Feminist Perspectives on Trans Issues
The relationship between feminism and transgender theory and politics is surprisingly fraught. The goal in this entry is to outline some of the key philosophical issues at the intersections, and this can be accomplished only by attending to the history of feminist and trans politics as it has unfolded in the U.S. “Transgender” as a politics and “trans studies” as a twin of “queer studies” (Stryker 2004) emerged in the early 1990s and this emergence is intertwined with feminist as well as queer theory and politics. (These terms will be explained below.) Consequently, this entry will follow a roughly chronological order.
One major set of philosophical themes concerns competing conceptions of the self and its relation to the sexed body and to gender. (Biological sex is often distinguished from gender, taken as the cultural roles assigned on the basis of sex). Is the self prior to the institution of gender identity? Is sex the “hardware” on which the program of gender is run, or is sex itself thoroughly cultural? If the self is irrevocably immersed in cultural gender, how is resistance to gender oppression possible at all? Moreover, how should answers to these questions inform feminist politics and theory? How should they inform trans politics and theory?
A related set of themes concerns the political and philosophical difficulties in formulating a theory of gender oppression and strategies for resistance when multiple modalities of oppression are recognized: If trans people are oppressed as trans people and women are oppressed as women, then it would seem we need an account of at least two different modalities of gender oppression. Do these two different modalities lead to politics that are inevitably at odds with each other? And if so how could we then accommodate individuals who are oppressed as woman and as trans people? How is coalition among non trans feminists and trans activists possible? Where are the grounds of commonality? Where are the tensions?
- 1. Terminology
- 2. The Transsexual Phenomenon
- 3. The Transsexual Empire
- 4. The Empire Strikes Back
- 5. (Trans) Gender Trouble
- 6. Technology and the Production of Gender
- 7. Butch/FTM Border Wars and Border Zone Dwellers
- 8. Feminist Solidarity After Queer Theory
- 9. The Phenomenology of Trans Embodiment
- 10. Toward a Trans/Feminism
- 11. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Transgender is often used to refer to people who “do not conform to prevailing expectations about gender” by presenting and living genders that were not assigned to them at birth or by presenting and living genders in ways that may not be readily intelligible in terms of more traditional conceptions of gender. Used as an umbrella term, it generally aims to group several different kinds of people such as transsexuals, drag queens and kings, some butch lesbians, and (heterosexual) male cross dressers. Earlier the term transgenderist had been used by Virginia Prince, a pioneer in the cross dresser movement in the US, to stand for a person who lives in the gender “opposite” the one assigned to them at birth but who is not a transsexual (Stryker 2008, 123). It seems that Leslie Feinberg was one of the first to use this as a political, umbrella term (ibid).
The term currently flags the political stance, especially in the Anglo United States, of resisting medical pathologization of trans people. This places it in prima facie opposition to the older notion of transsexual (at least in the more traditional sense of that word). The term transgender is also sometimes used as an equivalent to transgenderist, to refer to folk who live full-time in the role other than the one assigned to them at birth but who do not see themselves as transsexual.
Transsexual is often used to refer to individuals who use hormonal and/or surgical technologies to alter their bodies to conform to their gendered sense of self in ways that may be construed as at odds with the sex assigned at birth or in ways that may not be readily intelligible in terms of traditional conceptions of sexed bodies. It may also be used to indicate people who self-identify and live as the sex “opposite” to the one assigned to them at birth. The condition of being a transsexual has been captured by the terms transsexualism and transsexuality, the latter of which will be used in this entry.
Traditionally, the term transsexual has been connected to psychiatric notions such as gender dysphoria and has also been associated with the metaphor “trapped in the wrong body.” The term was first used in English by David Caldwell (spelled with one s). It was then popularized by Harry Benjamin (spelled with two). Transsexual has now also been redeployed in ways amenable to and possibly subsumable under the more recent term transgender (depending, in part, upon one's political stance). It may also be used as a political term indicating a break from the term transgender and as possibly contesting the underlying political ideology of “the transgender movement.”
FTM and MTF are abbreviations of female-to-male and male-to-female. They were originally connected to transsexual (medical) discourse indicating individuals who transition to the “opposite” sex. They are now used in ways that have broken from this medical discourse and may be used more generally to indicate folk who move away from being assigned male (or female) at birth to the “other” direction. They may also be used as primitive (undefined) terms. This means that they are not treated as abbreviations indicating transition from one sex to another. Instead, they are used to simply categorize individuals in a way analogous to the categories man and woman.
Queer is a political and theoretical term and a reclamation of the word used as an insult. Politically it was associated with groups such as Queer Nation and is used as umbrella term to apply to individuals often associated with the categories lesbian, gay, bisexual, and transgender (LGBT). It generally indicates opposition to identity-based categories and signals a strong antipathy for “heteronormativity” (roughly: the taken-for-granted social and sexual arrangements in a heterosexual-centered world-view). Queer Theory roughly applies to theoretical work, typically informed by Foucault and Derrida, that aims to study and “deconstruct” heteronormative ideology. It emerged in the 1990s through thinkers such as Judith Butler and Eve Kosofsky Sedgwick. The term genderqueer draws on the political force of queer. It is used as a term of self-identification by individuals who do not subscribe to the traditional binary division between male/female, man/woman, and masculine/feminine. An individual who self-identifies may claim both sexes or genders, neither, or a complex blend of them.
Since around 2010, the term trans* has been used in place of transgender and trans in order to provide for more possibilities. One of the reasons for this is that many of the people who self-identify as trans (or as transgender) identify as men or women and therefore in one way place themselves within traditional binary categories. As a consequence, those who do not place themselves within the binary (e.g., genderqueer people) are effectively left out, despite the original intention behind transgender as an inclusive umbrella term. Since its introduction, unfortunately the term is also now frequently used as a prefix that occurs before woman or man (as in trans* man and trans* woman) in well-intentioned efforts at inclusivity. A problem, however, is that such a use may replicate the very problem that led to the introduction of trans* in the first place by generating the expectation that trans* people are either trans* men or trans* women and thereby eliding trans* identities that resist placement within a gender binary. Moreover, many trans people may not self-identify as trans* and so there is a problem of wrongfully imputing identities (and political agendas) that run contrary to self-identifications.
In this entry, trans will be used as a place-holder for the possibly productive political tensions discussed above (transsexual vs. transgender, trans* vs. transgender). Since many forms of transphobia involve categorizing individuals contrary to their own sense of self, caution is required in applying terms to individuals who may not self-identify with them. In light of this, the use of trans should not be understood to impute an identity or a shared political vision. Rather, it is a functional term restricted to this entry alone, and is not intended to invoke a shared category among diverse individuals The expressions trans women and trans men will be used to refer to MTFs and FTMs who self-identify as women and men respectively (where trans functions as a context-restricted placeholder for the aforementioned political tensions.
Until 2013, Gender Identity Disorder had been a diagnostic category in both the American Psychiatric Association's DSM-IV-TR (Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders) and the World Health Organization's ICD-10 (International Classification of Diseases and Related Health Problems). The newer DSM-V replaces the diagnostic category Gender Identity Disorder with Gender Dysphoria in an effort to lessen stigmatization. Nonetheless, trans experiences continue to be captured by diagnostic categories in manuals which provide criteria for mental disorders.
While homosexuality was removed from the DSM as a diagnostic category in 1973, transsexuality was added in the 1980 DSM-III. However, the view of transsexuality and other trans-related phenomena as psychiatric and/or medical conditions has a much longer history. To be sure, not all accounts of trans phenomena were pathologizing (indeed, some aimed at political liberation). However, it is clear that early scholarly discussion of trans phenomena unfolded within the field of sexology—the “scientific” study of human sexuality. Some of the most notable thinkers include Karl Heinrich Ulrichs, Richard von Krafft-Ebing ( 1965), Havelock Ellis ( 1942), and Magnus Hirshfeld ( 1991).
In the early first part of the twentieth century, European scientists began to experiment with “sex-change” (Meyerowitz 2002, 16–21). By 1953, media sensation Christine Jorgensen had become the first “celebrity” MTF transsexual in the United States and scientific controversy heated over whether transsexuality was a psychological or physical condition (Meyerowitz 2002). While the former position (then dominant in the U.S.) held that trans phenomena were purely psychological in nature and ought to be treated psychotherapeutically to “cure the mental illness”, the latter (European model) held a “bisexuality theory” which maintained that there was a physical blend of male and female in all human beings and that special cases yielded a “mixed-sex” condition which in some cases justified surgical intervention (Meyerowitz 2002, 98–129)
Work by John Money, Joan Hampson, and John Hampson on intersexuality (the state of having both female and male biological characteristics) led to the introduction of the technical term gender (1955). They purported to evade the debate between psychology and biology, arguing that while the capacity to learn a gender role and orientation (like a language) was biologically grounded, the specific native role and orientation learned (like language) was contingent upon social environment which became “locked down” at a very early age (1957). Subsequently, the expression gender identity was coined by Robert Stoller and Ralph Greenson in 1964, which helped terminologically separate the notion of social role from psychological sense-of-self. It was ultimately taken up by the likes of Money and Harry Benjamin (Meyerowitz 2002, 117–9), and while debate over etiology continued, views allowing for both biology and social environment in determining gender identity gained somewhat greater prominence (Meyerowitz 2002, 119). Notably, in these views, gender identity is a biological demand to the extent that the capacity for gender identity (as the capacity for language) is viewed as innate. Such a view would seem to suggest that gender, like language, is integral to the human self.
In 1966, Benjamin published the landmark The Transsexual Phenomenon and that same year saw the opening of the Johns Hopkins University program for sex-reassignment surgery, ushering in a period of large university-based gender-identity clinics which lasted until the end of the seventies. By the closing of Johns Hopkins in 1979, the Harry Benjamin International Gender Dysphoria Association (since renamed The World Health Professional Association for Transgender Health or WPATH) had been formed and had approved standardized criteria for the treatment of transsexuals. A year later, transsexualism was added to the DSM.
Notably, until the early nineties, the vehicle by which transsexuals wrote about their own experiences was largely autobiography. Some examples of these include Canary Conn's The Story of a Transsexual (1977), Mario Mario's Emergence: A Transsexual Autobiography (1977), and Jan Morris' Conundrum: An Extraordinary Narrative of Transsexualism (1986)
Many of the earliest non-trans feminist perspectives on transsexuals were marked by hostility. One of the first examples of non-trans feminist reactions to trans women was the expulsion of Beth Elliott from the Daughters of Bilitis and the subsequent controversy over her participation in 1973 in the West Coast Lesbian Conference in Los Angeles (Stryker 2008). At the conference, Robin Morgan charged Elliot, “as an opportunist, an infiltrator, and a destroyer—with the mentality of a rapist” (Morgan 1978, 181). This theme of “violation” can also be found in Mary Daly's Gyn/Ecology (1978, 71). It is more thoroughly elaborated in Janice Raymond's The Transsexual Empire: The Making of the She-Male (1979) where she writes :
All transsexuals rape women's bodies by reducing the real female form to an artifact, appropriating this body for themselves. However, the transsexually constructed lesbian-feminist violates women's sexuality and spirit, as well. Rape, although it is usually done by force, can also be accomplished by deception. (104)
The thesis that MTF transsexuals are rapists because they appropriate women's bodies to themselves or through deception is difficult to assess since no arguments seem to have been given in its defense. However it will be worth trying to push such extreme representations to the side in order to isolate the core assumptions which ground Raymond's position as well as to appreciate her feminist critique of transsexuality as a medical phenomenon.
Raymond's position is underwritten by a substrate view about sex according to which sex exists as a given prior to the machinations of culture; social sex roles are then assigned on the basis of sex. (Raymond does not usually use the term gender, preferring, instead, the expression sex role). Membership in the category woman is determined by chromosomes and the individual's history of experience being assigned to a sex role (1979, 4, 18, 114). In light of this, Raymond maintains that MTF transsexuals are really men and FTM transsexuals are really women. The last condition (history of experience) is important in noting that MTF transsexuals have avoided the history of damage done to women who have suffered a lifetime under sex-role oppression. It is worth recognizing, however, that while MTFs may have avoided this oppression before transitioning, many MTFs experience sexual harassment and discrimination in the workplace, the threat of all variations of rape, survival sex work, and domestic violence after transitioning. Moreover, some MTFs live as women from a very young age.
A second underlying assumption of Raymond’s position is that oppression experienced by transsexuals (and trans people more generally) is nothing but an aspect of the sexist oppression enforced through sex role (1979, xviii, 16). In other words, MTFs are really men who are victims of the violence done through the rigidly enforced sex-role system and FTMs are really women who, as such, are the central targets of this system. Gender dysphoria experienced by transsexuals, in such a view, is to be understood as unhappiness with the existing sex-role system. This means that Raymond does not recognize a distinct modality of oppression that specifically targets trans people in a way that is non-reducible to the sexist oppression inherent in sex roles. Raymond poses the rhetorical question “Does a Black person who wants to be white suffer from the ‘disease’ of being a ‘transracial?’” and then observes that “there is no demand for transracial medical intervention precisely because most Blacks recognize that it is their society, not their skin, that needs changing” [Raymond 1994, xvi]. What is lacking in such an account is the possibility that transsexuals might be oppressed as transsexuals.
