“Eugenics” is a term loaded with historical significance and a strong negative valence. Its literal meaning—good birth—suggests a suitable goal for all prospective parents, yet its historical connotations tie it to the selective breeding programs, horrifying concentration camps, medical experiments, and mass exterminations promoted by Germany's Nazi regime in World War II. Undoubtedly, we have an obligation never to forget the Holocaust, or to allow history to repeat itself. Yet intuitively we have some moral obligation to promote good births—to have, in the most literal sense, eugenic aims. Indeed, if parents are encouraged to provide the best environment for their children (good nutrition, education, health care, a loving family situation, etc.), why not also encourage them to ensure their children have good genes? If we have some moral obligation to secure the well-being of our future children (a question explored extensively in the literature on the non-identity problem; see the entry on the nonidentity problem), different questions come into focus: how far do such obligations extend, what justifies them, and can related contemporary practices be distinguished, in their aims, forms, justifications, and likely consequences, from the clearly morally impermissible eugenic programs of the past?
Philosophers have recently begun to explore the possibility of “liberal” as opposed to “authoritative” eugenics (Agar 2004). Liberal eugenics would be based upon individual free choice, pluralist values, and up-to-date scientific understanding of genetics and epigenetics. Furthermore, advocates of liberal eugenics aim to be sensitive to the effects of problematic but deeply entrenched social problems (e.g., racism, sexism, heterosexism) on individual choice. Authoritative eugenics programs, in contrast, were coercive state programs designed to promote social goods, and were based on problematic assumptions about hereditability. Liberal eugenicists point to significant developments in our understanding of genetics to help distinguish contemporary liberal eugenics from its problematic predecessors. Indeed, scientific advances of the last several decades—years that include the advent of in vitro fertilization, the funding and completion of the Human Genome Project, creation of the National Human Genome Research Institute (NHGRI), and expansions of pre-implantation screening and prenatal testing panels—provide not only more precise understandings of genes and their role in shaping phenotypes and gene-environment interactions, but also a multitude of possibilities for intervention in the process of reproduction. How ought we to use this new knowledge and capacity? This entry offers a short history of the eugenics movement, a survey of arguments that attempt to define and defend liberal eugenics, and coverage of a variety of critiques of those arguments.
- 1. Short history of eugenics
- 2. Arguing for “liberal” eugenics
- 2.1 Broad commonalities
- 2.2 Permissibility for genetic enhancement
- 2.3 Obligations for genetic enhancement
- 3. Critics of “liberal” eugenics
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Although philosophers have contemplated the meaning and value of eugenics at least since Plato recommended a state-run program of mating intended to strengthen the guardian class in his Republic, the modern version of eugenics had its start with the 19th century cousin of Charles Darwin, British scientist Francis Galton (1883). Galton was interested in “improving human stock” through scientific management of mating; his explicit goal was to create better humans. His ideas were taken up widely in the early part of the 20th century by seemingly well-intended scientists and policy makers, particularly in the United States, Britain, and the Scandinavian countries. Notable eugenicists included Alexander Graham Bell and Margaret Sanger. (For an excellent history of eugenics, see Kevles 1985.)
Eugenicists had two-fold aims: to encourage people of good health to reproduce together to create good births (what is known as “positive” eugenics), and to end certain diseases and disabilities by discouraging or preventing others from reproducing (what is known as “negative” eugenics). In the United States, programs to encourage positive eugenics involved the creation of “Fitter Family Fairs” in which families competed for prizes at local county fairs, much in the way that livestock is judged for conformation and physical dexterity (Stern 2002). Negative eugenics took the form of encouraged or forced sterilizations of men and women deemed unfit to reproduce (in the language of the day, this included individuals who were “poor, mentally insane, feeble-minded, idiots, drunken” and more). At the time, many eugenicists seemed to assume that social and behavioral conditions, such as poverty, vagrancy or prostitution, would be passed from parent to child, inherited as traits rather than shared as common social situations. (For an interesting discussion of the relevant social moral epistemology, see Buchanan 2007.)
Racist, sexist, and classist assumptions pervaded the discourse. Alarm calls were raised about the lower birth rates among white Protestant Americans compared to the large immigrant Catholic populations of Italian and Irish descent. German scientists and policymakers visited the United States to learn from their methods, and when the Nazis came to power in Germany, they began eugenic policies of their own. Early German policies called for involuntary euthanasia of people in institutions whose physical or mental illnesses were considered incurable. Such individuals were considered to have “lives unworthy of life” (lebensunwertes Leben). The Nazis also encouraged selective breeding for Aryan traits (e.g., athletic, blond and blue-eyed). This policy quickly expanded to include bans on marriage between particular groups, forced sterilization, and then internment in concentration camps for individuals belonging to groups deemed inferior (i.e., people who were disabled, homosexual, diagnosed with psychiatric conditions, communists, considered to be Roma/gypsies, and/or Jewish). The purported aim was to promote the “health” of the German population by controlling those who were “unhealthy.” Prisoners faced extremely hard labor, medical experimentation that was torturous and designed to test the limits of the human body (Lifton 1986) and daily degradation and abuse. Eventually, Nazis escalated their eugenic program to the “final solution” of death camps, ultimately killing more than six million Jewish people in the name of promoting Germany's health.
Following the end of WWII, the term “eugenic” was so closely associated with the horrific programs of Nazi Germany that eugenics societies across the world changed their names (e.g., the American Eugenics Society became the Society for the Study of Social Biology) and tempered their aims. Yet many of the same practices and beliefs continued under a different guise. Involuntary eugenic sterilizations of “feeble-minded” women in a variety of states didn't officially end until the 1970s, and may continue covertly in some state institutions. California had the highest rate of involuntary sterilizations, which were widely performed on prison inmates, people in mental institutions, and women considered to be bad mothers. Such sterilizations were motivated by both perceived individual and social goods, but had deep-seated prejudice as well as scientific inaccuracies built into their assumptions (Stern 2005). Concepts of “feeble-mindedness” were historically entangled in deeply problematic ways with ideas of race, class and gender (Stubblefield 2007).
