an element of a function or possessed by the things that have functions, e.g. the function of the heart is to ensure that blood is circulated throughout the body. Naturally, the explanations for the possession of an end are multifarious; perhaps, for example, some collective ends are “wired-in”. Consider the desired end for sexual union. And if “wired-in” they might, nevertheless, exist in a relatively inchoate form; hence the need for social forms to refine and articulate prior collective ends.

3. Searle, in particular, might claim that the point of the deontic power is to enable the performance of the function. No doubt, but the function of money viz. exchange can be performed by shells (without deontic status), and the function of surgeons by non-accredited persons with surgery skills. That is, it is false that deontic powers are necessary for the performance of these functions.

4. Earlier versions of the material in this section appeared in Miller 2001 Chapter 6.

5. Here there is simplification for the sake of clarity. For what is said here is not strictly correct, at least in the case of many actions performed by members of organisations. Rather, typically some threshold set of actions is necessary to achieve the end; moreover the boundaries of this set are vague.

6. Managers and workers might in effect have waived this joint right by virtue of their employment contracts. But this does not affect the substantive point in relation to their prior joint moral right.

Copyright © 2011 by
Seumas Miller <>

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