On the basis of these two theses, Raymond is led to see the medicalization of gender variance and the gender identity clinics as nothing but vehicles to further secure sexist sex roles. Thus, for her, a sexist society is “the first cause” of transsexuality (1979, 16). The role of the medical treatment of transsexuality is to turn men into “women” and women into “men” when they cannot be normed into their natally assigned sex roles. For Raymond, the phrase transsexual empire applies to the patriarchal medical establishment which perpetuates sex-role oppression through surgical intervention. (She uses the word empire to refer to “a political unit having a territory of great extent, or a number of territories under a single sovereign authority” (xv). She sees the medical “empire” as including numerous specialties such as urology, gynecology, endocrinology, and so forth. She also sees the collaboration of psychology and psychiatry in hiding what she calls the sovereignty of the medical “empire” by making it appear that there is some need for transsexual medical intervention, as well as the involvement of lawyers and legislators. However, it is the medical establishment, for Raymond, which possesses this sovereignty. So it is the medical establishment which is the unifying authority of the “transsexual empire” (ibid.)).
Now Raymond is right that the medicalization of transsexuality involved the perpetuation of sexist (and heterosexist) norms. Yet the actual struggle of some scientists and surgeons to make surgeries available to transsexuals is ignored in Raymond's account (Riddell 2006). Such advocates for transsexual surgery were in the minority (certainly in the U.S) and themselves experienced hostility and marginalization. This means that what Raymond calls the transsexual empire was not monolithic. And given the marginalization of these advocates for transsexual surgery, it seems that the medical establishment was not especially friendly to transsexuality (Riddell 2006). Generally transsexuality was and remains largely unaccepted in society. Contrary to Raymond's view, it is largely not endorsed by “the patriarchy.”
Raymond's contrast between integration and integrity brings out a core aspect of her picture of liberation. Integration, for Raymond, involves putting together parts to form a complex whole (1979, 163). She sees androgyny as a kind of blend between masculine and feminine and she argues that transsexual surgery also brings about such blends (constructing the individual into a kind of hermaphroditic being) (1979, 165). By contrast, integrity involves a prior wholeness from which no part can be taken away (193). For Raymond, true liberation cannot be secured by any mere blending of sex roles. Rather, it must be secured through a transcendence of sex role altogether (164). This suggests a notion of the self that is prior to sex role or at least a notion of a self that can be freed from the cultural interpretations of sex. Raymond's solution to “the problem” of transsexuality which she sees as promoting the surgical violation of bodily integrity, is to “morally mandate it out of existence” (178) by working against sex role oppression through education and consciousness raising (178–185).
Raymond's representation of transsexuals themselves warrants particular comment. Beyond the two key assumptions mentioned above, Raymond adopts a stance for which transsexual subjectivities are erased. This means that she constructs monolithic, stereotypical representations of trans individuals (based on her own ideology) in ways that foreclose the possibility of registering the actual variable experiences of trans people (on this point see Riddell 2006, 152–3, Stone 1991, 298, Heyes 2003, 1095). She points to ways in which (some) MTFs take up traditional sex roles (and are thereby complicit) on the one hand (77–79), and yet goes on to criticize lesbian-separatist identified MTFs who have eschewed such roles as oppressively masculine (102–6). In this way, she traps MTF transsexuals with a double-bind: Either MTFs take up traditional sex roles and are thereby sexist or else they eschew these traditional sex roles and are thereby sexist (See Califia 1997, 102, 104–5; Serano 2007, 49). Such a theory isn't equipped to accommodate the actual variable experiences of MTFs trying to negotiate gender in a sexist and transphobic world. In this way, Raymond's theory erases the actual experiences of MTFs through monolithic, ideologically-driven representations of them. Moreover because Raymond sees transsexuality as essentially a male phenomenon, her discussion of FTMs is minimal. She argues that FTMs are mere tokens who are used to prop up claims that transsexuality is a universal phenomenon and thereby hide its true patriarchal character. In this way, FTM transsexuality is largely dropped out of the picture (xxiii, 27–28, 140; for further critique see Califia 1997, 100–1, Serano 2007, 48). This allows her to avoid discussing FTM transsexuals in any depth at all. And this means that the complex, variable, everyday experiences of FTMs do not get represented in the first place. Consider, for example, Raymond's claim “All transsexuals rape women's bodies by reducing the real female form to an artifact, appropriating this body for themselves.” While the statement purports to be universal, it is also a claim specifically about MTF transsexuals. In Raymond's account, there is no room for FTMs. They are erased.
While this tendency to forgo consideration of the real life experiences of trans people in favor of monolithic, stereotypical representations of them (or through outright erasure) seems to have been common in academic writing at the time, it is also worth noting the deep theoretical and political commitments at work. Raymond's account is situated within a lesbian-separatist paradigm which sees women's oppression as secured through compulsory heterosexual relationships (Radicalesbians  1988). In this heterosexual context, women are forced to adopt an identity that is male-dominant (man-identified). Liberation from the colonization of identity can only be obtained through lesbian relationships and a community of women-identified women. Central to this paradigm of oppression/ liberation, then, is the view that a woman's identity can be thoroughly colonized as well as the view that this can possibly be eliminated through loving lesbian relationships (Frye 1983). It is one, then, which does not see the self as inherently bound up with gender or sex role.
Given this account, it is no surprise that Raymond criticizes Money's view that gender identity, while determined by environmental factors, is “locked down” at an early age (1979, 62–8). And given the separation between sex and role, it becomes apparent why transsexual claims about gender identity become hard to fathom. On the one hand, identity might involve the internalization of and identification with the sexist gender roles from which, according to Raymond, we need to find transcendence. This would obviously cry out for feminist intervention. On the other hand, since Raymond accepts a view according to which sex is a given, biological substrate upon which cultural role is assigned, identity may simply be taken to reflect recognition of one's own invariant biological sex (male or female). Such an identity would survive any transcendence from cultural sex role. In this case, however, any purported misalignment between body and identity would seem deeply misguided (since identity merely reflects one's invariant biological sex).
In 1977 a controversy erupted in lesbian-separatist circles over Sandy Stone, an openly transsexual woman and an engineer who had been working at Olivia Records (an all-woman recording company). Both she and Olivia were explicitly targeted by Raymond in The Transsexual Empire. After leaving Olivia, Stone earned her doctorate under Donna Haraway at Santa Cruz, and in 1991 published a reply to Raymond and what would become the founding essay in transgender studies, “The Empire Strikes Back: A (post)transsexual manifesto” (Stryker 2008, 105, 124–5).
Stone takes up a third position in opposition to both the medicalized view of transsexuality characterized by Benjamin's The Transsexual Phenomenon and the feminist critique offered in Raymond's The Transsexual Empire. The fundamental move of the essay is to see transsexuals as a kind of “oppressed minority.” While Stone does not position transsexuals as a third gender, she does propose that transsexuals “currently occupy a position which is nowhere, which is outside the binary oppositions of gendered discourse” (1991, 295). Because Stone wishes to avoid appeal to a pre-existing class of individuals who are then oppressed, she represents transsexuality as a genre of discourse. The idea is that traditional medical discourse about transsexuality constitutes a distinctive, regulated way of talking and theorizing which Stone calls a genre. (Contrast, for example, traditional medical discourse on transsexuality with Raymond's feminist discourse on transsexuality). Stone is suspicious of appealing to a group of individuals prior to the workings of a particular discourse (that is, one which is conceived of as independent of a particular discourse) since, goes the postmodern worry, such an appeal to this group of individuals would nonetheless be at the same time providing an account of them within a discourse—a discourse which could be shaped by ideological commitments. Instead of trying to make such a move, then, Stone identifies a group of individuals as represented through traditional medical discourse about transsexuality.
Drawing on the autobiographies of some transsexual women, Stone finds herself in agreement with Raymond in worrying about what she sees as the uptake of sexist stereotypes by (some) MTFs (1991, 289). However, she also notes (some) MTF insistence upon a male/female binary and the absence of any middle or more complex gender ground (286). Beyond this, she criticizes the subjectivity-erasing, blanket claims in Raymond's work (e.g., “All transsexuals rape women's bodies”) along with the implicit denial of transsexual subjectivity discussed above (298).
What is lacking, according to Stone, is space for the discourse of transsexuals as transsexuals. She points to ways in which the medicalization of transsexuality has required both the uptake of sexist behavior as well as the acquiescence to a strict gender binary. In this way, she argues, transsexuals have been complicit in telling a story within a genre that does not necessarily reflect their own subjective experiences (1991, 295). At the same time, argues Stone, transsexuals have also developed their own subcultures as well as distinctive practices within those subcultures that entirely run against the official account of transsexuality (such as helping each other know what to say and how to act in order to get medically designated as a transsexual) (291–2). The solution, Stone argues, is for transsexuals to begin telling their own stories (295). This requires minimally, that post-operative transsexuals come out as transsexual and forego passing as (non-transsexual) men and women (298–9). The traditional medical requirement that one construct a plausible non-trans history to hide one's past, for Stone, undermines the possibility of authentic relationships. Because the injunction to forego passing as the (non-transsexual) sex one has transitioned into runs entirely against the prevalent discourse of transsexuality as such, Stone represents the political move as post-transsexual (299). She sees that while many transsexuals are complicit in this discourse, they nonetheless go beyond it by attempting, for example, to assist each other in “working” the medical regulations (as explained above). Thus their experiences and actions outstrip the “official” medical accounts of transsexuality. Yet this “outstripping” is rendered invisible in any complicit attempt to fit into a medical account which requires that one's status as transsexual be ultimately denied in everyday life (through this construction of a false history). For Stone, eschewing this discourse is important because it hides the complex, variable experiences of different trans people who are often positioned in contestatory ways vis a vis this discourse. The move is not designed to find some one authentic and uniform account of transsexuals beyond the medical discourse. It is, rather, to clear the way for discourses from which it is at least possible to speak and to speak politically as a transsexual.
Stone's manifesto relies on an account of oppression/resistance that breaks sharply from the utopian vision found in Raymond's work. Instead, it draws largely on the ideas of Haraway's “A Cyborg Manifesto” (1983, 1991) and Gloria Anzaldúa's theory of the mestiza (1987). It will be worth discussing these views briefly to draw out the nature of Stone's theoretical departure from Raymond.
Haraway's postmodern image of the cyborg (explained below) is intended to raise worries, derived largely from writings of women of color, about single, monolithic (identity-based) accounts of oppression/liberation. Haraway worries about political accounts which postulate an original state of innocence and subsequent fall from grace and which then envision a utopian future which promises a return to innocence.
According to Haraway, the difficulty with such theories is that they are partial in their account of the world (while assuming universality) and so end up ignoring (and even promoting) certain forms of oppression (1991, 156). For example, a feminist vision which posits a shared experience of oppression among women and recommends lesbian-separatism as its solution, as formulated, leaves out the experience of racial oppression among women of color (Combahee River Collective 1981). Why should women of color be expected to forego solidarity with progressive men of color?
The cyborg, then, is a collection of disparate, incongruent parts: Each individual contains multiple elements of oppressor and oppressed. As a metaphor, it is intended to refuse postulations of original innocence and utopian future (1991, 151). Instead, resistance for Haraway is possible due only to the possibility of the cyborg's turning against the intentions of its maker in a dystopian environment (151). This idea is notably taken up by Susan Stryker (1994), who uses the metaphor of Frankenstein's monster, in her reply to Mary Daly's (1978) representation of transsexuals as monstrous boundary violators.
This notion of mixture is also central in the work of Anzaldúa, who speaks against an emphasis on purity and in favor of the notion of mixed race (una raza mestiza) (1987, 99). She recognizes herself as a border dweller, torn between the demands of conflicting cultures (for example, anglo and Mexican) (1987, 100). The experience of being caught in the confluence of multiple cultures leads to a kind of multiplicity or fragmentation of self. For example, one might be represented in a racist manner in dominant white forms of feminism and in a sexist manner in dominant forms of racial resistance. This tension between conflicting cultural perspectives yields the possibility of “double” or “Mestiza” consciousness which involves the capacity to see oneself in accordance with the dominant ways in which one is oppressively represented and constrained in different, and often conflicting ways (101–2).
It is precisely the capacity to be conscious of this plurality of the self, in Anzaldúa's view, that allows for resistance, since there is an awareness which outstrips the multiple forms of oppression by viewing them together, as well as in conflict (1987, 102). Such a consciousness also allows for the possibility of “linguistic terrorism”—the creative blending of disparate languages and cultures in ways that work against the monolithic character of each (1987, 75–86). For example, Chicano Texas Spanish and Tex-Mex involve such a linguistic blending. Anzaldúa writes, “Until I am free to write bilingually and to switch codes without having always to translate … my tongue will be illegitimate” (81). And: “We are your linguistic nightmare, your linguistic aberration, your linguistic mestizaje …” (80).