Later, attempts to promote positive eugenics were renewed with the creation of the Repository for Germinal Choice, a sperm bank created in 1978 with the idea of collecting sperm from Nobel laureates, others deemed “geniuses” and Olympic level athletes. Given the availability of in vitro fertilization, women could now choose to reproduce with men presumed to have high-quality genes, without needing to form relationships with them. Although most Nobel prizewinners proved reluctant to donate to the sperm bank, the general idea took off. Even today, print and online ads in college newspapers regularly request sperm or eggs from donors who meet certain qualifications for health, intelligence, athleticism and/or attractiveness. Individuals or couples who require gamete donation to reproduce can shop around for a donor who meets their criteria.
The widespread practice of prenatal genetic testing (traditionally through chorionic villus sampling or amniocentesis in the second trimester of pregnancy, but now more routinely done through non-invasive blood tests in the first trimester, at least as a first screen), similarly presents the opportunity for individuals or couples to identify genes or genetic markers for traits they prefer for their fetuses not to have. If prenatal testing identifies an undesired gene, prospective parents may choose to continue the pregnancy, or to abort the fetus, often with the plan to later attempt a new pregnancy. Studies suggest that in the United States, 90% of “positive” diagnoses from prenatal testing result in abortion (Rothschild 2005). With the advent of pre-implantation genetic diagnosis, prospective parents can choose to use in vitro fertilization, and then test early cells of the created embryos to identify embryos with genes they prefer, or prefer to avoid. In this way, they avoid the potential need for abortion by choosing to implant only embryos that contain the desired genes. The aim of this practice certainly appears eugenic, though without an obviously coercive structure, and for the benefit of the individual family. The profession of genetic counseling, started in the 1990s, provides prospective parents with detailed information about the meaning of the tests, and the opportunity for discussion of test results. In part due to concerns about eugenic overtones, genetic counseling is built on a policy of “non-directiveness” to ensure that the reproductive autonomy of prospective parents is respected. That tenet of genetic counseling has been challenged by scholars who argue that we ought to balance parental autonomy with the child's future autonomy (see, e.g., Davis 2010).
Finally, advances in genetic technology suggest the possibility that our ability to test for (if not manipulate directly) a much larger array of genes and genetic markers related to a wide variety of diseases and traits may be on the near horizon. Prenatal testing panels currently include attention to conditions such as Trisomy 13, Trisomy 18, Trisomy 21 (Down Syndrome), Tay-Sachs, and more. Yet we allow adults to be tested for genetic markers linked to late onset disorders such as breast cancer, Huntington's disease, and Alzheimer's disease. Should such genetic tests be available on prenatal testing panels if parents request them? Or for all prospective parents who request prenatal testing? What about other additions that might be of interest to particular parents, even if the genetic linkages to the particular traits are less direct or even only mildly predictive: diabetes, obesity, homosexuality, or psychiatric conditions such as bipolar disorder or schizophrenia? (Informative discussions of the expansion of genetic testing can be found in Davis 2010 and Botkin 2003.) Deciding how to deal with the vast array of potentially genetically-linked markers—as a society, and potentially as individual prospective parents—is a monumental task that requires clarity about the benefits and drawbacks of testing, and requires us to revisit the meaning of eugenics, and the problems associated with it.
A much simpler and more clearly linked trait of interest is chromosomal sex. In the United States, parents can choose to find out their fetus's chromosomal sex via amniocentesis, or through an increasing number of early first trimester blood tests. In the U.K., by contrast, parents typically do not learn the sex of their fetus until birth, a policy put in place by the Human Fertility and Embryology Authority (HFEA) with the aim of avoiding sex discrimination and shoring up the line between genetic intervention for disease and non-disease traits. One of the concerns raised by critics of sex selection is what Mary Ann Warren deemed gendercide, in her book of the same name (Warren 1985). Indeed, evidence from around the world suggests a relatively strong bias in favor of male children (South Korea is now an exception), or at least male children first (Davis 2010). China and India, countries where cultural norms and practices still decidedly favor men, are facing significant sex ratio imbalances as a result of the use of technologies (and non-technical practices such as infanticide) to select against girls (for a discussion, see Davis 2010: Chapter 5). In response to concerns about sex ratios and underlying sexism, the American Congress of Obstetricians and Gynecologists (ACOG) has recommended a policy of only allowing sex selective interventions to be used to avoid sex-linked diseases, or for “family balancing” purposes (e.g., only for the second child in a family)(ACOG 2007). Concerns about the uses of sex selective technologies against a background of unjust sexism (see Bayles 1984; Rogers et al. 2007) illustrate the difficulties of arguing straightforwardly for unfettered reproductive choice about the traits of children.
As this short history should make clear, past, state-run, involuntary eugenic endeavors have been unjust and socially disastrous. Yet certain practices that have eugenic features continue today, albeit framed differently. Prenatal testing and preimplantation genetic diagnosis, for instance, are understood to enhance patient choice and expand prenatal knowledge, even as they are clearly used by prospective parents to determine which individuals should come into existence. Should they be considered eugenic practices? Is that necessarily morally troubling? As technological advances push us to figure out how many more, if any, kinds of genes and genetic markers we ought to be able to test for or choose prenatally, we may need to reassess our current practices to explore their justifications, and sort through the ways in which they are eugenic and potentially morally troubling.
