Born in 1908, Merleau-Ponty died in 1961 at the age of 53. This essay will follow the basic contours of his thought, beginning with the first published work, The Structure of Behavior (SB), followed by the Phenomenology of Perception (PP), and concluding with the posthumously published The Visible and the Invisible (VI). It will include only brief excursions into his writings on politics and art. Although I have no interest in dividing his oeuvre into three distinct periods, nonetheless, each of these works marks a stage in the philosophical itinerary of his thought, culminating with an ontology of the flesh elaborated in his later thought.
- 1. Neither Naturalism Nor Objectivism
- 2. The Third Dialectic
- 3. Critique Of Transcendental Philosophy
- 4. The Philosophy Of Language
- 5. Merleau-Ponty And Saussure
- 6. Political Philosophy And History
- 7. Ontology Of The Flesh
- 8. Merleau-Ponty in the 21st Century
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The first sentence of The Structure of Behavior reads, “Our goal is to understand the relationship of consciousness and nature: organic, psychological or even social” (SB, 3). In the philosophical field that Merleau-Ponty entered, the question concerning the relationship of consciousness and nature was dominated by two distinct approaches: on the one hand, what Merleau-Ponty would call ‘objectivism’, understood as naturalism in philosophy, behaviorism in psychology, and mechanism in biology; on the other hand, what he calls ‘intellectualism’, that is, the neo-Kantianism which loomed large in France at that time, particularly the thought of Brunschvicg. Merleau-Ponty's own position emerges as he critically negotiates his way between these two approaches. In The Structure of Behavior, he argues against naturalism and objectivism, however, he does not employ the epistemological resources of the Kantian tradition. In his rejection of an epistemological starting point, Merleau-Ponty's position resembles that of Hegel in the Phenomenology of Spirit. The Hegelian influence on The Structure of Behavior should not be underestimated. Like Hegel, Merleau-Ponty ‘starts from below’, which is to say, he does not begin with an analysis of a subjectivity which would constitute the condition of possibility for the appearance of objectivity. Rather he turns his attention to the research that was currently being done in the psychology and the biology of his day, attempting to demonstrate that the actual results of this research contradict the explicit ontology that subtends it.
Merleau-Ponty's strategy is to critically appropriate the critique of classical behaviorism that had been elaborated by the Gestalt psychologists. Without rehearsing the details of their analyses, what they had shown is that in order to arrive at a ‘basic’ unit of explanation, for example, ‘sense data’ or the ‘reflex arc’, it is necessary to simplify analytically what actually had been given phenomenally in experience. Merleau-Ponty evokes the simple experience of seeing a spot of light on a wall in a dark room. In this situation, the subject speaks of his attention being attracted by a spot of light, of his being pulled along by it. As such, this behavior is teleological and meaningful; it has a direction. He often evokes the ambiguity of the French word sense as both, or either, ‘meaning’ or ‘direction’, as for example, the street sign, sens unique, a ‘one way street’. According to classical behaviorism, the characteristics of my behavior toward the phenomenal light must be rejected as not being fundamental. Rather the spot of light must be explained by means of the causal action between the real light, conceived of as vibratory motion in the real world, and my body, conceived of as a part of the real world that exists partes extra partes. The spot of light on the black background must be decomposed, analyzed, into atomic units of ‘sense data’ which act upon distinctly localizable anatomical places of my retina. My behavior, which is phenomenally experienced as motivated, is, in ‘reality’, caused. My vision is not viewed as ‘attracted by’, ‘pulled toward’, rather it considered to be a response to a causal stimulus.
The Gestalt theorists had shown experimentally that even the most elementary experience is always structured, the most basic structure being that of the figure/ground. They argued that in terms of learning, the organism is not subjected to a causal process by which a certain ‘reflex arc’ becomes privileged through repetition; it does not ‘learn a response’ to a definite stimulus, rather it responses to a form, a gestalt of stimuli, a typical stimulus. “It is not the violent reaction which follows a painful experience that is established in a child's behavior, but rather the reaction of protecting himself, and although both reactions have the same meaning [not to touch the hot stove], they do not have the same appearance.” Merleau-Ponty writes, “learning is not a real operation” (SB, 98–99) and reaction is a type of behavior directed to a typical stimulus. The Gestalt theorists, Koehler and Koffka, had shown that the atomic units of perception and learning, namely, ‘sense data’ and ‘the reflex arc,’ are not elementary but derived and a structure is not reducible to the interaction of atomic units. According to Merleau-Ponty, the Gestalists had misunderstood the ultimate implications of their own work, because they believed that the notion of structure can be thought within the naturalist ontology that subtended the thought of the atomists whom they had criticized. The Gestalt theorists believed that structures existed in nature and that they do not cause atomic responses but rather structured responses. According to this view, behavior is still defined as a product of causality, but it is now a structural causality in which the structure remains a thing-like being. “The integration of matter, life and mind is obtained by this reduction to a common denominator of physical form” (SB, 135).
Against this position, Merleau-Ponty claims that the introduction of the concept of the Gestalt necessitates a complete revision on the level of both epistemology and ontology. Permit me an extended citation from The Structure of Behavior inasmuch as I think this passage is the pivotal point of the book.
That in the final analysis form cannot be defined in terms of reality but in terms of knowledge, not a thing of the physical world but as a perceived whole, is explicitly recognized by Koehler when he writes that the order in a form ‘rests’ …on the fact that each local event, one could almost say ‘dynamically knows’ others. It is not an accident that, in order to express this presence of each moment to the other, Koehler comes up with the term ‘knowledge’. A unity of this type can be found only in an object of knowledge. Taken as a being of nature, existing in space, the form would always be dispersed in several places and distributed in local events, even if these events mutually determine each other; to say that it does not suffer this division amounts to saying that it is not spread out in space, that it does not exist in the same manner as a thing, that it is the idea under which what happens in several places is brought together and resumed. This unity is the unity of perceived objects. A colored circle which I look at is completely modified in its physiognomy by an irregularity which removes something of its circular character and makes it an imperfect circle. (SB, 143)
Merleau-Ponty argues that the Gestalt exists for a perceiving subject; it is not a part of the world as it is in itself. The stimulus does not unilaterally affect the organism in virtue of its absolute physical and chemical properties; it becomes a stimulus only insofar as the organism constitutes for itself a vital milieu which it projects around itself. The mouse in The Metropolitan Museum of Art is affected by the crumbs of cookies on the floor, but not by the Velázquez painting on the wall. In the milieu that the mouse constitutes, the crumb is desirable and the painting does not exist.
Through his analysis of the notion of Gestalt, Merleau-Ponty arrives at the threshold of transcendental philosophy; however, he does not simply cross it. In the Introduction to The Structure of Behavior, rhetorically he asks, “Is the solution to be found purely and simply in a return to critical thought?” (SB, 4) According to him, there is something in naturalism which must be both understood and transposed. In his attempt to accomplish this understanding and transposition, he employs the notion of Gestalt, a notion which will become a guiding thread throughout his thought. In a Working Note to The Visible and the Invisible dated September 1959, he begins with the question: “What is a Gestalt?” (VI, 204).