While neither Haraway nor Anzaldúa explicitly discuss Raymond, it is clear that the position articulated in the The Transsexual Empire is vulnerable to their concerns. Raymond's vision provides both an origin account as well as the promise of salvation: The original imposition of sex roles and the final achievement of integrity through freedom from them (1979, 164). And Raymond's dismissal of integration (the mish-mash of incongruent parts) is precisely celebrated by Haraway and Anzaldúa, who have no patience for the alleged “innocence” and “purity” of integrity. Significantly, Anzaldúa identifies a state between man and woman as a site for creative resistance:
There is something compelling about being both male and female, about having an entry into both worlds. Contrary to some psychiatric tenets, half and halfs are not suffering from a confusion of sexual identity, or even from a confusion of gender. What we are suffering from is an absolute despot duality that says we are able to be only one or the other (1987, 41).
Although Stone does not explicitly use the expression “double consciousness”, it is evidently at work in her suggestion that transsexuals have learned to adopt the discourse of medicalization while doing so within a subaltern transsexual culture which fails to accurately correspond to the official account. Certainly her suggestion that transsexuals speak beyond the gender binary is anticipated in Anzaldúa's work, as is her call to mix-and-match genres.
The differences between a vision of the self as a site for potential gender colonization /decolonization (as presupposed by Raymond) and a vision which emphasizes “mestiza consciousness” are significant. María Lugones (1990), for example, argues that the former type of vision, as articulated by philosophers such as Frye (1983), simply cannot succeed as a theory of resistance. The difficulty, in part, is that the former seems to postulate a self underlying the cultural work of oppression or at least the possibility of a self that has been or could be freed entirely from culture (or at least gender). Yet, if such a possibility is not realistic, as it seems not to be, it is hard to see how any form of resistance to oppression can get a foot-hold. How can the colonized mind be open to transformation and resistance given that it is already colonized? It is precisely this possibility of “double consciousness”, argues Lugones (1990), which makes resistance possible at all.
Stone's article laid the foundations for the emergence of transgender studies, which can be characterized as the coming-to-academic-voice of (some) trans people against a history of scholarly objectification. The early nineties also witnessed the emergence of current transgender politics, articulated in the popular works of Leslie Feinberg (1992, 1993, 1996, 1998) and Kate Bornstein (1994). Three major features of what might be called the transgender paradigm paralleled the ideas of Stone: 1) the recognition of gender-based oppression, usually targeting trans people, as distinct from and non-reducible to sexist oppression; 2) the positioning of trans people as problematically situated with respect to the binary categories man and woman; and 3) the endorsement of a politics of visibility.
This is not to suggest that such politics are uniform. For example, while Feinberg tends to emphasize the historical persistence of transgender people as a kind of people or oppressed group, Bornstein tends to emphasize the constructed (and oppressive) nature of gender categories as a whole, the desirability of viewing gender as fashion, and the importance of moving toward a more consensual gender system. Notably, Bornstein draws on the ethnomethodological work of Garfinkel (1967) and Kessler and McKenna (1977). The work of Kessler and McKenna is especially remarkable for its early broad use of ‘gender’ to apply even to biological sex in order to indicate the implication of sex within cultural interpretation and practice. Ethnomethodology is a sociological analysis of how individuals construct their common-sense knowledge of the world in social contexts. Bornstein draws principally on Garfinkel's notion of the natural attitude about sex. This attitude, for Garfinkel, constitutes the everyday “common-sense” about sex. It is held by those he dubbed “normals” for whom the categories male and female are exclusive, exhaustive, invariant, and applied on the basis of genitalia. Notably, part of the natural attitude involves dismissing counter-examples (e.g., intersexual individuals who show that the neat categorization of humans into two discrete categories is bogus) as abnormal and aberrant.
At any rate, these and other popular works characterized and perhaps provided the foundation for the emerging Anglo-American transgender politics of the 1990s which while insisting upon the distinction between gender identity and presentation (on the one hand) and sexual orientation (on the other) also fought for representation within LGB politics. This led to the development of a somewhat more inclusive LGBT politics, grounded in the idea that gender-variant individuals had always, in the first place, been central to gay and lesbian liberation and that gay and lesbian individuals themselves may be subject to discrimination on the basis of gender presentation.
The emergence of transgender politics included the prolonged conflict between trans activists and non trans feminists over the exclusion of trans women from the Michigan Womyn's Music Festival. In 1994, the trans activist group, Transexual Menace, organized ‘Camp Trans’ directly opposite the festival. (The term transexual, spelled with one s, was intended to signal a break from the traditional medical conception of transsexuality). The point was to challenge what was seen as the festival organizers' transphobic attempt to exclude trans women through its ‘womyn-born womyn’ policy. The political conflict persists to this day.
In 1994, The Transsexual Empire was re-issued with a new introduction by Raymond that explicitly takes up the new transgender politics. Her critique largely involves the claim that any gender transgression by transgender people still involves the uptake of sexist gender roles and therefore fails at genuine gender transcendence (1994, xxix). In Raymond's view, most self-identified transgender people are predominantly men who are in some way performing a stereotypical and sexist femininity (ibid.). However, she also discusses Feinberg's Stone Butch Blues, a novel which played an important, informative role in the emergence of transgender politics. In this novel, we follow the lead protagonist, Jess, who moves from the category of butch (in butch-femme lesbian subculture) to the category transsexual, and who then recognizes that transition from female to male is likewise unfulfilling. Jess ends up occupying a middle ground, identifying simply as a ‘he-she.’ Raymond's major concern with this trajectory is that, Jess ultimately refuses self-identification as a woman (1994, xxxii).
Raymond's theoretical framework regarding gender transcendence and a strict biological binary prior to cultural imposition guides this discussion. Given her distinction between integration and integrity, any mixing and matching of gender would fail to achieve the goal of complete gender transcendence, and therefore fail as a politics of liberation. Moreover, given that she does not allow room for a third space between man and woman, given that she does not recognize trans oppression as somewhat independent of sexist oppression, and given that women-identified-women are central to her views about resistance, it is hardly surprising that she should be dismayed by Jess' decision. Aside from problems mentioned with this theory earlier, it is worth adding that, as Cressida Heyes notes, Raymond's theory, which rejects transgender resistance a priori, seems to be unfalsifiable (2003, 1108).
The impact of Judith Butler's Gender Trouble: Feminism and the Subversion of Identity (1990) was immediate and profound. Instead of being oppositional, the ground-breaking work of Butler bears a much more complex relation to transgender individuals and to trans studies.
Butler's work was partly motivated by the desire to answer concerns that queer enactments of gender (as in a butch-femme relationship or in gay male drag) merely replicate traditional patriarchal norms. For Butler, such a view presupposes a heterosexual bias obscuring the way in which gender is re-worked in queer contexts. What she has in mind is that in queer subculture gender practices do not always have the same meaning that they do in mainstream cultural contexts. For example, feminine presentation in some queer contexts may involve a degree of irony not found in mainstream instances of that feminine presentation. To treat queer gender practices as simply repeating or miming non-queer practices without any significant change in meaning is to understand all gender practices in a way that assigns dominant heterosexual meanings to it.
Queer gender performance, far from replicating patriarchal norms, can subvert such norms by exposing their non-natural, imitative character (1990, 174–80). Sometimes queer gender performance can involve irony and/or parody through exaggeration. (Good examples of this can be found in early films by John Waters, such as Female Trouble). Queer gender can make fun of heterosexual gender practices by exaggerating them and parodying them in such ways that make them seem theatrical and contrived. And gay male drag, for Butler, can show that feminine presentation is not the sole property of female individuals. Once it is recognized that such behavior is only contingently assigned to groups of individuals, the very idea that gay drag merely involves imitation of heterosexual women as the original assigns a priority to the latter over the former. This prioritization, for Butler, reflects a heterosexual bias. And, so for Butler, feminist identification of all gendered behavior as inherently sexist (as, for example, found in Raymond's work) is nothing short of a heterosexist tendency to attach a primacy to heterosexual gender performance.
Butler's account of gender aims to call into question the pre-existence of a group of individuals (i.e., women, females) prior to the enforcement of gender role. Instead, in Butler's view, biological sex is culturally instituted and in this sense “gender all along.” Prima facie this view seems counter-intuitive. One way to motivate it is to recognize that contrary to the natural attitude about sex (discussed above), human beings cannot always be neatly divided into male and female. Indeed, once we recognize various features which go into sex determination (chromosomal sex, gonadal sex, genital sex, etc.) we see that sex is not a single, unitary, easily-determined feature. Insofar as the natural attitude prevails, however, individuals act as if the natural attitude were true. Sex is now understood in terms of a particular attitude which shapes everyday social practices. And to the extent that such an attitude helps ground medical practices designed to surgically assign intersex infants to one sex or the other, it appears that sexual dimorphism is medically instituted. Insofar as bodies are made to conform to a particular cultural ideology about sex—an ideology which governs social practice—it makes some sense to say that biological sex itself is, to this degree, “culturally instituted.”
In Butler's view, whenever we discuss the body, we are also always representing it in culturally specific ways. To speak of the biologically sexed body as somehow prior to particular discourses about it is to, in so doing, nonetheless ironically speak about it within some particular discourse and hence to represent in some way. According to Butler, sex is culturally instituted by representing the body as the natural container of some inner, gendered self. Sex is understood as the bodily indication that concealed within it is the essence of either a woman or a man. For Butler, this view is false. However, just as the natural attitude may be treated as if it were true even though it is not, so, too, bodies can be falsely treated as containers of gendered selves. To the extent that this view is pervasive and regulative of human conduct, one can—in this sense—say that sex is socially constructed.
For Butler, behavioral manifestations of gender are often taken to express a prior gender identity that is contained within a naturally sexed body. Thus, feminine behavior is seen as expressive of an inner feminine core (contained within the body sexed female). On the contrary, in her view, such performances simply serve to generate the fiction of a pre-existing gender identity as well as the fiction of the sexed body qua natural container of this identity (1990, 178–9). This is to say: Behavioral manifestations are prior to gender identity and sexed body (rather than the other way around). The illusion of a stably sexed body, core gender identity, and (hetero) sexual orientation is perpetuated through repeated, stylized bodily performances that are performative in the sense that they are productive of the fiction of a stable identity, orientation, and sexed body as prior to the gendered behavior (173).
This allows Butler to answer the charge that queer gender performances merely replicate sexist gender role behavior. In her view, all gender behavior is imitative in nature. Heterosexual gender identity involves an instability that it attempts to cover over: While it purports to be grounded in a naturally gendered core, it amounts to nothing more than repeated attempts to imitate past instances of gendered behavior (1990, 185). Thus, there is also a subversive potential of queer drag and camp gender performance, in her view, insofar as it can parody and thereby expose this concealed imitative quality (1990, 174–6). As a consequence, Butler welcomes the proliferation of queer gender behaviors that re-signify, parody, and expose the mechanisms by which the fiction of normative heterosexist gender is created (1990, 184–190).
While Butler's theory was initially viewed by some as a kind of gender voluntarism, it is clear that this is very far from her actual view, further refined in Bodies that Matter (1993). Butler clarifies that instead of a kind of voluntary theatricality donned and doffed by a pre-existing agent, gender performance is constitutive of the agent itself. For Butler, even though the self is the mere effect of repeated gender performances, it is nonetheless real: There are selves, they are socially constructed. What is strictly fictional, for Butler, is the view that they are unified cores which exist prior to gendered behavior. Butler does not want to deny the existence of our psychic lives.
For Butler, gender performance is citational in that it tacitly cites or draws on gender norms (1993, 12–3; 230–33). But it is precisely this citing of the norm as authoritative which confers authority upon the norm (1993, 13). Indeed, the agent herself as the one who either willfully complies or fails to comply with the authoritative norm is likewise produced through this process of citation (1993, 13, 225, 232). Thus, Butler sees the agent qua unified source of gendered behavior as performatively constituted through repeated acts of gendered behavior. This is to say: The ‘agent’ is, far from the cause of gendered performance, its effect (1990, 184–5; 1991, 24; 1993, 232).
Such a view yields a kind of paradox: If the agent is the mere effect of the repeated acts, then how are the acts themselves produced? The concerns may be mitigated to some extent by recognizing that Butler is interested in the very formation of self-identity as understood within a psychoanalytic tradition. She follows Freud in seeing the ego as formed largely through a process of complex identifications. Identification, in this context, is to be understood as the stable psychic “taking on” of perceived properties of a lost love object (1990, 73–84; 1991 26–7). In this way, the lost object becomes a part of the ego through a process of imitation: The object is internalized (and psychically “preserved”).