Advocates of liberal eugenics intend to distinguish it from troubling historical predecessors by highlighting four main differences. First, it is individual in nature rather than state-sponsored. The intended benefit of any eugenic intervention is individual/private welfare (that of the child-to-be, or of the family), rather than the welfare of the state as a whole. Second, it is premised on individual liberty, the freedom of parents to choose according to their own values and conceptions of the good life. The state does not mandate contraception, sterilization, prenatal testing, abortion, or any other form of eugenic intervention (note: there are potential exceptions in which judges or states have offered long-term contraception such as Norplant as a condition of probation related to a criminal offense or for the continued provision of welfare, see e.g., Dresser 1996). Rather, it allows individuals to choose among a range of alternatives. Third, it presumes value pluralism, recognizing that individual parents will often desire different things for their offspring. This means allowing others to choose in ways that we ourselves would not, in the interest of preserving a liberal society that is neutral about particular conceptions of the good. The aim of a liberal eugenic program is to expand reproductive choices for individuals, in contrast to the historical eugenic programs that clearly cut off reproductive options for many. (That said, even liberal eugenics advocates typically presume that some limits would need to be in place, to ensure that prospective parents could not act in ways clearly contrary to the interests of their future children, or in ways that seem clearly vicious; how and where those limits would be set are intensely controversial, as will be discussed below.) Finally, advocates of liberal eugenics highlight the difference between the kind and quality of the science underlying the reproductive policies. Past eugenic programs relied on views of race, intelligence, and genetics that were, from our current perspective, “hopelessly wrong” (Agar 2004: 7). A cursory summary of these kinds of distinctions between old and “new” eugenics can be found in Caplan 2004, and the same collection of distinctions underlies most liberal or “new” eugenic arguments.
Many theorists argue in favor of permitting parents to make choices about their children's genetics, while explicitly arguing against any obligation to improve or enhance their children. Such arguments run the gamut from a completely laissez-faire market system—or “genetic supermarket”—of the sort considered by Robert Nozick (1974: 315) to a more highly regulated system, with controls to protect the well-being of future children as well as socially valued goods (e.g., rough equality, efforts to eliminate discrimination) that might be put at risk in a completely free market environment. Common to these arguments is a presumption that treatment of disease may be obligatory, while enhancement is not. (For an excellent discussion of this distinction and its problems, see Parens 1998a.)
Liberal eugenics arguments often start by recognizing the value of treatment of disease. Disease, typically defined as a negative departure from species typical functioning (Boorse 1975; Daniels 1994), can interfere with an individual's participation in society and/or individual flourishing. Buchanan et al. (2000) link disease to a reduction of opportunity, and so argue that provision of medical treatment for disease is a way for the state to promote equality of opportunity. Parents are obliged to ensure that their children get medical treatment for disease, and can be charged with negligence if they fail to do so. Only diseases that result in relatively small negative effects on participation (e.g., mild asthma) or where the overall benefits of treatment are still somewhat uncertain (e.g., some cancer treatments) can go untreated. Parents whose conceptions of the good life do not include medical treatment for disease—as in some religious communities—are not allowed to impose this view on their children, because the children deserve the opportunity to choose to adopt those views or not when they are adults. Mandatory life-saving treatment of their childhood diseases helps to ensure that they survive to make such decisions as adults (Feinberg 1980). This requirement has been the subject of some debate (see, e.g., DesAutels, Battin and May 1999).
Buchanan et al. (2000) note that as technology advances, theories of justice need no longer consider “natural inequalities” to be given, or outside the scope of distribution. If equality of opportunity is one of the aims of a society, then, provision of certain forms of genetic intervention—including interventions that determine who will be brought into existence—may become owed to future people. If parents can decide between implanting an embryo that carries a genetic marker associated with a serious disease— e.g., Tay Sachs—or an embryo without that marker, they would be obliged to choose the latter, in the name of promoting the health and well-being of the future child (impersonally, perhaps, given the non-identity problem). To be clear, though, they do not suggest that all prospective parents would be obliged to seek reproductive counseling and use in vitro fertilization in order to fulfill their parenting or impersonal duties. Such a requirement would be overly demanding on parents and an infringement on their procreative liberty, and would be unlikely to succeed in any case, given the prohibitive costs and relatively low success rates of IVF treatment. Most liberal eugenics advocates (Agar 2004; Glover 2006; Green 2007) move from a commonly accepted position of the requirement to treat serious diseases in children, to a requirement for people using genetic interventions (e.g., pre-implantation genetic diagnosis or perhaps one day technology to create “designer babies”) in reproduction to use them in ways that avoid serious diseases. The obligation doesn't extend to mandates on prenatal testing or abortion to avoid giving birth to a child with a serious disease, because of considerations related to women's rights to their bodies and religious freedom.
Treatments for disease aside, liberal eugenics advocates recognize that many prospective parents may be interested in enhancing their children. Why settle for the likelihood of normal functioning if one could safely engineer improvements in functioning? At least two reasons lead most such theorists to stop short of advocating a moral obligation to enhance. First, there is the difficulty of determining just what counts as an improvement (beyond addressing serious disease). Second, many see value in diversity and in allowing many Millian “experiments in living” to take place. For instance, Agar (2004) questions whether it is obviously better for a child to be highly intelligent (roughly approximated by a likely IQ of 160). Might some parents reasonably choose a more moderate level of intelligence for a child, presuming he will have greater social opportunities in the latter case? Perhaps the overall freedom of the child of moderate intelligence will be greater than that of the child with high intelligence, even though on that one dimension his capacities are comparatively lower. Erik Parens' provocatively titled essay—“Is Better Always Good?” (Parens 1998a)—suggests we may have reason to question the general notion that adding more of a capacity is good. The chapters in Parens' edited volume Enhancing Human Traits (Parens 1998b) point to a variety of ways the enhancement project might be misled by a seemingly valuable target that ends up producing negative effects or undermining other values we cherish. Additionally, even if many people agree on the value of an enhancement and it becomes so common that practically its possession is required for equal participation in society, we might want to resist the temptation to make that intervention obligatory. For example, Agar (2004: 85) suggests this might happen with the trait “being somewhat happier than is now normal” if treatment tied to 5-HTTLPR, a genetic marker associated with upbeat temperament, became common. The now-typical temperament is not a disease, but a mere variety within the capacious normal range of functioning, and would likely remain so even in a future society of 5-HTTLPR-enhanced people. A liberal eugenics cannot mandate any one view of the good life for its citizens.