In The Structure of Behavior, he elaborates the notion of three types of Gestalten, namely, the physical, the vital and that of the human order. Within the physical world, viewed as a world of appearances, there are structures, for example, the oil spot on water, the distribution of an electrical charge and so forth. Merleau-Ponty, in fact, argues that all scientific laws are expressions of structural relations. In the area of vital structures, he makes a distinction between different structures on the basis of their capacity to generalize, that is, their ability to remove themselves from a concrete situation. Syncretic structures are tied to the concrete, for example, a frog who is shown a fly which is separated from it by a glass panel will, nonetheless, snap at the fly as long as it sees it. Whereas amovable structures are connected to a certain type of situation, for example, a chicken can be taught to distinguish between the different shades of the color of his food; thus he is able to pick the lighter colored corn even though he has never encountered any corn of this particular shade. One could say that he has learned the opposition between lighter and darker.
The human order opens what Merleau-Ponty calls a ‘third dialectic’. Tied neither to a fact, nor to a delineated type of situation, it institutes a domain of culture in which the object is in no immediate sense related to a biological function. This ‘third dialectic’ is characterized by “the Hegelian term ‘work’” (SB, 163). Following Kojève, Merleau-Ponty regards ‘work’ as instituting a delay between a biological stimulus and a response, thus opening a domain of culture. He argues that Language, as a domain of signification, radically transcends the domain of a singular fact. Then he shows that between these three structures there is no equality, inasmuch as the study of nature, inanimate or animate, is accomplished in language. It is at this point that he cites Hegel approvingly: “The mind of nature is a hidden mind. It is not produced in the form of mind. It is only mind for the mind that knows it.” Then Merleau-Ponty continues, “In reality, we have already introduced consciousness, and what we have designated under the name of life was already consciousness of life. The concept is only the interior of nature, says Hegel. And already it seemed to us that the notion of a living body could not be grasped without the unity of signification, which distinguishes a gesture from a sum of movements” (SB, 161–162). Between consciousness and nature there is not a relation of exteriority. At this period in Merleau-Ponty's thought, Husserl's notion of intentionality has not yet been integrated into his thinking. It could be said that the role Hegel played in The Structure of Behavior has, in his later work, been displaced by Husserl. Nonetheless, the quote from Hegel's Philosophy of Nature cannot but strike the reader of The Visible and the Invisible where Merleau-Ponty speaks of the Invisible as the Invisible of the Visible, as its lining.
In both the Phenomenology of Perception and The Visible and the Invisible, he elaborates a conception of the relationship between the body and the soul that both retains and transforms the conception presented in The Structure of Behavior. Against Descartes, he claims that this relation is not a relationship between two substances which would in some way connect with one another. On the contray, the three structures are integrated, one into the other, in such a way that it reminds the reader of Hegel's notion of sublation (Aufhebung) whereby the lower is both cancelled, as independent, and also retained. When this synthesis is accomplished, the autonomy of the lower is annulled; however, the synthesis can become undone, in which case the autonomy of the lower structure re-emerges. When this synthesis is effected, the lower structure does not exist as such. “The appearance of reason and mind does not leave intact a sphere of self-enclosed instincts” (SB, 181). Merleau-Ponty insists that when speaking of the physical, the vital and the human structures, one should not conceive of them as acting on one another in a causal manner. “Each of them has to be conceived as a retaking and ‘new’ structuralization of the preceding one” (SB, 184). Insofar as the ‘third dialectic’ has fully integrated the physical and the vital structures so that they no longer act as autonomous systems, one could say that “body and soul are no longer distinguished” (SB, 203). Nonetheless, when they disintegrate then they are experienced as distinct. Merleau-Ponty writes, “This is the truth of dualism” (SB, 209).
As we have seen, the Gestalt does not exist as a thing in nature, rather it is viewed as an object of ‘knowledge’ for a subject. Thus we see that Merleau-Ponty comes to the threshold of transcendental philosophy, however, it is his ‘interrogation of the subject’ which blocks his entry into critical philosophy proper. He views this subject as neither the substantial subject of Descartes, nor the Kantian “I think” that can accompany any possible experience, rather it is a subject which has itself been constituted by a dialectic of physical and vital structures. He tells us that we must relativize the notion of body and soul, since each moment of the dialectic is “…soul with respect to the preceding one, and body with respect to the following one” (SB, 210). The subject for whom nature appears is itself the result of a dialectic which is, in the sense indicated above, a part of nature. Thus, to the question that forms the title of the last chapter of The Structure of Behavior, “Is there not a truth to naturalism?”, the answer is “Yes.” Merleau-Ponty's reflections on the being of the Gestalt led him to Hegel who claims that “Nature is the exterior of the concept” (SB, 210), but for Hegel, when the concept becomes conscious of itself, it comes to see that it has no exterior. On the contrary, for Merleau-Ponty the Gestalt must be conceived of as a unity of both nature and idea. This unity is intractable. There is in experience an “original text which cannot be extracted from its relationship to nature. The signification is embodied” (SB, 211). Thus we see that the consciousness for which the Gestalt exists is not an intellectual consciousness, rather it is a perceptual consciousness. According to critical philosophy, nature becomes a system of representations which exists for a consciousness whose activity is the condition of its possibility as appearance. Its unity is engendered by the synthesis which the subject effects of itself by its apperception and which it articulates in the “Table of Judgments.”
The movement from The Structure of Behavior to the Phenomenology of Perception is one in which critical philosophy, at whose threshold Merleau-Ponty hesitated in the last pages of the former book, becomes an object for critical reflection. As we have already noted, the philosophy of Husserl does not loom large in The Structure of Behavior. We note that The Structure of Behavior was published in 1941, and that beginning in 1939 Merleau-Ponty visited the Husserl Archives a number of times. Between then and 1945, the year in which the Phenomenology of Perception was published, the work of Husserl comes to exert a strong influence on his thinking; but in no sense can we argue that Merleau-Ponty uncritically absorbed Husserl's position. Although he often returns to the thought of Husserl and, towards the end of his life, writes a particularly brilliant article on him, “The Philosopher and his Shadow,” for our purposes here, the Preface to the Phenomenology of Perception can serve as the place where Merleau-Ponty elaborates upon his encounter with the thought of Husserl. It begins with the question, “What is phenomenology?” (PP, vii) Then he evokes a series of antimonies which he refers to as contradictions in Husserl's thought. Phenomenology is both a knowledge of essences and also a philosophy which puts essences back into existence, insisting that man and the world can be understood only on the basis of facticity; it has both a static and a genetic moment. All these different tensions will be resolved in Merleau-Ponty's thought, but for the most part not in the direction that Husserl, at least as he is conventionally interpreted, would have approved.
