Notes to God and Other Necessary Beings

1. The sort of necessity referenced here and throughout is necessity of the metaphysical or broadly logical sort (see Plantinga 1974a).

2. Unless otherwise specified, the abstract objects referenced in this essay are of the sort that exist necessarily (as opposed to, say, sets with contingent members). The reader should note the assumption of the falsity of David Lewis' (1986) metaphysics of possible worlds.

3. See Leftow (1989) for helpful discussion of Leibniz on this matter.

4. See Plantinga (1982) for a contemporary rendering of this suggestion.

5. There is some possible nuance in the Cartesian position ignored here. In particular, it might be claimed not that what is “necessarily true” could have been false on Descartes' picture, but that what's necessarily true isn't necessarily necessarily true. See Plantinga (1980) for discussion of this. See also Conee (1991) for further discussion of a Cartesian conception of omnipotence.

6. See Plantinga (1980), Stump and Kretzmann (1985), Mann (1982), and Wolterstorff (1991). More recently, see Bergmann and Brower (2006). Bergmann and Brower themselves take the sorts of circularity worries raised later on in the present entry to tell in favor of divine simplicity.

7. See also Zagzebski (1990), Roy (unpublished), Yandell (1994), Mares (1997), Nolan (1997), Yagasawi (1988), and Davis (2006).

8. See Plantinga (1982) for a particularly clear statement of this view. See also Morris and Menzel (1986).

9. This is the sort of account that Thomas Morris and Christopher Menzel adopt, and they are the foremost contemporary proponents of the view that abstract objects depend on God. See Morris and Menzel (1986) and Menzel (1990).

10. See Morris and Menzel 1986, p. 358–360.

11. See Leftow 1990, Davidson 1999, and Bergmann and Brower (2006) for statements of this sort of objection.

12. This is Morris and Menzel's (1986) response to this objection.

13. Leftow (1990, pp. 201-203) sketches concerns for the theistic activist that there are problematically-circular dependence relationship between divine attributes and God's creating properties. He develops in more detail (pp. 202-205) an argument that God creates himself on a theistic activist picture.

Bergmann and Brower (2006) also give an argument that there is a problematic circularity that the theistic activist must embrace.

14. Or, we might make sense of the claim that a proposition depends on its constituents in the same sort of manner, if its constituents are properties, relations, and the like.

15. Necessarily, a property p is an individual essence iff (a) it is possible that p is exemplified; and (b) necessarily, if there is an x that exemplifies p, then (i) necessarily, if x exists, x exemplifies p and (ii) necessarily, if there is a y which exemplifies p, then x = y.

16. Though see Merricks (2007), Sider (2011), and Davidson (forthcoming) for further discussion of grounding.

Copyright © 2013 by
Matthew Davidson <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.