Still, even mere permissibility to use genetic enhancements raises significant moral concerns. Critics fear obsessively focused prospective parents who design their children in ways that are overbearing or narrowly focused on a particular goal of the parents (Kass 2003; Sandel 2007). To avoid this problem, liberal eugenics advocates propose various limits on genetic interventions for enhancement purposes. There is widespread agreement that interventions should not harm the future child (by creating a life so miserable as to be not worth living, as might be the subject of a wrongful life suit). Beyond that, variations include, for instance: (1) only enhancements that will benefit the future children no matter what life plan they decide to pursue and that do not reinforce problematic social norms (Agar 2004), or (2) only enhancements that preserve a child's right to an open future (Davis 2010), or (3) only enhancements that preserve open futures and protect some central core of our human nature (Glover 2006), or (4) only enhancements that rational people will agree can be understood to be in the best interest of the child (Green 2007).
How might one harm a child through choosing genetic traits? Perhaps by selecting for traits that clearly cause significant suffering and a typically short life span (e.g., Tay-Sachs disease, Lesch-Nyan syndrome). Such a requirement may seem a bit unnecessary, given that most parents do not intentionally desire painful states for their children, and would not seek to engineer them in this way. Also, relatively few genetic conditions will be so inherently debilitating as to make life obviously miserable, to the extent that one could not say that life is, on balance, a benefit.
The more contentious territory has to do with choosing between lives that would be worth living, but have different features. How might we ensure a child's capacity to choose from a variety of life plans, or the right to an open future? Davis argues that “parents ought not deliberately to substantively constrain the ability of their children to make a wide variety of life choices when they become adults” (Davis 2010: 84). In other words, if they use genetic interventions in reproduction, they must not use them to narrow the range of options their child will likely have. So parents' choices must not substantively diminish the future options for their children, though they might in some way alter the range or nature of those futures possibilities. For Agar, the phrasing is slightly different: parents must not “infringe on a child's ability to choose a life plan and to successfully pursue it” (2004: 102). He employs Sen's capabilities approach, identifying various important human capabilities that individuals ought to have, and can then decide whether or not to exercise as they pursue their chosen life plans.
Davis and Agar both point to deafness as a useful case for clarification. If hearing is a core human capacity, or even if it is simply necessary for a wide variety of life plans, then engineering a child to be deaf will limit that child's future options. This is not, of course, to say that deaf individuals cannot live rewarding lives in which they flourish. Indeed, Agar recognizes that in some circumstances, lacking a capacity like hearing will only lead to a small difference in relative freedom, and if so, then we might not have a “general requirement to replace genetic arrangements linked with deafness” (2004: 105). On his view, prospective parents could engineer a child to be hearing because it would increase her real freedom, but could not engineer a child to be deaf, though they might be permitted to leave a deaf fetus/child deaf. Weighing in on the now widely analyzed case of two Deaf (the capital “D” marks membership in the linguistic-cultural group of the Deaf; a small “d” only signifies the physical state of the body) women who sought out a deaf sperm donor in hopes of having a deaf child (Spriggs 2002; Mundy 2002), Agar argues that they reduced their child's real freedom by attempting to ensure that he would be deaf. (One might still wonder whether their method of reproducing should even count as an enhancement technology for Agar, given that had one of the women simply partnered with the deaf man, the genetic deafness of their child would not be an issue of engineering.) Davis, too, acknowledges the claims of Deaf culture, and the reasons parents might prefer to have a child more like themselves, but argues that deliberately trying to conceive a child who will have relatively limited options—limited, in her view, not just due to enduring discrimination and social constraints, but also to bodily deficits—is morally impermissible.
A somewhat different argument is offered by Green (2007), who rejects the “right to an open future” language, in part because he thinks parents must be allowed to do things that are more for their own interests than for the sake of their children, even when doing so affects how the children develop. He argues that parents are allowed to
mold the child's nature in directions shaped by the parents' own hopes for their child, including the use of gene modification… [W]ithin limits, parents have the right to impose their dreams on a child. (2007: 127)
Following William Ruddick, he thinks of parents as both guardians and gardeners (2007: 125)—protecting their children so that they can grow as they will, but also shaping how they grow in line with the parents' hopes. Because he thinks “parental love almost always prevails” (2007: 114)—when we are faced with the actual child of ours, we will (typically) love it, regardless of its traits—he finds it morally acceptable that parents might want to choose traits for their children that do not strictly speaking preserve an open future. If parents want a child with a good shot at an athletic career, for instance, why not allow them to engineer for athleticism or great vision? Doing so might narrow other life opportunities, but not to the extent that the child couldn't choose how his life goes. His future would still be open enough.
Green emphasizes parental reproductive autonomy, and the continuum between shaping the future possibilities for our existing children through parental values, education, religion, and more, and doing so through genetic interventions. Although he acknowledges the possibility that
subtle types of pressure that the critics fear—coercion from non-governmental actors and self-coercion as parents race to keep up with the Joneses—could happen, (2007: 164)
he dismisses these worries as overstated, and not significantly different from pressures we already experience and apparently find acceptable. Green's central recommendation, then, is that genetic interventions should be aimed at what is reasonably in the child's best interests (2007: 216), recognizing that the parents' own interests are also relevant. By “reasonably” he means that
it is not enough for parents to think that something is in their child's best interests; their judgment must accord with that of most other informed members of society; (2007: 216)
once that condition is satisfied, parents would be permitted to choose, according to their own tastes and preferences, within a wide range of options of relatively “all-purpose” traits (2007: 218). Just who the “informed” members of society are, is of course, a matter of some contention (for discussion, see Hayry 2010).