The Phenomenology of Perception repeats and deepens Merleau-Ponty's critique of objective thought. As in The Structure of Behavior, this is not accomplished from an exterior epistemological perspective, rather he follows through the implicit critique of objectivism that was implied in the researches of empirical psychology and biology. In this brief introduction to Merleau-Ponty's philosophy, I will not pursue this thread of his thought further, but I must insist that he continues, to the time of his death, to remain in touch with the empirical sciences, particularly psychology but not absolutely excluding biology and physics. Nonetheless, there was on his part no attempt to found, or to prove, his philosophy on the basis of science, a project which for a phenomenological philosopher would be absurd. He writes, “The whole universe of science is built upon the world as directly experienced, and if we want to subject science itself to a rigorous scrutiny, and arrive at a precise assessment of its meaning and scope, we must begin by reawakening the basic experience of the world, of which science is the second-order expression” (PP, viii). Unlike Heidegger, he does not have a dismissive attitude towards science, namely, that it “does not think” or that it is merely calculation. On the contrary, in Merleau-Ponty's thought there is a constant dialogue with the sciences in the hope of a mutual clarification.
The aspect of the Phenomenology of Perception that I will bring to center stage is its deepening critique of transcendental philosophy and the implications of this for philosophy in general. Already in the Preface to the Phenomenology of Perception, Merleau-Ponty radically distinguishes his project from that of both Descartes and Kant whom he claims have detached the conscious subject from the world that is given in experience. Both of these thinkers proposed that “I could not apprehend anything as existing, unless I, first of all, experience myself as existing in the act of apprehending it” (PP, ix). According to Descartes, the subject's intuition of itself in the Cogito is the ground for its intuition of anything else. In the “Second Meditation” he tells us that he sees light and feels heat; but with the evil genius still on the loose, there is a distinct possibility that there is neither light nor heat. Nevertheless, that I see light and feel heat is as certain as the certainty of my own existence. However, this certainty is purchased at a price, namely, that of changing the object of perception into the thought, or the representation, of the object of perception. What Merleau-Ponty calls “analytic reflection” does not describe the world that is given to me when I open my eyes; rather it views the world as a product of subjective synthesis. This type of reflection does not describe my experience, but reconstructs it, thereby remaining true to Vico's maxim that ‘we can only know what we have made’. Merleau-Ponty, on the contrary, insists that we do not make the world that we experience. He writes, “The real is a closely woven fabric” (PP, x). It is not constituted out of acts of judgment, or acts of predication. If this were the case, then it would have the character of probability. I would be constantly readjusting the synthesis which gave my representations the status of reality. He argues that this is not the case, and that even the most improbable phenomena are immediately accepted as real. For example, if I were to see a number of cows in the corridor of The New School for Social Research, my first question would be, “What are these cows doing in The New School?” It would not be, except on the worst of days, “Are these cows real?”
It is from the observation of such phenomena that Merleau-Ponty concludes that perception and judgment cannot be accorded the same status. He distances himself from ‘analytic reflection’ in an important respect, particularly from the incarnation of it in the writings of Leon Brunschvicg. Gutting (2001) shows that Brunschvicg attempted to establish an identity between cognition and judgment by arguing that all cognitive activities are reducible to judgment. He claimed that in order to conceive, man must unite together certain characteristics and a certain understanding. Within the Kantian tradition, genuine knowledge requires receptivity and spontaneity. Spontaneity is conceived of as being intelligible through the “Categories of Judgment.” Much of the Phenomenology of Perception is written against this thesis, a thesis to which we will return in our reflections on The Visible and the Invisible.
The transformation of the object of perception into the thought of the object of perception, that is to say, the attempt to reconstitute the world in immanence, is pursued not only by analytic reflection; it is also accomplished by the phenomenological reduction, at least as it is proposed by Husserl (1913, Volume One). The reduction puts into brackets the thesis of the “natural attitude,” that is, the naive belief in the independent existence of a natural world, and, implicitly, that our perception of the world is caused by the world. After ‘the reduction’ the world remains, but now it is a world that is meant, a world which is the intentional correlate of acts of Sinngebung of a subject for whom this world appears. In this sense, Merleau-Ponty writes, “The phenomenological reduction is idealist” (PP, xi). He rejects those aspects of Husserl's thought which make the being of the subject coincide with its consciousness of itself, and which transform the experience of the world into the thought of the world. Nevertheless, he wishes to retain a certain attenuated, or weaker, conception of the reduction; he evokes Eugen Fink's characterization of the reduction as ‘wonder in the face of the world’. Merleau-Ponty writes, “Reduction does not withdraw from the world towards the unity of consciousness as the world's basis: it steps back to watch the forms of transcendence fly up like sparks from a fire; it slackens the intentional threads which attach us to the world, and thus brings them to our notice. It, alone, is consciousness of the world, because it reveals the world as strange and paradoxical” (PP, xii). The reduction, as Merleau-Ponty conceives of it, disrupts our absorption in the world, thereby destroying its “ordinary character.” The Russian formalists claimed that the function of poetic language is to ‘defamiliarize’ language. It is in this sense that Merleau-Ponty wishes to retain a version of Husserls's notion of ‘reduction’. Writing on painting in the last published article in his lifetime, “Eye and Mind,” in The Primacy of Perception (Northwestern Univ. Press, 1964 ) Merleau-Ponty employs this conception of the reduction. He tells us that ‘the vision of the painter’ shows us what “profane vision” overlooks (literally) in its rush to posit objects. The painter's vision draws our attention to the play of light and shadow through which the visible object becomes visible. For Merleau-Ponty, it is often the work of artists that performs something analogous to his notion of the reduction. In The Visible and the Invisible, it is the writing of Proust in Remembrance of Things Past that breaks through the familiarity of ordinary language, showing us the “little phrases” which form the substrate of ordinary speech. We will return to this point when we consider his theory of language.
In The Structure of Behavior, Merleau-Ponty criticized the idea that the reflex arc was a fundamental unit in the explanation of the behavior of the organism. In The Phenomenology of Perception, he claims that the idea of sensation plays an analogous role in both objectivist and intellectualist conceptions of perception. If atomic sensation, elsewhere he refers to them as “a wondering troupe of sensations,” is accepted as the basic given of perception, then in order to move from it to the perception of things, we need to employ either ‘the laws of association’, or a ‘theory of attention or of judgment’, in order to give those sensations a unity. Such an initial starting point is by no means given to us by experience, since there is no experience of a lone sensation. Rather this view is imposed on us by the assumption that the body is a mechanical system, affected by the “external” world of which it is a part. Merleau-Ponty contests the idea that perception is a process by which the “external world” is somehow imprinted on the subject. According to him, perception is a behavior effected not by consciousness but by the body, but not by the body as a piece of the physical world, rather by the body as lived, a living body. He refers us to both the experience of our body considered in relationship to scientific knowledge, that is, the objective body, and the “other knowledge which we have of it, in virtue of its always being with us. And of the fact that we are our body” (PP, 206). For this “other knowledge,” the world is not a spectacle with the body as an observer; rather the world is given as a system of possibilities, not as an “I think” but as an “I can.” The reduction, according to Husserl, returns us to the subject. Whereas Merleau-Ponty tells us that the most important lesson of the phenomenological reduction is that a complete reduction is impossible. Why? Because that “subject” to whom we are returned is not a transcendental subject, but a subject that emerges from nature. Rudolf Bernet writes (1993), “Nature is something at the heart of human existence that does not properly belong to the human subject: a ground (Grund) of its constituting capacities, that is at the same time, a non-ground (Abgrund), a capacity that evades constituting reason.” Bernet contrasts Husserl’s thought with that of Merleau-Ponty showing that, for the former, there is a reduction of natural life, whereas, for the latter, there is a reduction to natural life.