In Butler's view, the taboo against (heterosexual) incest presupposes a prior taboo against homosexuality (which effectively constitutes heterosexual desire as such) (1990, 82). Yet the taboo requires that the loved object as well as the homosexual desire itself be given up. In a process of melancholy the lost object is not grieved because the desire cannot even be acknowledge in the first place. So the lost object is internalized through this process of identification by which the individual now psychically takes on the attributes of the lost object, thereby acquiring a heterosexual gender identity (1990, 78–81; 1991, 26–7). In this way, imitation lies at the root of the very formation of gender identity.
For Butler the term psyche applies to more than simply the self or ego as constituted through gender imitation. In addition to the conscious self, she is also interested in the psychic workings of the unconscious as postulated in psychoanalysis. In Butler's view, the psyche outstrips the performatively constituted agent insofar as the repeated acts fail to entirely imitate the preceding ones and, indeed, insofar as they must be repeated at all (1991, 24). Butler allows for “psychic excess” which applies to that which is both presupposed by and yet excluded by heterosexual gender identities. For example, the love of the lost object discussed above cannot be allowed into the heterosexual gender identity. Nonetheless it is part of the psyche—is “psychic excess”—insofar as it is essentially presupposed by and yet disowned in the formation of heterosexual gender identity. Such excess manifests itself, for Butler, in performative failures and in behaviors which expose the imitative character of gender (24–5).
This involves a notable departure from the “double consciousness” model of resistance (and identity) discussed above. Rather than flagging the simultaneous blending of conflicting cultural claims to form a subject position that is constituted by its borderland status, Butler deploys the notion of “psychic excess” and points to the re-significations of performance (as within a historical chain) in ways that subvert a stable subject position altogether. This means that Butler situates subversion in disruptions which fail to imitate in the same way, which expose and undermine the illusion of a stable self. Despite this difference, however, both the notion of “double consciousness” and Butler's theory of gender performativity similarly depart from Raymond's view which postulates a self at least ideally freed from oppressive machinations.
In light of her appeal to citationality, Butler further clarifies that the subversive potential of gender performance is significantly constrained since, in order for gender performance to be subversive, it still must cite existing gender norms as norms (1993, 122–4, 226–7). This means that gender subversion is limited by the history of past iterations of gender performance. Butler also allows that there are ways in which gender performance can both replicate and subvert sexist, racist, and heterosexist norms at once. For example, she aims to defend an ambivalent picture of the culture portrayed in Jennie Livington's 1991 film Paris is Burning which documents the drag ball competitions of various ‘houses’ in New York City, held by mostly black and latino/a queer men, transsexuals, and queens (1993, 121–140).
Butler's discussion of the film is especially notable for its explicit treatment of transsexuality. She is largely responding to bell hooks who criticizes the film for the invisibility of the subject position of the director (a white, Yale-educated, lesbian woman) in shaping an objectifying spectacle of non-white gender and sexuality (1992, 150–1) and the very behavior and attitudes of the individuals documented in the film (147–50). Following in the tradition of Raymond, hooks raises worries about the masculinity involved in the drag performances (citing the competitive edge involved in the balls as well as the celebration of sexual objectification) (148–9). Moreover, she points out that white femininity seems elevated in these balls as the canonical form of femininity (150). Butler, by contrast, aims to highlight both subversion and the ways in which such subversion is constrained and even erased through dominant heterosexist forms of gender.
The bulk of Butler's defense of this ambivalence derives from her discussion of the life and death of Venus Xtravaganza, a light skinned Latina, and self-identified pre-operative transsexual woman. Xtravaganza dreams of a happy, suburban, heterosexual life but works as a prostitute and is ultimately killed. On the one hand, Butler sees the murder as the effect of the dominant order to annihilate that which subverts its (in this case, Xtravaganza's “in-between” body and gender incongruence) (1993, 131). On the other hand, Butler sees the murder of Xtravaganza as flowing from her “tragic misreading of the social map of power” where her hopes to live a happy life in the suburbs are shattered when she is treated in the way in which women of color are treated (1993, 131). While Butler sees Xtravaganza's life is genuinely subversive of dominant regulations of gender, she also raises worries about the nature of Xtravaganza's desire for gender realness as a middle-class, heterosexual woman (133) . In Butler's view, this desire is primarily an attempt to transcend race and class through gender transformation (130).
Butler's theory has the advantage of answering Raymond's assumption that all gendered behavior is inherently replicative of sexist norms, by providing a theoretical basis for the subversive potential of some queer gender performance and by jettisoning a view which sees biological male/female sex as independent of culture. In this way, her work is highly congenial to transgender theory and politics. Yet Butler's theory also has some significant difficulties which have led some trans scholars to voice strong objections to her work.
Notably, Butler's theory leaves the charges of gender replication entirely applicable to those trans people who see themselves and who behave as “real” men and women, as her account of Xtravaganza indicates. The tension involves her account of gender identity as socially constructed as well as her account of subversion (on the one hand), and the importance of gender identity and gender realness to some trans people (on the other). To be sure, there is no obvious theoretical tension here, since Butler can explain the importance of gender identity and gender realness. The problem, rather, is that this vision may not be politically useful for trans folk who seek to emphasize the importance of gender identity and realness for some trans people.
The tension seems to derive, in part, from the fact that Butler's aims to defend some forms of queer gender behavior in opposition to heterosexual gender behavior. In this model, transgressive gender performance is closely wedded to non-heterosexual sexuality (Prosser 1998, 31–32). In arguing that Xtravaganza is killed because of her gender subversion, Butler must understand this as breaking from demands of heterosexuality (Prosser 1998, 46). What is missing from such an account is recognition of trans oppression as a modality in some ways distinct from the heterosexism.
Perhaps more problematically, Butler's suggestion that Xtravanganza is killed as a woman of color elides the specifics of violence against trans women: Xtravangaza was not killed as a Latina woman, but as a Latina transsexual, working as prostitute (Prosser 1998, 47, Namaste 2000, 13). Moreover, Butler's suggestion that sex-change, for Xtravaganza, is an imagined vehicle to transcend her economic and racial conditions fails to take sufficiently serious her transsexual identity (Namaste 2000, 13–4). Indeed, both Jay Prosser (1998, 50–55) and Viviane Namaste (2000, 14) argue that Butler's treatment of Xtravaganza involves allegorizing her life and death as a way to generate theoretical mileage for her own views while failing to make room for her as a person who lived and died as a transsexual. In addition to such concerns, deeper theoretical worries about Butler's position are raised by both Prosser (1998) and Namaste (2000).
Prosser (1998) takes issue with Butler's view at the theoretical level of identity and body. For Butler, the acquisition of a gender identity (along with the corresponding heterosexual desire) involves the selection of certain bodily pleasures as acceptable and the rejection of others as unacceptable (1990, 89–90). This selection of appropriate pleasure is determined in such a way that pleasures do not literally derive from a particular body part “where” they are located (90–1). Rather the sexual pleasure derives from the eroticization of that body part (i.e., by its role as an object in erotic fantasy). In heterosexual “incorporation” the eroticization of body parts is falsely literalized where the body part is then construed as the “container” and “source” of sexual bodily pleasure (87–90). In this way, the subjective experience of one's sexed body is nothing but a literalized fantasy.
In response to this account, Prosser claims that Butler misreads Freud according to whom, he argues, the body ego really does arise from the body (1998, 40–2). Prosser appeals to Didier Anzieu's notion of the “skin ego”—the “inner experience” of the body arising from bodily sensations—which serves as a significant interface between psyche and body (65–67). This allows Prosser to argue that transsexuals appeal to the notion of the ‘wrong body’ because it simply feels that way (68–9). His account of body ego departs from Butler in emphasizing bodily sensation and proprioceptive awareness, rather than the visualization of bodily surface (78–9). Prosser deploys notions of bodily agnosia (the neurological inability to track parts of one's body) (78) and phantom limb experiences (84–5) to help explain the way in which a transsexual's body image may not accord with their actual body.
Prosser's view has the advantage of offering a more plausible account of the body ego. Yet it is also worth remarking that little attention is paid to the way in which social conceptions of the body might impact the ego. By grounding transsexuality so thoroughly in the body, Prosser's view does not appear well-equipped to accommodate transsexual self-identifications as woman or man where such identifications involve more than the body, but also social role. In this way, Prosser seems to offer a conception of self (or at least bodily self) which is implausibly independent of cultural demands.
While Prosser's work primarily focuses on Butler's psychoanalytic account of ego formation, Viviane Namaste's (2000) focuses on Butler's account of queer drag as subversive. In Namaste's view, Butler fails to heed to the larger social context in which gay male drag is situated and through which gender is regulated. Namaste points to the social facts that gay male drag performance is often restricted to entertainment on the stage where it is viewed as “mere performance.” By contrast, gay male sexual identity is not restricted to the stage and is not viewed as “mere performance” (10–13). Given that Butler allows for an ambivalence in subversion, however, it isn't clear that her view cannot accommodate these social facts in the way that she theorizes drag performance in Paris is Burning. Yet Namaste aims for a deeper theoretical critique, charging Butler with departing from a post-structuralist framework which situates such phenomena precisely within a broader social analysis she sees lacking in Butler's account (16–23).
By using drag as a way to represent and theorize all gender relations, argues Namaste, Butler fails to examine the multiple concrete ways in which gender is regulated in everyday life (20–1). It isn't clear that this by itself undermines Butler's claim that some gender behavior can be genuinely subversive (and indeed, Butler does not point only to drag, but also butch/femme presentations of gender). However, it may nonetheless raise worries about Butler's attempt to offer a uniform theory of gender as imitation. Given that degree of abstraction from concrete social circumstance, it may be that Butler omits crucial elements of gender that are specific to various concrete social practices.
Butler's more recent work has to some extent attempted to mitigate some of the preceding concerns (2004). She indicates that she has been informed by what she calls “The New Gender Politics” (i.e., the activism initiated by intersexual, transgender, and transsexual people) (Butler 2004, 4). Where the notion of “doing” gender is central to her earlier work, the notion of “undoing” now becomes central. She is concerned specifically with the notion of the “human” and the fact that some people are recognized as less human or, in some ways, not recognized as human at all (2004, 2). Insofar as this is a function of what counts as intelligible gender, one can be “undone” by gender (rendered unintelligible or recognized as less human) (2–3). Insofar as gender is relational, and for Butler now often involves acting for another, one can be “undone” by those to whom we are vulnerable (22–5). Thus, we may be undone through the loss of a close friend, just as we may be undone through acts of phobic violence.
Butler now seeks to find a balance between the demand for autonomy (required by a democratizing ideal to which she explicitly subscribes) and the fact that such autonomy does not flow from an atomistic self, but rather its grounding in the particular ideologies and institutions which necessarily connect us with others and deny certain individuals the status of human (37–9, 223–7). Her demand, then, is to distinguish norms which foreclose the possibility of livable lives for those rendered marginal, and those which open up possibilities “to live and breathe and move”(2004, 8, 31,219). In this way, she aims to offer a more nuanced approach to the importance of identity in democratic politics, explicitly taking up a “tension that arises between queer theory and both intersex and transsexual activism” which “centers on the question of sex assignment and the desirability of identity categories” (7). Effectively, then, Butler recognizes that insofar as queer theory aims to undermine the “illusion” of stable identities while arguing against the viability of a politics based upon identity categories, it is in opposition to intersex and transsexual activism both of which are centered upon identities (i.e., intersex identity and transsexual identity). Conceding some ground, Butler recognizes that a livable life “does require various degrees of stability” (8). Her earlier work found subversion only in the disruption of stable identity. She recognizes here, however, that without some stability, life is not livable.
She also reconsiders her earlier appeal to drag. For Butler, what is important about drag is only that it reveals the possibility that what is taken as a given is really cultural and that it can be contested and assigned new meanings (213–9). However, while her earlier view had insisted more strongly upon the importance of subverting the norm through its exposure as imitative, what now seem more important are the different kinds of norms at stake, and whether they conduce to possibilities of livable lives for those who are marginalized.
Notably, Butler considers the political tension between those trans activists who would oppose the Gender Identity Disorder as pathologizing and paternalistic, and those who insist upon its importance in securing access to medical technologies, recommending the strategic use of the diagnosis. While the latter view underestimates that degree to which such a move further empowers the existing structural arrangement and inflicts damage upon those who undergo the regulations (82–3), the former fail to see how, in practice, movement away from some medical regulation is not going to be possible without also completely undermining access to the technology (90–1). In Butler's view, the institutional mechanisms which permit access through medical regulation and psychological evaluation, allow for a kind of culturally circumscribed access to autonomy, but only at the cost of “undoing” oneself (91). Butler sees this bind of “undoing oneself” in order to “do oneself” as characteristic of the general way in which autonomy is both culturally denied and bestowed (100–1).
While Butler's modified view in some ways eases the tension between her theory of gender and the demands of trans politics, it is worth noting that the theory does not deliver many details in terms of trans oppression and possibilities for resistance. Her discussion of Gender Identity Disorder is a case in point. It leaves us with a powerful illustration of her theoretical claims about autonomy; yet it does not offer much in terms of concrete political strategies.