Children's future options can, of course, be limited due to the makeup of their bodies, or to the unwelcoming or oppressive social situations into which they are born, or both. Given the history of eugenics, most liberal eugenics advocates recognize the need to attend carefully to unjust social circumstances and to control for existing bias. For instance, if we could change a child's future sexuality through genetic intervention, it might appear that we should permit parents to engineer in either direction, because heterosexuality and homosexuality both permit the successful pursuit of a wide variety of life plans. But if we attend to current social situations, we will recognize that homophobia is still common in many quarters, despite advances in anti-discrimination legislation and improvements in at least some conscious attitudes, and people who identify as homosexual are more likely to experience social ostracism, bullying, and physical assault. As such, engineering a homosexual child might appear to decrease a child's future options in this society. Thus, if we take the social situation into account, we would only allow engineering to create heterosexual children. Yet doing so would “end up colluding with prejudice, worsening its effects” (Agar 2004: 109–110).
Given existing social norms—even those that are unjust—one might worry that a “free market” approach to genetic enhancement of future children would result in pressure toward homogeneity. Parents who are free to choose characteristics for their offspring may be inclined to choose similarly, either because they agree (perhaps wrongly) that those characteristics are better, or because they worry their child will be at a substantial disadvantage relative to other children if they choose what is unpopular (or simply fail to intervene to ensure what is popular). If so, societal pressures on parental choices will have effects similar to policies enforced by a state—homogeneity of traits selected across the population. In this case, it appears that enhancement technologies “will grant racism and homophobia an unprecedented efficacy” (Agar 2004: 148) and as such, “concern for prospective welfare may result in genocide by stealth” (2004: 149). Davis (2010) shares this kind of concern, but focuses more on sex selection than selection in respect to sexual orientation.
One way to address this problem is to note that some characteristics will only be harmful to the individual in a morally defective social environment, while others will be harmful regardless of the environment (e.g., for Agar, this gets to the difference between genetic markers linked to homosexuality and deafness, respectively, 2004: 151). In the first case, we seem to misdiagnose the problem if we think altering the genome will help address it. What we need to do instead is change attitudes and social practices. In the second case, however, he argues that the condition itself (deafness) limits options for the child, even if we can recognize some of the disadvantages of the condition to be social.
We might nevertheless think it could be permissible to use genetic engineering to address social problems, if the genetic interventions are at hand and would reduce some suffering, and the social solutions are distant and rather unlikely. For instance, Agar acknowledges that it would be preferable to eliminate racism (2004: 155), but given how entrenched it is in many societies, he considers whether we might want to allow some genetic interventions (e.g., engineering lighter skin tone) that could help individuals avoid suffering from it. Ultimately, however, he claims that we should not allow this kind of genetic engineering—not simply because it seems to collude with a morally defective social environment, but because it reinforces and perhaps exacerbates that environment (it undermines work toward changing the morally defective social environment) (2004: 156–157).
Green also recommends against interventions that would reinforce or increase unjust inequality and discrimination, economic inequality, or racism (2007: 216–226), but he does so with some reservations. Parents understandably might want to reduce social burdens on their children through genetic interventions, and if we make doing so illegal, they will likely go elsewhere or underground to get what they want. He also—optimistically—suggests that stereotypes and fashions ebb and flow, and may be self-corrective (2007: 227).
Some advocates of liberal eugenics more carefully explore the possibility that our current social norms might be “morally defective” in respect to disability. For instance, Glover defends the permissibility of parental choice within some limits, but he investigates just what counts as a disability. He proposes that a disability involves a functional limitation that “impairs the capacity for human flourishing” (2006: 9), either by itself or in conjunction with social disadvantage. Thus, although racism results in social disadvantage, having dark skin is not itself a disability, because it has no associated functional limitation. Some conditions previously considered disabilities—e.g., achondroplasia—need not be disabilities at all, according to this view (for more on achondroplasia, see Miller 2006 and Davis 2010). Glover understands “functional limitations” as a contrast to normal human functioning, a species-based notion that itself involves significant degrees of variation and the matter of setting (rather than discovering) boundaries. As such, “normal” is not purely statistical, but also partly normative (see also Buchanan et al. 2000). Glover recognizes the conceptual messiness of “normal functioning” but still prefers it to alternatives. If an individual prefers a bodily state that might otherwise count as a functional limitation (his example is Asperger's syndrome), then it isn't a disability for her (2006: 14); it doesn't affect her flourishing. He is much less sanguine about blindness and deafness. Both conditions, he suggests, confer significant functional limitations, and although they can certainly allow individuals to have lives of great worth and flourishing—he explores conflicting first person accounts about going blind and gaining sight to explore the positive sides of the conditions and the negative side of normalizing (2006: 15–22)—he concludes that they are nonetheless disabilities that confer clear disadvantages (related to navigation, safety, etc.). As such, they can be understood to be disabilities that are understandably acceptable to some, but that ought not be chosen for future children. Such future children, like their parents, might be able to flourish with the condition, but engineering it means intentionally impairing at least some capacities commonly relevant to flourishing. Interestingly, Glover concludes that the Deaf lesbian couple who sought a deaf sperm donor did nothing wrong in conceiving their deaf child (the child cannot be harmed by his clearly worthwhile existence), but he argues they would be wrong in not giving him a cochlear implant if the technology were perfected (2006: 26). Glover's attention to the difficulty of defining disability is helpful, and he emphasizes the importance of taking seriously the perspectives of people who have lived with the disabilities in question. Such first person accounts are, however, but one source of information about the relative value of the condition in question.