At the end of the chapter on “The Spatiality of One's Own Body and Motility,” Merleau-Ponty writes, “Bodily experience forces us to acknowledge an imposition of meaning, which is not the work of a universal-constituting consciousness, a meaning which clings to certain contents. My body is the meaningful core which behaves like a general function, and which, nevertheless, exists and is susceptible to disease” (PP, 46). It is through an experience of the “phantom limb” that Merleau-Ponty explores one of the non-personal or pre-personal dimensions of our existence. After an amputation, the patient continues to experience her missing limb as if it were still present as it was before it was cut away. Merleau-Ponty provides a critique of both the intellectualist and empiricist attempts to explain this phenomenon. We do not have space here to give a lengthly account of his critique, but drawing on empirical research he tells us that the patient experiences the absent limb, for example, a hand, as a correlate of those aspects of the world which “speak to” the hand, namely, the piano to be played, the doorknob to be opened, and so forth. When the patient restructures his/ her world in such a manner that the things no longer beckon to the lost limb, then the experience of it vanishes. But if the doorknob “given as to be turned” is a correlate of my hand's capacity to turn it, then how is it possible that it continues to be perceived as ‘to be turned’, even when his/her hand is no longer there? Merleau-Ponty tells us that we must make a distinction between the body as it is at a given moment, and the body that he calls an “habitual body.” On the basis of past experience, I have learned that doorknobs are to be turned. This ‘knowledge’ has sedimentated into my habitual body. While learning to play the piano, or to dance, I am intensely focused on what I am doing, and subsequently, this ability to play or to dance sedimentates into an habitual disposition.
According to Merleau-Ponty, this dimension of the non-personal goes much deeper, inasmuch as I do not learn to stand upright, or to perceive, in the same way that I learn to play the piano. He tells us that I should not say I (je) perceive, but rather that one (on) perceives through me.
Every perception takes place in an atmosphere of generality, and is presented to us anonymously. I cannot say ‘I see the blue of the sky’ in the sense in which I say I understood a book, or that I have decided to devote my life to mathematics … . Every time I experience a sensation, I feel that it concerns not my own being, the one for which I am responsible, and for which I make decisions, but another self, which has already sided with the world, which is already open to certain of its aspects, and synchronized with them. Between my sensation and myself there stands always the thickness of some primordial acquisition which prevents my experience from being clear to itself (PP, 215–216).
In perception I discover a sense which I did not constitute.
It is this dimension of the Phenomenology of Perception that is prolonged and deepened in Merleau-Ponty's later work. The extent of continuity or discontinuity between the Phenomenology of Perception and The Visible and the Invisible is extensively contested in the critical literature on his thought. I will not pursue these debates here, except to say that there is sufficient ambiguity in the Phenomenology of Perception for some of the early interpreters of his work to speak about a “body subject,” as if Merleau-Ponty had attributed to the “lived body,” the corp propre (a genuinely unfortunate choice of phrase) the attributes that classical philosophy gives to the subject. According to this reading, the body is conceived of as the vehicle for a constituting subject; this reading, I would say mis-reading, also permits people to imagine that Merleau-Ponty and Jean-Paul Sartre, their personal and political relationships notwithstanding, were close philosophically. According to the interpretation that we are pursuing here, the progression is from the idea of the Gestalt, to the body as the impersonal agent of perception, that is, the one (on) who perceives through me, to the notion of the “flesh of the world,” that for which there is no name in the tradition of philosophy.
Before tracing this development in more detail, we must consider Merleau-Ponty's conception of Language. In The Structure of Behavior we have seen that the human order is characterized by its ability to disengage itself from a concrete situation. This is a movement toward language, but the theme of language as such is not developed in this work. It is in the chapter entitled “The Body as Expression and Speech” in the Phenomenology of Perception that he begins his critique of both the empiricist and the intellectualist conceptions of language. This critique is organized by Merleau-Ponty's insisting that “the word has a meaning” (PP, 177). Whereas for a consistent behaviorist, words are a response caused by a stimulus and, therefore, they have causes but they do not have meanings. In this respect, Merleau-Ponty claims that for the behaviorist, a man speaks as a lightbulb becomes incandescent, that is, without having any idea of why. On the other hand, he criticizes the intellectualist conception of language, according to which language is an envelope of thought. It is something that is added on to thought in order to make my inner ideas communicable to others; this communicability is accomplished by my adopting a certain linguistic convention. In this conception of language, there is indeed a subject and meaning, however, it is a ‘thinking subject’ and not a ‘speaking subject’. In the thought of Merleau-Ponty, speech does not simply transmit thought, rather it accomplishes, or completes, it. Nonetheless, he does not identify thought and language. He evokes those experiences in which we “cannot quite find the word” as also instances in which the thought itself remains incomplete. A very multilingual friend who uses four languages in the course of an ordinary day--one with her husband, another with her child, another in the street and yet another at work--told me that there are times when upon waking she cannot quite identify the toaster, that is, until she has first situated herself in one linguistic universe.
Merleau-Ponty argues that it is not adequate to say that speech indicates thought “as smoke betrays fire” (PP, 182) since this would be the case only if both thought and word were given as external to one another. In fact, he claims that thought and word are intertwined. Speech is not the clothing of thought, rather it is its body. Let us note in passing that Merleau-Ponty opposed himself to Husserl's separation of “expression and indication,” long before Derrida did so in his Speech and Phenomena. Merleau-Ponty elaborates a gestural theory of language. According to him, when I speak, “I reach back for the word, as my hand reaches toward a part of my body which is being pricked; the word has a certain location in my linguistic world and is a part of my equipment” (PP, 180). To speak is to make a gesture in one direction of my linguistic world. Immediately a difficulty emerges. It is clear that I can gesture, or point, to a tree in the visual world, a world which is shared intersubjectively. However, there is not only one given linguistic world. Nevertheless, Merleau-Ponty argues that there is a shared linguistic world, one that is the product of a sedimentation; it is the sedimentation of an intersubjective practice. This shared linguistic world exists not as the natural world, but rather as what Hegel refers to as “objective spirit.” It is an institution at the interior of which one can, indeed, gesture in the direction of a word and be understood. Merleau-Ponty insists that when I understand another's speech, I do not somehow reproduce, in my own mind, his mental processes. Nevertheless, if there is an institution, then it must institutionalize something. He writes: “Our view of man will remain superficial so long as we fail to go back to that origin, so long as we fail to find, beneath the chatter of words, the primordial silence, and so long as we do not describe the action which breaks the silence. The spoken word is a gesture, and its meaning the world” (PP, 184).