Bernice Hausman's Changing Sex: Transsexualism, Technology, and the Idea of Gender (1995) aims to provide a feminist analysis of transsexuality within a Foucauldian paradigm. While her theoretical framework differs markedly from Raymond's, she also shares Raymond's concern about transsexuality as well as her deep distrust of medical intervention on the body.
For Hausman, the primary hallmark of transsexuality is the sheer demand for transsexual surgeries through which transsexual subjects are constituted as such (1995, 110). As a consequence, she sees transsexual subjectivity as entirely dependent upon medical technology. In Hausman's view, transsexuals and doctors work interdependently to produce “the standard account” of transsexuality which serves as a “cover” for the demand for surgery and to justify access to the medical technologies (110, 138–9). Behind the “cover” there is only the problematic demand to, through technology, engineer oneself as a subject. Because of this, Hausman claims that transsexual agency can be “read through” the medical discourse (110).
A corollary of her view is that the very notion of gender (as a psychological entity and cultural role distinguished from sex) is a consequence of medical technology, and in part, the emergence of transsexuality. Rather than arising as a consequence of sexist gender roles, Hausman argues, transsexuality is one of vehicles through which gender itself is produced as an effect of discourses designed to justify access to certain medical technology (140). In defending this position, Hausman points to the historical emergence of the expressions gender and gender identity in the work of individuals such as John Money and Robert Stoller (discussed earlier). She sees such historical developments not as moments of intellectual discovery but as discursive development. It is the precisely the development of this new gender discourse which ushers in gender and gender identity. And such discourse is made possible, for Hausman, through the advance in technology which allows surgical treatment of intersex and transsexual individuals. In effect, gender and gender identity discourse emerges as a way to motivate and justify the deployment of certain medical technologies.
In light of this, Hausman critiques Butler for assuming an ahistorical use of gender/sex in her attempt to read sex as “gender all along.” On the contrary, argues Hausman, gender was a historical development (179). Prior to gender, argues Hausman, the reproductive subject (i.e., woman or man understood within a heterosexual framework) was understood in terms of the body as signifier of sex. With the development of gender, the reproductive subject (now understood in terms of heterosexual gender role) is taken to signify gender identity (as the very ground for biological sex) (187–88). Hausman resists Butler's (1990) call to proliferate genders, then, and insists instead on a return to the notion of sex (180).
A significant component of Hausman's account is that transsexual agency is inherently complicit in the medical model (140). For Hausman, transsexuals are defined by their desire for surgical conversion and have their subjectivity constituted by and through medical accounts of transsexuality. Beyond the medical model, no transsexual subjectivity is possible at all, according to Hausman. Whereas Stone (1991) sought to disrupt the traditional transsexual narrative by making room for the experiences of transsexuals (captured in “double vision”) and by generating new hybrid (“genre-blending”) narratives, Hausman denies that there is anything further to be said (174). Notably, Hausman appears to misrepresent Stone as claiming that there is a single reality or truth to be told, concealed by the medical narrative (146). However, she also appears to reject any possibility of “double consciousness” and of trans resistance to the medical model (195–6). This rejection, however, is empirically false as is evidenced by Stone's observations about the subversive activities in transsexual subculture (discussed above). Indeed, given that Stone herself, a transsexual, seems capable of articulating an account of self that exceeds and contests the medical model, it is unclear why and how Hausman can deny that resistant transsexual subjectivity is possible.
For Hausman, transsexual autobiographies serve the function of justifying access to surgery through the deployment of medical accounts. The purpose of such narratives is to compel the reader to comply with the author's experience and to interpret her own life in the same way (156). Indeed, Hausman argues, these very narratives belie several contradictions and are actually self-defeating. For example, Hausman notes a self-defeating tension between transsexual claims to have always been “the other sex” all along and the related demand for “sex-change” surgery (148). If one was always that sex all along, then why sex-change surgery?
In response to this charge, Prosser (1998) argues that autobiographical narrative is essential to understanding transsexual subjectivity (103). In his view, autobiographical narrative—required by the clinician, and then perhaps re-visited through a formal autobiography—allows transsexuals to confer intelligibility upon their lives. Such accounts, Prosser points out, are always retrospective. And they involve a split between the narrated self and the narrating self. Such tensions between claims to having always belonged to a sex (on the one hand) and of going through a process of surgical sex-change (on the other) are simply constitutive of the types of tensions that arise in autobiographical narrative (1998, 114–120).
Whether or not Prosser is correct, however, Hausman's identification of self-undermining tensions is weak. A claim to have always belonged to a sex and a claim to have become a sex through surgery are only in tension if ‘sex’ is used univocally in the two claims. But it isn't clear that this is so. If claims to have always belong to a sex are used to flag a gender identity and perhaps the sense that one ought to have born to the other sex (on the one hand), while claims to have changed one's sex are used to flag bodily transformation (on the other hand), then there scarcely seems to be a self-defeating tension.
Hausman also briefly considers transgender politics as a possible source of resistance to the medical conception of transsexuality. She recognizes that the possibility of trans people working in a way that is at odds with the medical regulation of gender is at odds with her attempt to reduce transsexual subjectivity to complicity. In reply, however, Hausman sides with Raymond in affirming that the sheer mix-and-match of gender presentation does nothing to transcend gender, relying on an unacceptable view of gender as in some ways voluntary (197–8). She also notes that Bornstein (whom she sees as representative of all current transgender politics) continues to make room for transsexual identities and transsexual surgery, which she sees as fundamentally problematic (198). Even if Hausman is right that some transgender activists adopt this position about transsexuals, however, she hasn't fully addressed the main point that there exist forms of trans subjectivity which outstrip the medical model. And while she is certainly right that not all gender blending is subversive, it isn't clear why none is.
One of the notable outcomes of Hausman's work (as well as Raymond's new introduction to The Transsexual Empire), was a heightened recognition among trans scholars of the fragility of transgender studies. Concerned by the continuing transphobia inherent in some non trans feminist writers, C. Jacob Hale drafted “Suggested Rules for Non-Transsexuals Writing about Transsexuality, Transsexualism, or Trans” (1997) to assist non-trans individuals in writing about trans people in ways that avoided, rather than perpetuated, transphobic strategies and representations.
To a large extent, (non-trans) feminist discussion of trans issues seems to have circulated around the perceived problematic status of trans people (and, in particular, transsexuals). Moreover, there has generally been an over-emphasis on MTFs in particular. So it is worth drawing attention to significant (trans) feminist views which have emerged from disputes in subaltern communities among various non-gender normative individuals, particularly those assigned female at birth.
Tensions among FTM-identified and butch lesbian-identified people had been leading to politically charged disputes about the significance of masculinity. For some lesbians, FTMs represented a betrayal of womanhood and a desertion of lesbian community. For some FTMs, butch masculinity was a lesser and perhaps “artificial” manifestation of masculinity in contrast to the masculinity exemplified by FTMs. Such competing ways of understanding masculinity led to what have sometimes been called “Butch/FTM border wars” (Halberstam and Hale, 1998).
Such conflict found articulation in a dispute over the gender identity and sexual orientation of a young masculine-presenting female-assigned-at birth individual, Brandon (Teena), who was slain in Humbolt, Nebraska in 1993, when discovered to be “really a woman.” (Hale [1998a] argues that there is not good evidence that Brandon used the name Brandon Teena. It has, however, become a common way of referring to this individual. I place the name Teena in parentheses to flag the problematic nature of this linguistic construction). An article in the Village Voice, by Donna Minkowitz entitled “Love Hurts. Brandon Teena Was a Woman Who Lived and Loved as a Man. She was Killed for Carrying It Off”, led to the formation of Transexual Menace, a trans activist group, which protested the perceived invalidation of Brandon's identity as transgender person (Prosser 1997, 316).
Similar tensions arose in the academic literature. Judith Halberstam's ground-breaking essay “F2M: The Making of Female Masculinity” (1994) was the target of considerable criticism from within FTM communities (Halberstam 1998a). Jay Prosser's “No Place Like Home: The Transgendered Narrative of Leslie Feinberg's Stone Butch Blues” (1995) aimed to offer an academic reply to Halberstam's perceived invalidation of FTM self-identities.
In “F2M” Halberstam seeks to undercut the representation of FTM transition as a more radical form of gender crossing than others (such as lesbian butch gender presentation) (1994, 212; 1998a, 289). She points to the failure of the standard scheme (straight/ lesbian/ transsexual) in accounting for the multiple and highly specific forms of identity and desire in “postmodern lesbian identities.” She argues against the notion of crossing from one category to another in light of the proliferation of such identities situated at alleged “crossings” (1994, 212). By this she means that such identities can be taken in their own right as claiming ways of being in the world that contest the very dominant categories that would situate them as “crossings.”
Halberstam claims that surgical intervention in the case of “sex-change” serves to “fictionalize” gender (i.e., render or expose as artificial) (1994, 216). Likewise, she argues, alternative gender presentations involving attire or fantasy can “fictionalize” gender, where in all cases the “fiction” requires a reader (221). These “fictions” may play a significant role in the identities and desire of individuals. The upshot is that there is nothing distinctive about FTM transsexuality in “fictionalizing” gender. Rather a masculine performing butch lesbian, for example, likewise fictionalizes it. “Sex-change” and “cross-dressing” are largely on a par with regard to their central importance to identity and desire.
In light of this move, Halberstam notoriously remarks, “We are all transsexuals. There are no transsexuals” (1994, 212) in order to underline the plurality of ways in which gender (as identity and desire central) can be “fictionalized.” This attempt to undercut the specificity of FTM transsexuality drew fire from some FTM circles and Halberstam later weakened her claim (1998a, 306). Her point, however, (as she later explained), was to mark out space for the notion of a transgender butch as a position which resisted a continuum in which lesbian butch masculinity is represented as less than the fully achieved masculinity of FTM transsexuals (1998a, 289).
In his reply to Halberstam, Prosser contrasts what he sees as the oppositional positions of queer and trans. He takes issue with a tendency in queer theory to represent gender/sex as performance and, in Halberstam's work, fictions. (As has been noted, for some trans people, the view that gender is unreal or artificial seems to undo their very attempts to see themselves as “real men” or “real women”). Yet, while there may be some grounds for some political complaint with this theoretical account, Prosser falls prey to a view which holds butch lesbian masculine presentation as merely artificial or gender play, in contrast with the “reality” and “depth” present in the case of FTMs. In this way, he does not sufficiently differentiate between lived lives that may (or may not) be described as “queer” (e.g. butch masculinities) and an academic queer/postmodern theoretical starting point (1995, 487). The latter may very well involve viewing all gender as performance and identity as fictional. However, “queer” lives (involving butch masculinities) need not be viewed this way. To distinguish butch as artificial and transsexual as real is to refuse to acknowledge the relationship of many butch individuals to gender and identity.
Prosser's strategy for marking a trans theoretical vantage point is to draw a contrast between the centrality of performance (in queer theory) and narrative (for transsexual people). He correctly notes a tendency in postmodern queer theory to raise questions about the political role of narratives (1995, 484). Such narratives may be seen to involve the illusion of a false unity and they may also involve exclusionary politics. Yet narratives, according to Prosser, are central to the accounts of transsexuals and such narratives involve the notion of home and belonging (1995, 488). This appeal to narrative seems in tension with a picture which underscores the fragmentation of coherent narratives into diverse performances and which identifies subversion with the disruption of narrative-based identities. Coherent narratives, even if ultimately fictional, play important intelligibility-conferring roles in the lives of transsexuals, according to Prosser. And this cannot be well-accommodated in accounts which aim to undermine such coherence.
In Prosser's view, transsexual narratives are driven by a sense of feeling not at home in one's body, through a journey of surgical change, ultimately culminating in a coming home to oneself (and one's body) (1995, 490). In this way, the body and bodily discomfort constitute the “depth” or “reality” that stands in contrast to the view that body is sexed through performative gender behavior which constitutes it as the container of gender identity. In light of this, Prosser concludes that queer theory's use of transsexuals to undermine gender as mere performance fails to do justice to the importance of narrative and belonging in trans identities.
Drawing on Feinberg's Stone Butch Blues, Prosser argues that transgender (construed as a departure from traditional transsexuality) likewise involves a narrative structure. In this case, however, the narrative involves making a home of the in-between space between man and woman (1995, 500). Since, however, it involves more than mere performance (i.e., dysphoria concerning one's body) as well as the centrality of narrative, it ought to be distinguished from generic understandings of queer. He later alters his view slightly, placing transgender in a liminal space between queer and transsexual, admitting far more ambivalence around the notion of home and belonging (1998, 177).
While Prosser may be right to emphasize the importance of narratives in the identities of transsexual and transgender people, however, it is hardly clear that he can maintain the fairly sharp lines he hopes to draw between transsexual, transgender, and queer. The narrative structure of identity (as well as notions of home and belonging) may be important for many people (including queer-identified ones). And, while for Prosser what is distinctive about transsexual/transgender narratives is that they involve a feeling of bodily unbelonging, it isn't clear why such dysphoria may not be present among non trans-identified people. Moreover, his view seems to take for granted the view that for trans people there is always a “home” to which one might return (or, at least, imagine). Yet this is to assume that trans people have the means by which to find this belonging (in their bodies, etc.). Given economic realities, however, this is far from clear. Indeed, given the meagerness of linguistic resources to even explain trans experiences, it isn't obvious how, in some cases, so much as an imaginary home might be formulated.