A different sort of societal harm that might follow from the permissibility of genetic enhancement is increasing polarization between people who have the finances to afford genetic enhancements, and those who do not. The wealthy already have advantages; if we allow them to give their children genetic enhancements—such that they are smarter, faster, stronger, and with less need to sleep, etc.—they will be ever more competitive, and liable to increase the divide between rich and poor. (Lee Silver explores this dystopian possibility with the GenRich and the Naturals in his Remaking Eden, 1997.) One way to avoid the problem would be to attempt to make genetic enhancements available to all, at least for enhancements that offer significant advantages (Buchanan 2011). Traits that only offer positional advantages—being taller than, perhaps faster than—would then be self-defeating (Buchanan et al. 2000) if available to all, and the allure might fade. Other traits—perhaps enhanced concentration, memory, or immunity—might be advantageous regardless of how many people have them. Providing funding to improve accessibility would then be necessary in order to ensure fairness. Many proponents of liberal eugenics treat the threat of polarization as a relatively minor concern. For example, Green (2007) notes that all innovations have a period of diffusion, during which early adopters pay higher prices and take some risks for the potential of leading the way forward, and then, if the technology is successful, prices drop and the wider public gains access through the market. In Beyond Humanity, Buchanan compares genetic intervention to literacy, numeracy and agriculture: these innovations were only available to a few at the start, but that does not take away from their great benefits to humanity.
In addition to considering concerns about social effects of genetic enhancement related to homogeneity and polarization, Glover also looks at whether we need to resist some forms of genetic enhancement in order to defend a “central core of human nature” (2006: 81). What might that be? Not simply all the functional states we currently have—those could well change over time, perhaps for the better. Indeed, some advocates of liberal eugenics are particularly attentive to the “status quo bias” (Green 2007; Bostrom and Ord 2006) and likely unjustifiable intuitions that our present nature is worth preserving (Buchanan 2011). Nonetheless, Glover proposes two potential features of great value in our current nature: our capacity to rein in our violent and destructive tendencies, and our capacity to aim for a good life (for Glover, this is about a balance between happiness and flourishing). These are very tentatively offered, with many qualifications about possible linkages to other traits of value, and the likelihood that we might be more successful in securing containment through non-genetic means. Still, the suggestion is that if parents might be tempted to select for genetic markers linked to, for instance, extreme selfishness or emotional coldness, in an attempt to have their child succeed in gaining power and riches, doing so would seem to endanger parts of our nature that we can widely agree are deeply valuable for society as a whole. Therefore, on Glover's view, even a liberal eugenics should exclude such choices.
In sum, theorists who argue for the permissibility of genetic enhancement emphasize the need to protect the future child's options, so long as doing so does not reinforce unjust social prejudices or threaten deeply held core values. At the same time, they seek to preserve parental reproductive autonomy, and to expand rather than reduce parental options. One problem with this thesis, to be explored more in depth below in the section on critiques, is the appropriate scope of its central claims. Some critics (e.g., Asch 2000; Saxton 2000; Sparrow 2005), for instance, suggest that it fails to recognize that many of the presumptions about social prejudice could be extended to prejudice against people with disabilities, many of whom live relatively well with traits or characteristics that genetic enhancers may well desire to eliminate or attempt to improve upon. If we ought not collude with and exacerbate the social prejudices of sexism and racism through our reproductive genetic choices, why is doing the same for ableist norms permissible? The cynical critic might wonder if there are, in fact, any traits that will meet the criteria for being relatively all-purpose enhancements (Sparrow 2011b; Trommelmans 2006). Other critics express concern about the meaning and value of relative freedom, particularly when identifying what counts as a decrease in freedom seems to depend significantly on the positioning and values of the particular prospective parent or cultural community (Sparrow 2005). When one parent insists that getting rid of a trait will increase her child's relative freedom and the group of people who live with that trait point to the ways that the choice contributes to and reinforces social prejudice against their group (Lane and Grodin 1997; Saxton 2000; Asch 2000), how are we to proceed with the regulation of “liberal” eugenics?
Agar forthrightly declares,
I have argued that the addition of the word “liberal” to “eugenics” transforms an evil doctrine into a morally acceptable one. (2004: 135)
For him, that single word changes the fundamental assumptions about how and why genetic interventions are pursued. Liberal states remain neutral about what constitutes the good life, but impose certain restrictions (laws, policies) and offer education or aid (public health campaigns, food stamps) in the name of ensuring that citizens are safe, relatively stable, and have equal opportunity to pursue their goals. But critics point out the many ways that a collection of individual choices, pressured by unjust social norms and assumptions, may lead to results not wholly unlike those of historical eugenics programs (Duster 1990). They fear that regulations put in place by advocates—whether in the form of laws, restrictions of the use of federal or state funds, or mere recommendations or guidelines from medical societies—will not be sufficient to avoid the negative consequences of eugenic enhancement. Green optimistically suggests, in the final line of his book, “By moving responsibly into this emerging era of genetic choice, we can incorporate gene technology into the ongoing human adventure” (2007: 230). Groups who have experienced significant discrimination over many generations will understandably reject such optimism. Such groups have more to fear, however, from those who do not merely argue for permission to enhance, but for an obligation to do so.
Other advocates of liberal eugenics (e.g., Harris 2000, 2007; Savulescu 2001; Kahane and Savulescu 2008) recognize the potential benefits of genetic enhancement, and forthrightly argue in favor of moral obligations to pursue them. Some such enhancements might be relatively minor, while others might be radical enough to eventually create a new species (Glover 2006). These arguments for the obligation to enhance tend to arise in the context of consequential moral reasoning, but with a libertarian qualification. According to early work by Savulescu, for instance, parents have an obligation to produce the best children possible, but the state need not (indeed, should not) legally coerce them to do so (Savulescu 2001). To the contrary, the state must balance the benefits of potential enforcement against its existing obligations to protect reproductive liberties. Nonetheless, the state might have good reason to encourage parents to take such action, through education and persuasive campaigns (not unlike anti-smoking campaigns). On this stronger view, others, too, would be right to express disapproval:
Egregious procreative choices deserve our disapproval just like other failures to meet one's obligations, such as failure to protect the welfare of one's children. (Kahane and Savulescu 2008: 278)
A similar position is advocated by Harris (2007). Although the arguments are about a moral obligation to enhance, the authors recognize that other competing priorities (e.g., autonomy of parents, welfare of other siblings, harm to others) could potentially trump this obligation.