When I am speaking, I avail myself of already constituted meanings. We must ask from where do these meanings come? Here Merleau-Ponty makes the distinction between a spoken language and a speaking language. The spoken language is the sedimentated world of acquired linguistic meanings that I have at my disposal. Whereas the speaking language is the expressive gesture which engenders language. He is not, however, proposing an onomatopoeic conception of the origin of language. The “original” speech does not sound like what it signifies; rather it expresses the emotional essence of our encounter with the world. We speak as we sing when we are happy. To speak is to sing the world in a melody of words. Merleau-Ponty does not accept the position that the relationship between the word and what it signifies is arbitrary; he views this relationship as being “motivated.”
But if this is the case, then how does he account for the diversity of languages? He argues that because different cultures experience the world differently, the differences of language correspond to their different emotional experiences of the world. “It is no more natural and no less conventional to shout in anger, to kiss in love, than to call a table a table” (PP, 189). His thought does not argue for a natural level of behavior upon which is superimposed an artificial, or cultural, convention. As The Structure of Behavior has shown us, the “lower” and the “higher” are not simply juxtaposed. There is, rather, a relationship of dialectical sublation between them, in such a way that everything in man is both natural and conventional, “through a genius for ambiguity, which might serve to define man” (PP, 189). The speaking language, so important for poetry, sedimentates into a spoken language; this spoken language, having lost track of its origin in an expressive experience, can give rise to the illusion that language is a purely conventional system which externalizes our “inner thoughts.” We might remark in passing that the tone of Merleau-Ponty's discussion of the “spoken language” differs sharply from the discussion of “inauthentic language” (Gerede) in Heidegger's Being and Time, where it has a distinctly negative tone, a superficiality, a flittering from one thing to the next, and so forth. For Merleau-Ponty it is simply the acquired system of meaning, without which no culture could exist. In general, when Merleau-Ponty discusses the anonymous ‘subject’ of perception, the one (on) which would translate the German Man, there is no sense of fallenness or inauthenticity. Rather it signifies either the perceiver's attachment to nature, or the speaker's (no matter how innovative the discourse) attachment to a cultural tradition. In some sense, even James Joyce does write in the English language. There is no pathos connected to Merleau-Ponty's discussion of anonymity.
An important event which takes place between the publication of the Phenomenology of Perception and the beginning of The Visible and the Invisible is Merleau-Ponty's encounter with the linguistics of Ferdinand de Saussure. Merleau-Ponty was one of the first to see the philosophical implications of Saussure's Course in General Linguistics. The accuracy of his interpretation of Saussure is problematic, to say the least, but that is not our concern here. As analytic philosophers would claim, let us say that he gives it “a strong misreading.” For our purposes here, we are concerned with the impact of his encounter with Saussure on his philosophy. So let us turn our attention to Merleau-Ponty's transformation of two fundamental Saussurian ideas: the diacritical structure of language; the arbitrary relationship between signifier and signified. In Saussure's theory, the notion of a diacritical structure of language-- language as a system of differences without positive terms--is strictly correlative with the notion that the signifier and the signified are arbitrarily connected. According to him, these two notions are inextricably linked. He argues that if there is no motivation, then there is no natural affinity between the English word ‘chair’ and the concept ‘chair’. If there is no reason to say “chair” rather than “la chaise” or “der Stuhl,” then the relationship between the level of the signifier, the word (the sound image) “chair,” and the level of the signified, the concept ‘chair’, is arbitrary.
The sound image (signifier) and the concept (signified) must be what they are, not in reference to ‘the piece of furniture that one sits on’, but in reference to other signifiers and signifieds within the same language. If there were a motivated relationship between the word and the concept, then one word would be more or less adequate; this is, in fact, not the case since there are many different languages. Lacking any motivated relationship, the identity of both word and concept must be thought of in terms of other words and other concepts within the same phonetic and conceptual system. The identity of the signifier and the signified exists on the level of a set of differentiations within the same media. Different pronunciations of the word “chair” remain pronunciations of the same word, so long as none of the differences are marked as ‘significant within the system’ of the English language. In like manner, the signified chair is constituted in terms of its difference from bench, stool, throne and so forth. According to Saussure, the differential structure of language is a consequence of its purely conventional character. Merleau-Ponty endorses the notion of the diacritical structure of language, thereby accepting and incorporating one of the Saussurian ideas but not the other. In the Prose of the World he argues that the primordial level of language must be approached by defining signs, as Saussure does, not as the representations of certain significations, but as the means of differentiation in the verbal chain and of “opposite, relative and negative entities in speech.” He writes, “A language is less a sum of signs (words, grammatical and syntactical forms) than a methodological means of differentiating signs from one another, and thereby constituting a linguistic universe of which we later say--once it is precise enough to crystallize significant intentions, and to have it reborn in another-- that it expresses a world of thought…” (PW, 31).
At this point we must insist that Merleau-Ponty's concern with language is fundamentally different from that of Saussure. According to Saussure, the notion of a diacritical structure of language and, consequently, the synchronic (as distinct from the diachronic) study of language have as their aim the reformulation of the science of linguistics. His wish is to transform the object domain of linguistics. As a practitioner of the human sciences, he is concerned with language as an object of study; therefore, he does not pose the question of the ontological value of language, language as the place of truth. Early in The Visible and the Invisible (VI, 31) Merleau-Ponty writes in a particularly non-Saussurian vein, “Yet, there is a world of silence, the perceived world. There is an order where there are non-linguistic significations, yes non-linguistic significations, but they are not, accordingly, positive” And further on he writes, “This silence will not be the contrary of language” (VI, 171). Thus we see that Merleau-Ponty does not accept the purely arbitrary relation of language and the world, nevertheless, his study of Saussure disabuses him of the idea that it might be possible, if only in principle, to derive language directly from an expressive experience, a notion he entertained in the Phenomenology of Perception. After his work with the thought of Saussure, he tells us that we are “always already” within language, that it is not we who have language, but rather it is language that has us. Against Saussure and closer to Heidegger, he shows us that there is an ontological dimension of language. We are always already in Being. Being which differs from itself and exists by a “divergence from itself.”