The work of C. Jacob Hale is a kind of philosophical intervention in these borderland disputes. He offers one of the earliest theorizations of trans issues from within the analytic tradition. And in some ways, his perspective welds together trans, queer, and feminist sensibilities from a distinctive queer, feminist, ftm vantage point. (Hale uses the term ftm rather than FTM as a way to refuse the term as an abbreviation of female-to-male. Instead, for Hale, it is a community-specific term. This discussion of Hale will respect his terminological decisions). His work centers around the analysis of gender categories.
Hale (1996) examines Monique Wittig's (1992) contentious claim that lesbians are not women. (Wittig's point was to turn on its head the heterosexist view that lesbians fail to count as women by arguing that lesbians step outside the oppressive category of woman which requires heterosexual relations with men). Hale is one of the first to defend the view (now adopted by many feminist philosophers) that the category woman is what Wittgenstein called a family-resemblance concept. The concept woman, in Hale's view, has thirteen, differently weighted characteristics none of which are necessary or sufficient for category membership (1996, 107–12). This position enables Hale to then argue, pace Wittig, that some lesbians are women, others are not, and for some there is no fact of the matter (1996, 115).
In Hale's view, the category woman is inherently normative (1996, 104). Individuals who fall within it can be assessed on the degree to which they conform to the thirteen characteristics. For Hale, the category is governed by both positive and negative exemplars. Negative exemplars serve to proscribe certain forms of behavior and threaten the possibility of falling out of the category altogether (1996, 105). Yet while the threat of falling outside of the category must be in place to regulate conduct, owing to the cultural requirements of preserving the prevailing common sense about gender, very few individuals must actually fall outside of the category altogether (105–6).
Similarly, Hale argues, there is no single feature which can distinguish between butch and ftm individuals (except, perhaps, the sheer self-identification with the very labels butch or ftm). Not all ftms self-identify as men and not all butches self-identify as women, some butches identify more strongly with masculinity than do some ftms, and some butches avail themselves of body-altering medical technologies, while some ftms do not (1998a, 321–2). Hale also critiques “desire for a penis” as the dividing line between butches and ftms (199a, 326–30): Such an attempt erases complex butch desires as well as the idiosyncratic relationship of ftms to their bodies while accounting for butch/ftm distinctions in a phallocentric way. Additionally, it draws on a model of “sex-change surgery” which is borrowed from male-to-female contexts (in which “the surgery” is identified with genital surgery) and thereby further promotes male-to-female dominance in trans contexts (329–30). By this Hale means that “the surgery” is typically used to refer to genital reconstruction surgery. However the centralization of one surgery is especially problematic in ftm contexts. Double mastectomy and hysterectomy are other important surgeries. Indeed, “top surgery” (as it is sometimes called) often figures more prominently in ftm contexts.
Instead, Hale suggests that both categories would be better analyzed as family-resemblance concepts (1998a, 323). If so, claims Hale, it would be better to speak of a border zone where the categories partially overlap with each other than to search for a firm boundary between the two (323). The model allows Hale to, perhaps in the spirit of Anzaldúa, speak of “border zone dwellers”—individuals who live at the edges of multiple, overlapping identity categories. He argues that given the evidence, Brandon (Teena) appears to have been such a border zone dweller (317–9). Attempts to claim the dead (or the living) who live in such border zones, argues Hale, make it even harder for such individuals to live there (319). It makes it more difficult to live there by threatening to eliminate border zone space altogether by trying to force individuals who occupy it into other frameworks. Similarly, border zone dwellers may face pressure to claim identity categories that do not work well and which threaten to erase the specifics of their lived experiences (336). Such subject positions (constituted by a lack of any central identity category) are important, albeit difficult place to speak from (partially because there doesn't seem to be any available language). Yet such specificity must be maintained, argues Hale, partially through calling into question the function of definitions and categories, partially through artistic endeavor that attempts to creatively give voice to experiences not well captured in the available language (336–7). Hale strongly urges that butch/ftm border zones be “demilitarized” (i.e., that different “camps” such as ftm community and lesbian community stop trying to claim border zone dwellers as their own) in order to make room for marginalized border zone dwellers themselves (340).
Hale expands on his notion of the border zone dweller in order to outline what it might be to articulate an ftm feminist voice (1998b). He draws principally on María Lugones' notion of ‘world’-travelling (Lugones 1987). In her view, those marginalized by the mainstream may occupy different ‘worlds’ in which they may be constructed as different persons. (A shift in self, for Lugones, constitutes a shift in ‘world’). For Hale, then, border zone dwellers, those who occupy ‘dislocated locations,’ may fit within different categories (‘man’, ‘ftm’, ‘butch’, ‘genderqueer’ etc.) that attach to different cultural ‘worlds’ (1998b, 116–7). However, since these border zone dwellers are marginal with respect to the categories, their fit in all cases will be only limited and tenuous. In this way, Hale modifies Lugones' conception of ‘world’-travel (which does not postulate such a tenuous fit into categories) (117). By contrast, Lugones' conception insists upon the multiplicity of languages and systems of meaning, which is de-emphasized in Hale's model.
Hale argues that because many ftms have had experiences living as girls or women, have a history of moving in feminist ‘worlds’, and may be far more aware of the significance of masculine enactments, there is a strong basis for wanting to avoid certain forms of masculinity while embracing those which abide by feminist values (1998b, 118). This requires, according to Hale, maintaining human bonds with non-trans feminist women and travelling to their “worlds” while continuing to recognize oneself as a border dweller. This is difficult, however, given assumptions by non-trans feminists who do not have the experience of certain forms of gender oppression (such as transphobia) (118).
It also requires caution with respect to the types of identifications one makes. For Hale, identification as a member of a category involves both identifications with members of that group as well as identifications as not-members of some other category (119). There may be pressure, through uptake of the category ftm, for example, to identify primarily with non-trans men and to dis-identify with butch lesbians. Such pressure, for Hale must be avoided (119). Identification with may operate independently of identification as a member of category (on the basis of, for example, historical ties). The making of such identifications must be guided by the exercise of moral and political agency. In light of this, Hale argues, gendered self-identities must be made secondary to moral and political identifications (120).
After Butler, there have been notable non-trans feminist contributions to the study of trans issues, focusing largely on the issue of feminist solidarity and trans identities. In marked contrast to the works of Raymond and Hausman, these contributions constitute sincere efforts at promoting trans and non-trans feminist coalition.
Naomi Scheman (1997) examines the ways in which certain dominant forms of normativity necessitate “abjected others” who are required but rendered impossible and unintelligible to normatively privileged selves. Scheman rejects the options of either claiming a place at the center of normalized forms of life (from which one has initially been excluded), or refusing to engage the dominant forms of identity at all (by accepting one's “marginal” status). Instead, Scheman aims to contest the normative center by centralizing those who have been marginalized (126–7). With this in mind, she begins with the assumption that marginalized lives “are lived, and hence livable” (132).
Scheman draws on her own lack of clarity about Jewish identity, as a secular Jew, in order to help trouble the unproblematic status of her own gender. She sees a Jewish people conceptually required by Christianormativity, and yet rendered unintelligible by its representation of all religions as entirely conversion-based (1997, 128). Under such conditions, it becomes hard to explain what it is to identify as a secular Jew. Likewise, she sees transsexuality as involving a required incoherence. Since heteronormativity requires a “natural” binary of women and men, transsexuals are paradoxically defined by an insistence of having always been the other sex all along and thereby required to deny their own histories (as Stone argues) (138–9). In this respect, Scheman notes, Christianormativity and heteronormativity are contrasting: The former represents all religions as driven by choice and conversion, the latter represents all gender as naturally determined at birth (142).
Both “Jewishness” and “womanhood” for Scheman, can be understood as family-resemblance concepts (1997, 144). However those who have been assigned to the category Jew on the basis of ancestry or to a gender on the basis of birth form the basis of such concepts without which the concepts would not exist at all (144). She introduces the expression “perinatally pinked” to describe those individuals who have experienced oppression as female from birth and recommends it as a way to understand the need for “womyn-born-womyn” space which she sees as intended for healing the damage inflicted through natal assignment as a female in a misogynist society (141–2).
Yet just as individuals may convert to Judaism and become a Jew, Scheman suggests, MTFs may be understood to “convert” to womanhood. In both cases, such individuals are no less real than those who have been assigned the categories at birth (144). While she notes several disanalogies (e.g., in the case of transsexuality one does not simply choose, as one might convert to a religion), she also suggests that by viewing sex/gender as more analogous to Jewishness in this respect, some of its oppressiveness might be undermined (145). The notion of joining a collectivity is important, for Scheman, because it stresses the importance of shared bonds, values, and commitments. In the end, this is what is most important, she argues: “The issue, then, is not who is or is not really whatever but who can be counted on when they come for any one of us: The solid ground is not identity but loyalty and solidarity” (153).
Cressida Heyes continues this non-trans feminist project of finding grounds for solidarity between (non trans) feminists and trans folk. Following Hale, she argues that woman is a family-resemblance concept, regulated in different ways for different political purposes (2000, 84–5). And following Scheman, she notes that in some cases differences between trans and non-trans women (such as being “perinatally pinked”) may need to be emphasized for political purposes (93). She offers a critique of the non-trans feminist positions of Raymond and Hausman, while also critiquing what she sees as troubling tendencies in some transgender politics (such as the work of Leslie Feinberg) to adopt a liberal conception of the self as atomistic (2003). In this way, she seeks to find some middle, common ground.
Heyes argues that both Raymond and Hausman are caught in the grip of a picture which precludes any examination of their own gender privilege while foreclosing the possibility of perceiving trans resistance (2003, 1095). This foreclosure is accomplished through assimilating all transsexual subjectivity into to a hetero-patriarchal medical discourse about transsexuality (2003, 1095). Using Feinberg's book Trans Liberation as an example, Heyes also raises worries about a transgender politics which says that individual gender expression ought not be subject to criticism, restriction, or oppression. She observes that gender is not merely an aesthetic style or expression of an isolated self. It is relational and often embedded in problematic systems of oppression. This means that forms of masculinity involve interacting with women, for example, in particular ways. Certain forms of masculinity involve misogyny. What it means to be a “real man” may involve relating to women in hostile, destructive ways. Such gender behavior ought to be critiqued. What is missing from accounts which merely tout gender freedom of expression, Heyes argues, is a rich “ethics of transformation” which distinguishes between progressive transformations from those who are oppressed and marginalized and hegemonic (i.e., dominant; oppressive) forms of gender that only further oppression and marginalization (2003, 1111–3).
Heyes also examines the use of sex/race analogy in questions about transsexuality and a hypothetical “transracialism.” Recall Raymond's rhetorical question “Does a Black person who wants to be white suffer from the ‘disease’ of being a ‘transracial?’” Such a question is intended to show that, since “transracialism” is politically and morally suspect, so too, is transsexuality. Christine Overall, by contrast, argues the inverse of what Raymond claims, namely that those who accept the morality of transsexuality ought to accept the morality of “transracialism” as well (2004).
Heyes observes that Raymond's claim that “there is no demand for transracial medical intervention precisely because most Blacks recognize that it is their society, not their skin, that needs changing” [1994, xvi] is actually empirically false (2003, 1102). Cosmetic procedures do exist which aim to modify ethnically or racially marked features (e.g. hair-straightening treatments, nose-jobs, eye-lid surgery). Heyes points to Raymond's use of a sex/race analogy to dismiss transsexuals as “capricious or appropriative” (2006, 269). The analogy is used, Heyes claims, as a basis for assessing the motivations and politics of individuals who change identity in a way that problematically assumes that such motivations may be based on a “transparent political evaluation of its benefits and drawbacks” (ibid.).
While Overall offers a far more nuanced analysis, claims Heyes, she still treats race and sex in a way that is abstracted from the historical conditions and assumes that such history is irrelevant to ethical assessment (2006, 269–70). In particular, Heyes argues that in drawing analogies between race and sex there is a danger in not paying sufficient attention to the contrasting histories of race and sex. For example, since sex has been viewed as a core ontological fact in a binary scheme, the conditions are in place for the possibility of sex-change as well as medicalized transsexual discourse which reinscribes this basic, ontological binary (2003, 1102; 2006, 2006, 277). By contrast, while race has also been viewed as a natural category, there is another racial discourse which understands it as a superficial feature under which human beings are all the same. This, along with the lack of the same strict binary, does not provide the same conditions which would make “transracialism” a similar possibility (2003, 1103).