Savulescu's early paper on the obligation to intervene genetically argued for a seemingly perfectionist stance—if we decide to reproduce, we are morally obligated to have the best children we, as parents, can have. His Principle of Procreative Beneficence (PPB) holds that
couples (or single reproducers) should select the child, of the possible children they could have, who is expected to have the best life, or at least as good a life as the others, based on the relevant available information. (2001: 415)
This obligation can't be owed to any particular child (given the non-identity problem), but is an impersonal obligation, to make the world a better place. If parents are using pre-implantation genetic diagnosis, they should always choose the embryo with the best chances at the best life. If our best genetic information suggests that one embryo has a chance of mild asthma, and the other does not, and they are alike in other respects, Savulescu claims it is obvious that the parents should choose the embryo not inclined to asthma. He also offers a much longer list of traits that may have genetic markers, including bipolar disorder, alcoholism, aggression and criminal behavior, memory and intelligence, neuroticism, and maternal behavior (2001: 417). Why? Even if these are not all disease-genes, they are linked to conditions that can positively or negatively influence how a life will go. Savulescu imagines that the rational parent could make no other decision but to avoid the negative linkages and promote the positive ones, where possible.
Deciding which traits are positive, and of those, which are better than others, is a task that will not be simple. “The most advantaged child” is inherently comparative. Critics point to the difficulty of ranking the expected well-being of future possible lives, given 1) disagreement about what is positive and negative (and the need to contextualize that in a particular environmental and family situation), and 2) the reality that most embryos will have a complex mixture of positive and negative traits making meaningful pairwise comparisons very difficult (de Melo Martin 2004; Parker 2007). Kahane and Savulescu reply that we do this kind of ranking all the time, and that it needn't rely on a single vision of what a perfect child would be.
[A]iming at the best is compatible with thinking that the concept of the most advantaged life is plural and open-ended. If different forms of life are equally good, or if the amount of well-being realized in each is incomparable, then parents can reasonably choose either option. But there are plenty of cases where we can rank the goodness of lives. We do so in numerous moral decisions in everyday life, especially in bringing up and educating our children. (Kahane and Savulescu 2008: 279)
While this response suggests some greater flexibility in their view than might be apparent from the language of PPB, they do not always seem consistent in advocating for this flexibility. How will we know when different forms of life are equally good or when the associated well-being is incomparable? The fact that some cases will be very clear can be handled by the regulatory structure of a philosophical position that sets a relatively low bar; the space between ruling out selection for traits that clearly cause pain and suffering, for instance, and demanding those that create the “best”, is vast.
Rather than giving a substantive account of well-being (and offering a prima facie list of rankings), Kahane and Savulescu imply only that we will be able to find an agreeable one. They offer simple examples to illustrate their view. Mild asthma, though only a minor impediment to well-being, is nonetheless not acceptable to choose if we have the information, and an alternative without the mild asthma. Deafness is clearly a detriment to well-being—at least in this society—and so should not be selected. They are careful to add that their view can appreciate deafness, and recognize that it is clearly compatible with a good, even flourishing life. But a life without asthma or deafness, they submit, would clearly be better. Our obligation is to produce the best, not just a life compatible with flourishing. So they see the need for two steps: finding a reasonable theoretical model of well-being, and then investigating whether a particular trait or condition is, on balance, a detriment to overall well-being on that view (2008: 288).
Despite their confidence, we have reason to think there will be significant disagreement in both steps. A theory of well-being that is acceptable to most might be so abstract as to not offer significant help, and then the matter of determining how traits or conditions in question are related to expected well-being—such that we can do a comparison and select the best—will be even more difficult (Parker 2007). Parents who see value in a wide variety of ways of being in the world—both for the individual, and for society as a whole—may welcome children who have traits that are not standardly considered advantageous. (Consider positive accounts about raising children with Down syndrome, Berube 1998 and Estreich 2011, and even profound cognitive and physical disability, Kittay 1999). Welcoming such children who are “naturally” produced might be different from engineering them to be so, but Kahane and Savulescu go a step further. They admit that women need not undergo IVF treatment just for relatively negligible improvements in the life prospects of their future children, but
we believe that PB instructs women to seriously consider IVF if natural reproduction is likely to lead to a child with a condition that is expected to reduce well-being significantly, even if that condition is not a disease. This is clearest if natural reproduction is likely to result in a child disposed to, say, clinical depression or autism. But we believe that reproducers also have strong reasons to seek to prevent even an innate tendency to negative affect, or the severe impairment in social skills associated with Asperger's syndrome. (2008: 281)
The moral obligation to produce the best child one can, then, can include an obligation to take on the risks and impositions of IVF.
One worry regarding the obligation to produce the best child—particularly the best child in a particular society—is that unjust societal norms will then exert their force even more strongly. The “most advantaged” child in a sexist society is likely to be a boy. If the society is also racist and homophobic, that boy will be light skinned and heterosexual (see Sparrow 2011a). Interestingly, Kahane and Savulescu stand by PPB—there is a moral obligation to produce the best child, who would, in this case, be a light-skinned heterosexual boy—but they note that we have other moral reasons that outweigh the moral reasons offered by PPB in this case.