Before considering the ontology of The Visible and the Invisible, I propose that we cast a glance at the evolution of Merleau-Ponty's political philosophy. In the wake of World War II and the Occupation, he, like many intellectuals at that time, was extremely attached to marxism. The aspect of marxists texts which fascinated him was the conception of the proletariat as a universal class, a notion taken from Hegel and transformed by Marx, especially by the young Marx. The quasi-scholastic readings of Marxists texts that abounded at this time held no fascination for Merleau-Ponty. His Marxism involved a historical commitment. For him the historical incarnation of Marxism was the October Revolution; his 1947 Humanism and Terror (HT) is the work of a philosopher judging a revolution. In some respects, it is reminiscent of Kant's reflection on the French Revolution. While Kant condemned the revolution, arguing that the execution of the king is a crime for which there is no forgiveness either in this world or the next, he notes that the enthusiasm for a republican form of government, along with ‘the recognition of man by man’ that the revolution elicits, is a sign of human progress. Nonetheless, it is not a proof of progress because teleological judgments are reflective judgments not determinate ones. To the question “why must we choose to view human history as if it were moving in the direction of progress?” Kant responds, in Perpetual Peace and Other Essays (PPOE), that otherwise the sight of human history would become unbearable. In “On the Old Proverb: This may be True in Theory but is of no Practical Use,” he writes, “...in the long run it [human history] becomes a farce. If the actors do not become weary of it, since they are fools, then the spectator will when, after one or another act, he has sufficient grounds for assuming that the never-ending pace will be eternally the same” (PPOE, 68). This is to say that the spectator will conclude that human history is “a tale told by an idiot, full of sound and fury, signifying nothing.”
Given the tenor of the times, Merleau-Ponty looked unflinchingly, at least relatively unflinchingly, at the level of violence in the USSR, for example, the forced labor, the Moscow trials, the mass executions and so forth. His question was the following: “Can we still see signs of proletarian universalism, of a violence which is self-liquidating, a humanist assumption of responsibility for violence in the acts of the revolutionaries?” His response was “no”, at least not at the moment. To the question: “Should we reject Marxism and search for an alternative theory?” here again the answer was “no”. His reason for this response is strikingly similar to that of Kant, but for Merleau-Ponty, unlike for Kant, there is no “noumenal course of history, ” no Providential ordering of history. Rather there is the Marxist conception of history as fueled by class conflict and finalized toward a classless society. (Whether or not this is, in fact, a secularization of Providence is another story) It was Merleau-Ponty's contention in Humanism and Terror that if one rejected Marxism, then one would reject all meaning in history; it would be to view history as the repetitive, meaningless farce that Kant referred to. He writes:
The decline of proletarian humanism is not a crucial experience which invalidates the whole of Marxism. It is still valid as a critique of the present world and alternative humanisms. In this respect, at least, it cannot be surpassed. Even if it is incapable of shaping world history, it remains powerful enough to discredit other solutions. On close consideration, Marxism is not just any hypothesis that might be replaced tomorrow by some other. It is the simple statement of those conditions without which there would be neither any humanism, in the sense of a mutual relation between men, nor any rationality in history. In this sense Marxism is not a philosophy of history; it is the philosophy of history and to denounce it is to dig the grave of Reason in history. After that there can be no more dreams or adventures. (HT, 153)
At this time he characterized his attitude as a “Marxism wait-and-see” and, in fact, withdrew from political writing. However, this did not remain his position for long. It is the Korean War that was, for him, the moment of truth whereby the USSR revealed itself as an aggressive imperialist power. As he elaborated in “Sartre Ultra-Boshevik” published in the Adventures of the Dialectic (AD), it was also the occasion for his political and personal break with Jean-Paul Sartre. We are not able to pursue this matter here.
After re-elaborating his theory of meaning, Merleau-Ponty breaks with his erstwhile ‘either/or position’ of either total meaning in history or no meaning at all. Through his reading of Saussure and, perhaps, especially his discovery of Max Weber's conception of selective affinity, he arrived at a finite theory of historical meaning. He writes:
There is thus a religious efficacy and an economic efficacy.Weber describes them as interwoven, exchanging positions so that one, now the other, plays the role of tutor. The effect turns back on its cause, carrying and transforming it in its turn. Furthermore, Weber does not simply integrate spiritual motives and material causes; he renews the concept of historical matter itself. An economic system is, as he says, a cosmos, a human choice become a situation; and that is what allows it to rise from worldly asceticism to religious motives, as well as to descend toward its capitalistic decay: everything is woven into the same fabric. History has meaning, but there is no pure development of ideas. Its meaning arises in contact with contingency, at the moment when initiative founds a system of life taking up anew scattered givens. And historical understanding which reveals an interior to history still leaves us in the presence of empirical history, with its density and its haphazardness, and does not subordinate it to any hidden reason. Such is the philosophy without dogmatism which one discerns all through Weber's studies. (AD., p. 16).
Between the evolution of Merleau-Ponty's philosophy of language and his political philosophy, there is a certain parallel. We have seen that speaking speech put him in touch with the ‘origin of language’, and that the conception of the proletariat as the universal class, strongly influenced by Lukacs, put him at the ‘origin of the political’. But his later work on language shows us that we are ‘always already’ in language. In a similar vein, in his later political thought, especially the Epilogue to The Adventures of the Dialectic, he defends parliamentary democracy, an institution of democracy which makes possible the space for legitimate opposition and self-criticism. On the philosophical level, totalization legitimates dogmatism; on the political level, it legitimates violence.
Let us now return to our discussion of Merleau-Ponty's ontology. The guiding thread that we had been following was his critique of transcendental philosophy, particularly the notion of subjectivity that is implied in this philosophical project. In The Visible and the Invisible this critique is deepen and further developed. One could argue that, historically, the project of transcendental philosophy begins as a refutation of skepticism. By taking this stance, we begin by putting ourselves on the side of the negative. Like Stanley Cavell, Merleau-Ponty sees that the skeptic radically transforms the ordinary meaning of the question, “Do I know that?” Extending this question to everything changes its meaning. Merleau-Ponty claims that philosophy elects certain beings' “sensations, representations, thoughts, consciousness, or even a deceiving being--in order to separate itself from all being” (VI, 107). He argues that the radical skeptic borrows something from our experience, absolutizes it, then in his quest for complete certainty, he uses it to terrorize our experience of ‘inherence in the world’, an experience that Merleau-Ponty, in The Visible and the Invisible, calls “perceptual faith.” Those who would begin philosophy by attempting to refute skepticism must also agree with the skeptic's rejection of our inherence in Being; they do so in the name of establishing absolute evidence which would deliver us from our contingent insertion into Being. Merleau-Ponty sees this ‘desire to be delivered from contingency’ operative in critical philosophy's effort to “undo our natural pact with the world in order to remake it.” Its attempt to follow backward the path taken by the ‘subject who has constituted the object’ in order to arrive at the unity of subjectivity. It does so in a manner similar to the way one could walk indifferently in either direction from Notre Dame to the Etoile, or from the Etoile to Notre Dame.