Heyes points to the historical role played by heredity in determining race (but not sex). This mitigates against the possibility of “transracialism” in a way that is not present in the case of sex, she argues (2006, 271). Relatedly, changing race has a history of being associated with “passing” which would leave any “transracialist” subject to accusations of “passing” in a way that is not present in the case of sexual crossing (272). Heyes notes, then, that those promoting cosmetic procedures which change ethnic or racial features take care to avoid issues around racial betrayal by emphasizing individual self-expression and aesthetics (273–4). By contrast, argues Heyes, since sex is not viewed as hereditary, the possible of sex-change has been more viable. Indeed, contemporary sex must be understood as partially constituted by the history of technological developments in sex modification (as “passing” has partially constituted race) that has precisely allowed for such sex-change within the discourse of pathology and internal gender identity (277).
In considering the metaphysics of sex/gender transition (i.e. transition from man to woman or woman to man), Christine Overall (2009), critiques two accounts of it. Both accounts agree that, in a way, there is no change of sex/gender at all. One remains the sex/gender one always was. She calls both of these “masquerade hypotheses” (12). In the first version, adopted usually by (some) nontrans people, the trans person who transitions from one sex/gender to another is merely donning a mask or engaging in a pretense that effectively hides what they always really were (the “true person”). In such a view, the trans person is represented as either deceptive or deluded. In the second version, adopted usually by (some) trans people, the trans person who transitions is merely becoming what they always already were, through pulling off a kind of bodily mask which fails to express what they are “on the inside” (the “true person”). In both accounts, sex/gender is invariant. Rather than changing sex/gender, one either moves into the state of masquerade or out of it. Overall argues that both the delusion and deception are implausibly applied to the diverse lives of all trans people and, indeed, belied by the lives of many trans people (13-14). She rejects the second masquerade account on the grounds that it relies on a suspect metaphysics (14-18).
In Overall's view, by contrast, we ought to understand sex/gender transition as analogous to “other life-changing and life-enhancing aspirations for personal transformation and self-realization” (19). Some of the examples she gives include becoming an immigrant; joining a twelve-step program to give up alcohol, joining a religion, becoming a mother. “Some goals and aspirations,” Overall writes, “are deeply felt and of central value to particular individuals, and it is those goals and aspirations that provide the dominant drives of the individual” (19). In place of both masquerade views, she proposes that we view sex/gender transition as an actual change in sex/gender. What remains constant is not some reified gendered self. Instead, the person “persists insofar as her way of being, after transition, is desired and actively sought by her previous self, so that the way of being after the transition grows out of the previous self, is generated by the previous self, and can be understood in terms of characteristics of the previous self” (20).
One unfortunate consequence of this view is that a trans man (for example) cannot truthfully claim to be a man prior to transitioning. To be sure, there is a sense in which being a man is a core part of his identity both prior to transition and afterwards, since becoming a man is a life-changing aspiration subsequently realized. Her account is therefore importantly different from the first masquerade account in that it takes seriously trans identities, viewing them as striving for a kind of authenticity. But his claim to be a man (or male) prior to transitioning is still false. To see this more clearly consider that insofar as Overall (2009) effectively defines sex in terms of genitalia (11), it follows that a trans man who has not undergone phalloplasty has not yet changed his sex (and is still therefore female, and possibly still a woman). The problem is that, in part owing to its cost, many trans men elect not to have this type of surgery. Nonetheless, they may still regard themselves as men (and even male). This leaves open the possibility for the charge of self-delusion or self-deception to re-emerge despite Overall's attempt to avoid this.
Overall (2012) uses her conception of gender/sex transition as aspirational, to undermine the view that trans and cisgender people are very different from each other. Her goal in doing this is not to elide the forms of violence and discrimination to which trans people are subject as trans, but to call into question the view that being cisgender is normal, while being trans is deviant (252-3).
She distinguishes between acquired and aspirational identities. The first are assigned or earned in such a way that no further work is required to maintain them (255). For example, being a biological mother is an acquired identity. Aspirational identity, by contrast, requires constant work to maintain (256). For example, being a mother (as in a caregiver for one or more children) requires constant maintenance. Overall argues that gender identity (by which she means the social categories boy/man and girl/woman) is aspirational in nature. “One can aspire to exemplify a gender through the aforementioned bodily styling, self-presentation, and gendered activities, all of which must be ongoing for gender identity maintenance” (256-57). She also argues that sex itself may be becoming an aspirational identity (at least for some) insofar as both cis and trans people alike seek out surgery and other medical procedures (e.g. hormone therapy) to alter or augment the sexual characteristics of their bodies (258).
Overall then argues that trans and cis people have the following features in common (with regard to aspirational identity). Both are immersed in a system of compulsory gender maintenance, both are subject to constraints on how their gender identities are maintained while also afforded various opportunities to express their identities, both are subject to various dangers connected to gender maintenance (e.g., trans people can be subject to transphobic violence for “misrepresenting” their genital status, while cis women may be subject to violence on the basis of their gender presentation), finally (and contrary to a common assumption) both may experience forms of continuity and discontinuity in their gender aspirations. For example, a trans person may harbor gender aspirations of being a girl/woman for most of their life, while a cis woman may, as a consequence of feminism, alter her womanly aspirations. In this way, Overall continues this non-trans feminist project of finding grounds for solidarity between non-trans feminists and trans people.
Gayle Salamon's work (2010) concerns the phenomenology of gendered embodiment and, in particular, trans experiences of dissonance between “felt body” and the external appearance of the body. She revisits the dispute between Judith Butler (who claims that the gendered self is socially-constructed) and trans theorists, such as Jay Prosser (1998) who, rather than taking transsexuality as evidence of the constructedness of gender, points to it as evidence of something that transcends such construction (1998, 7 and 65). Aside from arguing that Prosser misreads both Freud and Didier Anzieu (2010, 39-40), Salamon defends the implausibility of viewing proprioceptive awareness of the body as somehow culturally-transcendent. She argues that the body postulated in such a view is ultimately unrecognizable as human (88). In her view, “the same social forces that constitute a body as culturally legible or illegible also shape the very feelings of embodiment that would seem to be most personal, most individual, and most immune to regulatory injunction” (77).
Drawing on the work of Schilder (1950), Salamon sees one’s body image as not innate, but as built up over time through experiential contact with the world (including interactions with other people). In light of this, Salamon argues that the lack of fit between felt sense of body and external appearance of the body experienced by some trans people is, in fact, pervasive - relevant to trans and non-trans folk alike: “The production of normative gender itself,” she writes, “relies on a disjunction between the 'felt sense' of the body and the body's corporeal contours and . . . this disjunction need not be viewed as a pathological structure” (2010, 2).
Yet it is not clear how such an environmental account can explain the genesis of trans experiences of “wrong” embodiment. Consider that not all trans women possess a conscious self-identity of being a woman (or a girl) from a very early age, and not all trans men possess a conscious self-identity of being a man (or boy) from early on. Imagine, then a trans woman who is raised to see herself as male and to follow “the proper” gender norms. This person should, in the environmental account, develop a body image that would be described as roughly 'male.' For in accordance with external gender norms and internalized gender identity, this person will have generally had the types of interactive worldly-experiences that would be expected to yield such an image. Thus, if there's such an image that's incongruent with assigned gender, it mustn't have been developed in that environmental way.
In addition to possessing an internal perception of one's body, however, one is also affectively invested in one's body. That is, one takes an interest in it and has strong emotions about it. Salamon writes, “Without that investment, our relationship to our bodies is one of depersonalized estrangement: my sense of the ”mine-ness“ of my own body-and, crucially, even my sense of its coherence-depends on this narcissistic investment” (2010, 42). This provides a way to move beyond the limitations of (socially-regulated) environmental experience insofar as such affective attitudes are not subject to the same type of worldly-constraint.
The challenge, however, is to explain this investment in such a way that does not reduce to sexuality or forms of eroticism. Expressions such as Schilder's libinal investment have strong sexual connotations. And the worry is that an appeal to such notions will reduce trans experiences of bodily dsyphoria to sexual feelings. This is of particular concern in light of the long standing tendency (as Salamon notes, 2010, 45) to construe transsexuality in terms of sexual desire, to reduce cross-gender identification to a kind of sexual fetish, and to elide trans gender body dysphoria as a discrete phenomenon. Unfortunately in her discussion of this issue, Salamon appeals to Butler's notion of the morphological imaginary which itself actually does appear to privilege the sexual. What remains to be explained - a serious lacuna - is the non-sexual affective investment in the gendered body that presumably must ground the disjunction between felt sense of gendered body and the visual body in cases of trans bodily dysphoria.
In her own account of sexual desire, however, Salamon is notably careful to avoid reducing transsexuality to eroticism. She is merely interested instead, in accommodating trans experiences of sexuality in a way that is not invalidating (2010, 45). Salamon draws on Merleau-Ponty's notions of the sexual schema and transposition. In experiencing sexual desire, one is oriented toward an object of desire. In transposition, one's body (that “houses”) the sexual desire comes to be replaced by (or itself actually becomes) the desire itself. Salamon illustrates the point as follows. When I'm thirsty and reach for a glass of water, “my arm, unbent and reaching out, is no longer the location of my sensation but rather becomes the gesture through which I am toward the other. The arm is the conduit of desire, but not the seat of its sensation” (54).
In Salamon's account, what's important is not the actual body part itself, but its role in sexual desire, and this process of transposition: “The join between desire and the body is the location of sexuality, and that join may be a penis, or some other phallus, or some other body part, or a region of the body that is not individuated into a part, or a bodily auxiliary that is not organically attached to the body” (2010, 51). In this way, Salamon's appeal to Merleau-Ponty is similar to Butler's notion of the morphological imaginary with respect to the role of the erotic in incorporating the part through a form of sexuality (or, actually, the whole way of being toward another). Notably, however, Salamon's account allows her to show how one's “internal sense of gender” can become capable of being witnessed by others in the world. For rather than talking merely about an internal feeling, we are talking about ways of being in the world, in interaction with others.
Many trans women, because they are women, are well acquainted with mechanisms of sexism and sexual violence. Moreover, sometimes sexism and transphobia can be blended together inseparably. For example, some trans women may sometimes find that they are stereotypically represented as prostitutes simply because they are seen as transgender women. With such considerations in mind, a trans feminist stance might involve taking the oppression of trans women as its starting point. Several writers have outlined distinctive “trans feminist” positions.
Emi Koyama defines transfeminism as “primarily a movement by and for trans women who view their liberation to be intrinsically linked to the liberation of all women and beyond” (2003, 244). For Koyama, transfeminism “stands up for trans and non-trans women alike, and asks non-trans women to stand up for trans-women in return”, thereby embracing feminist coalition politics (ibid.). Some of the issues of transfeminist concern, for Koyama, include body image, violence against women, and health and reproductive choice.
Koyama deepens the discussion of the tensions, identified by Heyes, between freedom of gender expression (on the one hand) and concerns about the political implications of gender understood as relational (on the other). While Koyama calls trans women to avoid the uptake of sexist forms of gender as well as refusing any traditional appeal to an essentializing gender identity, she also recognizes that trans women can find themselves in situations in which uptake of traditional forms of gender are necessary to secure access to medical technologies, legitimation as “real women”, and avoidance of transphobic violence through passing (as non-trans) (2003). She raises worries about the purist demand that a trans woman eradicate all gender stereotypes in a society in which such stereotypes pervade. She insists instead on the priority of larger scale coalitional politics, leaving individual women to make their own personal decisions about how to negotiate gender, free of judgments about who does and does not count as a feminist (2003).
Koyama also takes up the issues of trans exclusion in the “womyn-born womyn” policy of the Michigan Womyn's Music Festival. Koyama criticizes the efforts of some post-operative trans women to accept a “compromise” policy which would have admitted only post-operative trans women. Such a policy, argues Koyama, would unfairly advantage those trans women with greater economic resources, and is consequently both classist and racist (2006, 700). Koyama also argues that even if it is true that non-trans women require their own space, this does not preclude the admission of trans women into the festival, since while women of color have special exclusionary space on the land, this does not require that white women cannot enter the festival at all (701). Moreover, Koyama points out, such special space for women of color does not exclude those women of color who can pass as white (and thereby receive certain privileges) (701). Indeed, Koyama argues, the exclusion of trans women is inherently racist insofar as it is uses differences in experience to rule out trans women, a policy which can only make sense if it is presupposed that feminist solidarity requires a monolithically shared experience (704).
Another version of trans feminist politics has been elaborated by Julia Serano who distinguishes between traditional sexism (which she sees as the belief that males and masculinity are superior to females and femininity) and oppositional sexism (which she sees as the belief that male and female, along with masculinity and femininity, constitute exclusive categories) (2007, 12–3). Serano coins the expression trans-misogyny to capture forms of discrimination which pertain specifically to trans women which principally target their perceived femininity (13). For example, Serano points to ways in which some trans women are represented in the media as either sexually predatory deceivers or pathetic, laughable, fakes (36). In Serano's view, such representations derive largely from a sexist focus on the feminine presentation of trans women and the tendency to view femininity as artificial (43–44). Serano also provocatively argues that the devaluation of feminine males is a distinctive form of traditional sexism which she calls “effemimania” (129, 287).