It is Merleau-Ponty's contention that it is not possible to achieve this return to subjectivity. Reflection is always secondary, that is, it must recognize itself as founded on a pre-reflective experience of Being that cannot be assimilated, employing the felicitous phrase of Adorno, “without remainder.” This reflection which must always be mindful of its own situated character is what Merleau-Ponty names “hyper-reflection.” This sort of reflection is expressed in an excellent manner by a line of Kafka, cited by Lefort in his Preface to The Visible and the Invisible, “that things present themselves to him not by their roots, but by some point or another situated towards the middle of them” (VI, xvvi). Merleau-Ponty evokes our ineluctable inherence in Being as evidence that Husserl's project of free variation, while being useful, was not able to accomplish what Husserl desired of it. Free variation was Husserl's way to move from the register of ‘fact’ to that of ‘essence’. One begins with a real factual experience, then by means of free variation one transforms it in imagination up to the point where it is no longer an object of the same type. At this point, Husserl claims that we intuit its essential structure.
Merleau-Ponty agrees that we can vary our experience in imagination, that we can move from the real to the virtual, that is, we can give ourselves leeway. However, we cannot “complete” the circuit by which the real would become simply a variant of the possible. He writes, “On the contrary, it is the possible worlds and possible things that are variants and doubles of the actual world and of actual beings” (VI, 112). It is the ineluctability of our inherence in the world that forecloses both the attempt to move from the fact to the essential structure and the project of completing the phenomenological reduction.
In the last chapter of the never completed The Visible and the Invisible entitled “The Intertwining–the Chiasm,” Merleau-Ponty begins to give a positive elaboration of the ontological position to which he has been led. In a number of respects, his last work distances itself from certain central notions in the phenomenological tradition. Nonetheless, in one respect it is mindful of Husserl's injunction, “Return to the things themselves.” Merleau-Ponty wishes to begin in a dimension of experience which has not been “worked over, that offers us, all at once, pell-mell, both subject and object--both existence and essence--and, hence, gives philosophy resources to redefine them” (VI, 130). When Merleau-Ponty speaks of “perceptual faith” his notion of faith is perhaps the very opposite of the agonized Kierkegaardian “leap of faith.” It is a faith the commitment of which has ‘always already’ been made, a faith which subtends the avowal of responsibility by which personal identity is formed. Perceptual faith is a faith that I am in no danger of losing, except in the philosophical interpretation of it which portrays it as knowledge. This chapter on what Merleau-Ponty calls the Chiasm is a continuation of his study of perception, however, at first viewing it may not appear as such. In the Phenomenology of Perception, he insisted upon making a distinction between operative intentionality and act intentionality, but in The Visible and the Invisible this distinction is deepened in such a way that the concept of intentionality itself is thrown into question. In his critical reflections on Sartre, which due to spatial constraints we have not been able to develop here, Merleau-Ponty said that for a subject defined as For-itself, as consciousness of itself, passivity could have no meaning. He argues that, defined as such, consciousness could not but be sovereign.
In his late thought, Merleau-Ponty poses the question whether a consciousness, defined as intentional, is adequate to think a notion of perception viewed as the self-revelation of the sense of a world in and through a being which is itself a part of the world, flesh of its flesh, a world which “... is much more than the correlative of my vision, such that it imposes my vision upon me as a continuation of its own sovereign existence” (VI, 131). For him, to see is not to pose a thing as the object pole, much less a noema (Husserl), of my act of seeing. Rather seeing is being drawn into a dimension of Being, a tissue of sensible being to which the perceiving body is not foreign. Merleau-Ponty speaks of the perception of the color ‘red’ as not merely the awareness of a quality belonging to an object. He claims that for an experience ‘prior to being worked over’, it is an encounter with “a punctuation in the field of red things, which includes the tiles of rooftops; the flags of gatekeepers and of the revolution; of certain terrains near Aix or Madagascar. It is also a punctuation in the field of red garments, which includes, along with the dresses of women, the robes of professors, bishops and advocates general...and its red is literally not the same if it appears in one constellation or in another … . A certain red is also a fossil, drawn up from the depths of imaginary worlds” (VI, 132). When seeing, I do not hold an object at the terminus of my gaze, rather I am delivered over to a field of the sensible which is structured in terms of the “difference between things and colors, a momentary crystallization of colored being or visibility” (VI, 132).
When we turn in the direction of the seer, we do not discover a transcendental ego but a being who is itself of the sensible, a being which “knows it before knowing it”(VI, 133). The sensate body possesses “an art of interrogating the sensible according to its own wishes, an inspired exegesis” (VI, 135). If I wish to feel the cloth of a coat that I am about to purchase, it will not suffice if I pound it with my fists or quickly wisk my hand over it. Rather it must be touched as it wishes to be touched and for this my body needs no instruction. Like the cloth, my hand is a part of the tangible world; between it and the rest of the tangible world there exists a “relationship by principle” (VI, 133). My hand which touches the things is itself subject to being touched. “Through this crisscrossing within it of the touching and the tangible, its own movements incorporate themselves in the universe that they interrogate, are recorded on the same map as it” (VI, 133).
Merleau-Ponty writes, “it is not different for vision.” He argues that it is essential that the seer itself must be visible, that is, seeable; he refers to the body as an “exemplar sensible” being both sensate and sensible. As in the case with touching, there is a pre-possession of the vision by the visible, and vice versa. The body, being itself visible, uses its being to participate in the being of the visible world. Rather than speaking of the act of seeing, one ought to speak of a “visibility, sometimes wondering, sometimes reassembled” (VI, 138). What Merleau-Ponty calls “flesh” is the generality of the sensible, “an anonymity innate to myself” (VI, 133). We see that there is a progression of Merleau-Ponty's ontology which moves from the notion of Gestalt in The Structure of Behavior, to the notion of ‘the one’ (the on) that is the ‘subject’of perception in the Phenomenology of Perception, then to the notion of the Flesh in The Visible and the Invisible. The flesh is neither some sort of ethereal matter nor is it a life force that runs through everything. Rather it is a notion which is formed in order to express the intertwining of the sensate and the sensible, their intertwining and their reversibility. It is this notion of reversibility that most directly problemetizes the concept of intentionality, since rather than having the model of act and object, one has the image of a fold, and of the body as the place of this fold by which the sensible reveals itself.
We see that this notion of intertwining does not only concern the relationship between the sensible and the sensate, between the body and the world. It also orchestrates the relationship between the visible and the invisible. As Merleau-Ponty undercuts, or if one prefers deconstructs, the opposition between subject and object, he also wishes to do the same for the opposition between the visible and the invisible, the sensible and the ideal. We have seen this project already operating in The Structure of Behavior, where he viewed the human order, which is to say the order of symbolic behavior, as a sublation of both physical and vital structures. Also in The Visible and the Invisible he searchs for an “infrastructure” of thought in the body. This infrastructure is located in the body's non-coincidence with itself. In his reflection on the touching-touched , he has shown that my hand, my eye, my voice is both touching, seeing and speaking, and at the same time tangible, visible and audible. However, between these two dimensions there is a non-coincidence; I never, at the same instance, experience my hand as touching and as touched. He writes, “Either my right hand really passes over to the rank of the touched, but then its hold on the world is interrupted, or it retains its hold on the world, but then I do not really touch it” (VI, 148).