Serano posits the existence of a “subconscious sex” to capture the traditional notion of gender identity without requiring an initial conscious awareness of “wrong body” which she suggests is biologically grounded and largely limited to body rather than social role (78–82). (In this way, her notion echoes Prosser's appeal to “body ego.”) Serano deploys the term cissexualism to indicate the advantaging of those for whom biological sex and subconscious sex are in alignment. The term cisgenderism, by contrast, indicates the assumption that males ought to be masculine and females ought to be feminine (where masculinity and femininity are constituted by the set of attributes typically associated with males and females respectively) (90). Serano takes the position that while some forms of femininity may be socially instituted, many feminine attributes may also be biologically grounded. She writes:
One would have to have a rather grim view of the female population to believe that a majority could so easily be “brainwashed” or “coerced” into enthusiastically adopting an entirely contrived of wholly artificial set of gender expressions. In fact, it seems incomprehensible that so many women could so actively gravitate toward femininity unless there was something about it that resonated with them on a profound level. (2007, 339)
There is a worry, however, about Serano's under-estimation of the degree and depth of female subordination as well as her theoretical failure to distinguish between “personal resonance” and enforced social acquiescence. In Serano's view, many (non-trans) feminists have engaged in negative assessments of femininity (viewing it as strictly an imposed artifice) and thereby implicated themselves in a form of sexism. Indeed, Serano claims that any feminist critique of trans femininity is inherently anti-feminist:
In other words, when we critique any gender as being ‘good’ or ‘bad,’ we are by definition, being sexist. After all, isn't what drives many of us into feminism and queer activism in the first place our frustration that other people often place rather arbitrary meanings and values onto our sexed bodies, gender expression, and sexualities? (2007, 360)
While Serano may be right to raise worries about the ways in which the behavior of trans women has been unfairly judged, a position which allows for no analysis of politically problematic gender behavior at all seems to seriously impair feminism's critical force. The core issue is that Serano does not see gender as fundamentally relational. This allows her to view gender as something that everybody ought to be free to express in any way they want to (fee of judgment as ‘good’ or ‘bad’). However, once gender is viewed as relational, it seems entirely appropriate to raise feminist worries about certain forms of masculinity that involve treating women badly and certain forms of femininity that involve accepting poor treatment. Once gender is recognized as relational (i.e., as involving the treatment of other gendered people in particular ways), it can be subject to ethical evaluation (e.g.,“that gendered behavior involves hurting people”). For the very sake of trans women and their safety, such a trans feminist intervention is surely appropriate.
In fairness to Serano, she does not fail to note sexist relations between men and women. Indeed, she offers a rich account of the sexualization of trans women (2007, 253–262). In her view, however, such negative relational features which accrue to femininity flow from the inappropriate interpretation and evaluation of femininity, rather than femininity itself. That said, the difficulty is how one is to distinguish femininity as abstracted from such relational social meanings. Even if such a project were possible, it seems clear enough that feminists are concerned precisely by the harmful forms of masculinity and femininity that are deeply implicated in systems of social meaning. And it seems unfair to accuse feminists who raise worries about such forms of sexism as themselves sexist, by construing them as negatively assessing some culturally abstracted form of femininity.
Talia Mae Bettcher (2012a; 2013; 2014) argues against both the traditional wrong-body account of transsexuality (in which gender identity is taken as innate, allegedly determining one's “real” sex) and the newer, beyond-the-binary vision that emerged with the new transgender politics of the nineteen-nineties. Both accounts invalidate trans identities, she argues - the first, by invalidating the self-identities of trans people who do not regard their genitals as wrong, the second, by representing all trans people as problematically positioned with regard to the binary (2013, 53). Moreover, both accounts fail on their own terms. While beyond-the-binary politics tend to marginalize trans people who position themselves within the binary, and therefore fails as a complete account of trans oppression and resistance (2014, 387), the wrong-body account fails to secure trans identity claims to belong to their preferred gender categories (for example, she argues, according to the dominant meaning of woman, an MTF who has had genital reconstruction surgery is at best a difficult case (possibly a man owing to chromosomes, possibly a woman owing to genitalia) (2014, 386). Bettcher's aim (2012a, 2014), then, is to provide an account of trans politics that does not marginalize trans people who situate themselves within the binary and that successfully grounds their self-identity claims.
Instead of attempting to justify trans self-identity claims, Bettcher (2012a) argues, such claims ought to be accepted as presumptively valid as a starting-point of trans theory and politics (245-6). She adopts the general view that (many) trans people tend to oppose the meanings of mainstream gender terms and practices. In many trans subcultures, she argues, the meaning of terms such as woman and man are altered so that both trans men and trans women turn out to paradigm instances of men and women respectively (241). For example possession of XY chromosomes does not count against trans woman's claim to womanhood insofar as a trans woman is a kind of woman who tends to have XY chromosomes. As a consequence of this, an MTF may count as a man in mainstream culture while she may count as a woman in a resistant trans subculture (242). More deeply, Bettcher argues (2009, 110-12), the shift in meaning involves not only an expansion of the category, but also a change in use, reflected in the grammar of first and third person assertions. It is no longer merely a question whether the category is truthfully predicated of the object in question. Instead, there is a first person, present tense avowal of gender. For example, the claim “I am a trans woman” may be an avowal of a deep sense of “who one is” (that is, of one's deepest values and commitments) where defeasible avowals of gender are presumptively taken as authoritative (2009, 110-12). The political conflict, at any rate, is framed in terms of competing cultural formations where the dominant one possesses institutional power and the capacity to enforce a way of life and way of seeing the world, regardless of the personal costs to the trans people involved and regardless of subcultural socially practices which help give their lives meaning (2009, 115; 2012, 243; 2013, 53-54; 2014, 388-90). (One notable absence, in this view, is any account of how it is that trans people are motivated to transition and to occupy such trans cultural spaces in the first place. That is, there is no account of underlying gender dysphoria).
Bettcher characterizes the nature of trans oppression largely in terms of a form of transphobia she in earlier work calls the Basic Denial of Authenticity (BDA) (2006b, 181) and in later work, reality enforcement (2013, 58-9; 2014, 392). In this type of transphobia, the identity invalidation of trans men and trans women is situated in discourses about appearance, reality, exposure, discovery, and deception. For example, a trans woman may be viewed as “really a man disguised as a woman.” Importantly, for Bettcher, the invalidation is connected to forms of genital verification. Explicit genital verification involves literally exposing or touching the trans person inappropriately to determined “what they are really.” Implicit genital verification involves euphemistic questions and claims (“Have you had the surgery?” “Are you male or female?”). Reality enforcement takes two forms given by the possibilities of the trans person being visibly trans or passing as non-trans. In the latter case, trans individuals may be viewed as deceptive (when “exposed”), while in the former case they may be viewed as playing at harmless make-believe. Either way, she argues, trans self-identities are invalidated (2007, 50-51).
Bettcher argues that an account of transphobia which appeals only to the imposition of a strict man/woman binary cannot account for reality enforcement and leads to a restricted and problematic vision of trans politics. Such identity invalidations often do not involve perplexity on the part of the transphobe about how to situate the trans person categorically. On the contrary, trans people are viewed as “really men” or “really women” (2006b, 184-7). Moreover, she critiques transgender politics of visibility. For given that reality enforcement always produces a double-bind, Bettcher argues, such a politics may not always be promising. Indeed, if it is impossible for trans people to tell the truth because whatever they do (“pass” as non-trans or “come out” as trans) yields the view that they are fraudulent deceivers or pretenders, then it seems that it is not possible to tell the truth in the first place(2006b, 188-90, 195). If so, the demand to “tell the truth about oneself” would seem misplaced.
Bettcher argues that by recognizing reality enforcement and resistant responses to it, the perceived conflict (discussed earlier in this entry) between theories which reduce gender to a social construction and the political necessity of taking seriously trans identities which claim gender realness can be better mitigated. Insofar as reality enforcement has sway, trans people are inevitably constructed as frauds or fakes (2006b, 194). But the general claim that all gender is socially constructed simply does not address the specific ways in which trans people are constructed as fraudulent. Bettcher argues that once we recognize reality enforcement trans people who contest such invalidation by claiming gender realness may also be viewed as resistant to transphobic oppression, thereby undermining the tendency (present in Butler) to dismiss such individuals as merely gender reactionary or conservative (2014, 397-99). Indeed, the Wrong-Body Account itself may be viewed as response to reality enforcement through a kind of inversion where the body is now viewed as the deceptive appearance which hides the true, concealed gender identity (2014, 399-404).
A central thesis in Bettcher's account is that reality enforcement is explained by the fact that gender presentation (taken as “appearance”) literally signifies physical sex and in particular, genital status (taken as “deep reality”). If it is true that trans people who “misalign” gender presentation with sexed body are deceivers or pretenders, then those who “correctly” align presentation with body tell the truth. In light of this, Bettcher argues, there is a representational relation between gender presentation and sexed body (2007, 52-3). Bettcher draws attention to the irony that attire is intended to conceal one's “privates” while it also serves to symbolically reveal that which is private (2007, 53). Insofar as it is invasive to demand private bodily information of a complete stranger, she argues, a system, enforced by violence which requires the disclosure of genital status is inherently abusive. In light of this, she argues, reality enforcement is inherently bound up with sexual abuse (2006a, 205-6).
Bettcher introduces the notion of intimate personhood (2012b) to further illuminate reality enforcement and its grounding in gender presentation as genital representation. In this view, people are given to us through forms of sensory (and discursive) access that admit of interpersonal closeness (intimacy) and distance (324). This access, she argues, and therefore intimate personhood itself, requires the existence of normative interpersonal boundaries on sensory access to bodies, while the actual structure of boundaries is culturally contingent (325). In our culture, nakedness as a social possibility and a form of self-presentation, she argues, is just as socially-constructed as (public) gender presentation (322). It is determined by the subjection of bodies to sex-differential boundaries of privacy and decency boundaries which protect both the object and subject of sensory access and which provide the underlying rationale for public concealment (322-3). Female nipples, for example are subject to boundaries on sensory access while male nipples are not. Moreover, while a man seeing a woman's genitals may constitute a violation of her privacy, a woman seeing a man's may involve his committing an indecency offense against her (327). Thus, in her view, just as there are two forms of public gender presentation, so there are two sex-differentiated forms of nakedness (326) and her central thesis that gender presentation communicates genital status becomes the more refined view that clothed gender presentation represents naked gender presentation through euphemistic means (329-330).
Bettcher argues that this gender-genital representational relation is part of a larger non-verbal system of communication that is used in manipulative heterosexual sexuality. For example, feminine attire has been used to excuse rape in “she asked for it” defenses. In Bettcher's view, gender presentation as genital representation is of a piece with this type of sexual “communication”: One reason for the communication of genital status is to secure manipulative heterosexual sexuality (2007, 56). Notably, this yields specific difficulties for trans women which arise at the intersections of sexism and transphobia. For example, a trans woman who is passing as non-trans may be subject to sexualized scrutiny (increasing her chances of being “read”) (2006a, 207). Moreover, the very behavior which opens her to the double-binded manipulations of (hetero) sexuality may appear necessarily in order to avoid being exposed as a “deceiver” (2006a, 207).
Bettcher points to ways in which racist ideology, rape, and racist accusations of rape intersect with each other. Consider the raping of black women by white men and the lynching of black men (justified through false accusation of having raped white women) as historical tactics of racial subordination. Bettcher argues since reality enforcement is involved in broader relations of sexual violence and since such violence has been interwoven with racial injustice, reality enforcement is likewise grounded in racial oppression (2007, 57). Indeed, Bettcher suggests that attempts to address transphobia which fail to take seriously the realities of racial oppression (by working uncritically with the criminal justice system, for example) are bound to fail (2007, 58–60). Bettcher concludes that her account can serve as a theoretical basis for anti-racist trans and non-trans feminist solidarity (2007, 57–8). It can also elucidate transphobic feminist representations of trans women as deceivers and rapists as fundamentally drawing on a (hetero) sexist, sexually abusive, and rape-facilitating system in which gender presentation communicates genital status. Given the interconnection between reality enforcement and sexist and racist forms of oppression, it behooves non-trans feminists to question the political value of deploying such representations.
While early (non-trans) feminist perspectives on trans issues were marked by hostility, trans studies and politics have emerged in complex reaction and interaction with feminist and queer theory and politics as something to be recognized. As time has passed, it seems the possibility of productive interplay between feminist and trans theory and politics as well as solidarity between trans and non-trans feminist is being realized. This suggests a promising future for trans feminist philosophical investigations. In light of the history of trans/feminist interaction, it seems that the self and its relation to oppression and resistance will continue to be a fruitful topic of inquiry.
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- Transgender Law Center
- Transgender Law and Policy Institute
- Suggested Rules for Non-Transsexuals Writing about Transsexuals, Transsexuality, Transsexualism, or Trans____, by C. Jacob Hale, 1997