There is a divergence (écart) which short-circuits the body's immanence with itself and creates an internal fissure in the visible, thereby generating differentiation rather than identity. There is, Merleau-Ponty says, a sort of reflection that the body effects on itself. Six pages before this incompleted text breaks off, he tells us that we have reached the “most difficult point,” that is, “the bond between flesh and idea, and the internal armature which [it] manifests and which it conceals” (VI, 149). The invisible, the idea, is not the contrary of the visible, it is the invisible of the visible. Merleau-Ponty evokes Proust's notion of the “little phrase” in the musical piece, which in Remembrance of Things Past signify Swann's love for Odette, as an instance of a meaning that cannot be extracted from its sensible incarnation but which, nonethelesss, is itself not strictly speaking sensible. Permit me to use another example. Harry Matthews, in my opinion a very important American writer, when he finished his undergraduate studies at Harvard University went to live in Paris where he has lived for the past 40 years or so. He is obviously completely fluent in French, but he writes in English. At a public lecture, someone asked if he ever thought of writing in French. His answer was a definite “no” because he said that to write in French, as he does in English, it would have been necessary to have attended high school in France. In the context, it was clear that he did not mean that there were certain expressions that French school children use that he does not know. Rather he meant that he did not have a sense of the sensible infrastructure which underlies forms of popular speech, like Proust's ‘little phrases’ which cannot be abstracted from their context. As Merleau-Ponty claims that there is “an ideality that is not alien to the flesh, that gives it its axis, its depth, its dimensions.”
There are meanings that can be abstracted from the sensible body but not from “another, less heavy, more transparent, body, as though it were to change flesh, abandoning the flesh of the body for that of language, and thereby [they] would be emancipated, but not freed, from every condition” (VI, 153). Language is a more diaphanous body, but body nonetheless, which is capable of sedimentation, of forming a world which, in Hannah Arendt's phrase, houses the speaker. The notion of “the invisible of the visible” continues the theme of a logos of the perceived world that we discovered in the Phenomenology of Perception, along with the theme of silence significance (pre-linguistic meaning), a silence which is not the contrary of language. In 1961 Merleau-Ponty's own voice fell silent. But insofar as it provokes speech, it was a silence which was not the contrary of language.
If we think how the thought of Merleau-Ponty might prolong itself into the 21st century, or as it protends a future, then we cannot not be struck by the fact that his philosophy does not entertain any conception whatsoever of an ‘apocalyptic end of philosophy’ followed by the emergence of some essentially different mode of thought. Unlike Heidegger, there is no anticipation of an ‘other beginning’, also there is nothing like Derrida's ‘Theory’ which is waiting in the wings to displace philosophy, and unlike Wittgenstein, Merleau-Ponty's thought does not await the disappearence of philosophy. In the academic year 1958–1959, Merleau-Ponty gave a course at the Collège de France entitled “Our State of Non-Philosophy.” He began by saying that ‘for the moment’ philosophy is in a crisis, but he continued, “My thesis: this decadence is inessential; it is that of a certain type of philosopher…. Philosophy will find help in poetry, art, etc., in a closer relationship with them, it will be reborn and will re-interprete its own past of metaphysics—which is not past” (Notes de cours, 1959–60, p. 39, my translation). After writing this he turns to literature, painting, music, and psychoanalysis for philosophical inspiration.
The theme of the indeterminate frequently recurs in the thought of Merleau-Ponty. Philosophy is enrooted in the soil of our culture and its possibilities are not infinite, but neither are they exhausted. In an essay entitled “Everywhere and Nowhere, ” Merleau-Ponty explicitly reflects on the future of philosophy, he writes that philosophy “will never regain the conviction of holding the keys to nature or history in its concepts, and it will not renounce its radicalism, that search for presuppositions and foundations which has produced the great philosophies” (Signs, 157). In his Inaugural Address to the Collège de France, he claimed that “philosophy limps” and further on that “this limping of philosophy is its virtue” (In Praise of Philosophy, 61).
What will philosophy do in the 21st century? It will limp along.
Works by Merleau-Ponty
|[SB]||La Structure du Comportement, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1942.|
|[PP]||Phénoménologie de la Perception, Paris: Gallimard, 1945.|
|[HT]||Humanism et Terreur, Paris: Gallimard, 1947.|
|-||Causeries, 1948, Paris: Seuil, 2002|
|-||Sens et Non-Sens, Paris: Nagel, 1948.|
|[AD]||Les Aventures de la Dialectique, Paris: Gallimard, 1955.|
|-||Eloge de la Philosophie et autres essais, Paris: Gallimard, 1960.|
|-||Signes, Paris: Gallimard, 1960|
|-||L'Oeil et L'Esprit, Paris: Gallimard, 1964.|
|[VI]||Le Visible et L'Invisible, Paris: Gallimard, 1964.|
|-||Merleau-Ponty et la Sorbonne: Résumé de ses cours établi par les étudiants,|
|-||Bulletin de Psychologie, 18 (236): 3–6 (November 1964).|
|[PW]||La Prose du Monde, Paris: Gallimard, 1969.|
|-||Résumés de Cours: Collège de France 1952–1960, Paris: Gallimard, 1968.|
|-||La Nature: Notes Cours du Collège de France, 1956–1957, Seuil, 1995.|
|-||Notes de Cours 1959–1961, Paris: Gallimard, 1996.|
|-||Merleau-Ponty: Parcours 1935-1951, Verdier, 1997.|
|-||Merleau-Ponty: Notes de cours sur “L'Origine be la Geometrie de Husserl” suivi de Recherches sur la Phenomenologie de Merleau-Ponty, Presses Universitaires de France, 1998.|
|-||Résumés de Cours: La Sorbonne, 1949–1952, Paris: Cynara, 1998.|
|-||Merleau-Ponty: Parcours Deux, 1951-1961, Verdier, 2000.|
Translations into English
- The Structure of Behavior, A.L. Fisher (trans.), Boston: Beacon Press, 1963.
- Phenomenology of Perception, Colin Smith (trans.), New York: Humanities Press, 1962.
- Humanism and Terror, John O'Neill (trans.), Boston: Beacon Press, 1969.
- Adventures of the Dialectic, Joseph Bien (trans.), Evanston: Northwestern, University Press, 1973.
- In Praise of Philosophy, J. Wild & J.M. Edie (trans.), Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1963.
- Consciousness and the Acquisition of Language, Hugh Silverman (trans.), Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1973.
- The Primacy of Perception, J.M. Edie (ed.), Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1964.
- Signs, Richard McCleary (trans.), Evanston: Northwesteren University Press, 1964.
- Sense and Non-Sense, Hubert Dreyfus & Patricia Allen Dreyfus (trans.), Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1964.
- The Visible and the Invisible, Alphonso Lingis (trans.), Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1968
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