Parents shouldn't choose the fair skinned child because of the expected prejudice. It's better to change pernicious attitudes than to reinforce them through capitulation. (2008: 290)
How would we change the attitudes? Perhaps by education and anti-discrimination laws for existing people. For Kahane and Savulescu, it doesn't make sense to restrict access to genetic interventions regarding sex, sexuality or skin color, in order to ensure no such capitulation to these unjust norms. In his earlier paper, Savulescu (2001) notes that in a sexist society, we have to address the unfair treatment of women, but it doesn't make sense to do that through regulation of reproductive decision-making.
Reproduction should not become an instrument of social change, at least not mediated or motivated at a social level. This also illustrates why Procreative Beneficence is different to eugenics. Eugenics is selective breeding to produce a better population. A public interest justification for interfering in reproduction is different from Procreative Beneficence, which aims at producing the best child, of the possible children, a couple could have. That is an essentially private enterprise. (2001: 424)
Buchanan (2011) is broadly optimistic about biomedical enhancement technologies—seeing them as not significantly unlike other enhancing societal innovations, such as literacy, numeracy and agriculture— and argues in favor of funding research and development into a broad array of enhancements. While he mainly argues against conservative critics of bioenhancement (e.g,. Kass 2003; Sandel 2007; Fukuyama 2003), he also considers the likelihood of a shift from individual to social justifications of enhancement interventions. If biomedical enhancements that improve individual well-being become available, governments may rightly be interested in funding enhancements and perhaps even making them mandatory (2011: 128), because doing so will be socially good: good for economic growth to avoid problems of illiteracy, sickness, etc. that can accompany, for instance, lower intelligence and merely typical immune systems. Buchanan recommends the creation of a Global Institute for Justice in Innovation (2011: 255) in order to ensure that such benefits would be made more widely available, given that some individuals and governments would not otherwise be able to afford them. He recognizes that the social justification for enhancement, with the possibility of mandatory participation, starts to sound surprisingly like past eugenic policies, but he seems to think they are different, at least in part because individuals should benefit as well. Indeed, he explicitly states
To justify encouraging or even requiring biomedical enhancements, governments wouldn't have to resurrect the bad science and bizarre master-race theories that warped eugenic thinking. They would only have to appeal to the same reasons we all invoke when we justify public education, health insurance, public health measures like vaccination, and policies designed to help American business be more competitive in a global economy. (2011: 124)
If we think it makes sense to support these programs, the implication is that we ought to support genetic enhancements as well. The result might be mandatory enhancement for your own good—and that of society.
Other theorists likewise offer social benefit justifications for genetic enhancement. Elster (2011) advocates a principle of general procreative beneficence, changing the last part of Savulescu's PPB to an obligation to produce the best child, of those possible, “whose life will maximize the expected overall value in the world.” (2011: 483). Rather than focus on individual welfare, he recommends a system of obligations that starts from general social goods. Parents considering reproduction are then bound by a maximizing duty to the world.
Although Savulescu highlights the well-being of the individual in his work on PPB, in more recent work, the obligation to produce the best seems to have shifted from an obligation to improve the world by privately producing the best individuals, to an obligation to improve the world by producing individuals who will help to solve social problems. For instance, he argues with Persson (Persson and Savulescu 2012) that we are obligated to fund and explore moral bioenhancement (2012: 2)—the idea that we could genetically or pharmacologically enhance our moral motivation, to reduce selfishness and aggression, and increase our sense of fairness, altruism, and our willingness to cooperate (see also Douglas 2008). Given the massive threats to human well-being presented by global climate change and the abundance of weapons of mass destruction—and the fact that solutions to these large scale problems will require collective action to prevent future problems—Persson and Savulescu claim that traditional methods of moral change (e.g., education, public campaigns) will be unlikely to be effective. If we care to save the planet—and we should—then we are obligated to invest in moral bioenhancement research, and presumably ensure that if successful, it gets wide uptake (Persson and Savulescu 2012). Buchanan (2011) is sympathetic, noting that critics who worry about whether we will use this technology wisely may be short-sighted:
[I]f you think we should avoid enhancements because you think our present character is so flawed that we are bound to misuse them, you're assuming that our character is fixed. It may not be. (2011: 171)
This suggestion about moral bioenhancement has sparked criticism focused on threats to human freedom (Harris 2011; Simkulet 2013), the meaning of being virtuous (Kabasenche 2013), and the complexity of human moral psychology (Zarpentine 2011).
Critics of the argument regarding moral obligations to enhance are highly skeptical of the claim that such arguments can escape the charge of being problematically eugenic. Bennett (2008) notes:
[F]or all this well-meaning talk of liberalism and freedom, an obligation to bring to birth the best children possible arguably entails very “unliberal” notions and consequences. I argue that this obligation can only be established by placing a lower moral value on those with disabilities or otherwise impaired lives and, if accepted, this obligation, produces a strong argument in favour not only of infringing individual reproductive autonomy but also of introducing eugenic policies. (2008: 270)
Sparrow (2011a) is also sharply critical:
Only through a very particular and not especially plausible negotiation of the uneasy relationship between their moral theory and their policy prescriptions can Harris and Savulescu obscure the fact that the gap between the new and the old eugenics is not that large at all…[with] implications that most people would find profoundly unattractive. (2011a: 33)
Koch (2011) highlights similarities to past eugenic policies and accuses the central theorists of hubris—even a “huckster's promise” (p. 199)—in presuming not only that we will be able to engineer complex traits like intelligence, but that they can know the appropriate regulatory limits and speak for all parents. The title of Persson and Savulescu's book—Unfit for Life (2012)—combined with its thesis regarding the need for tightened controls on liberal societies in order to preserve human security, makes unavoidable comparisons to the Nazi idea of lives unworthy of life. (For a chilling review of Savulescu's recent work, see Munsterhjelm 2011.)
Criticisms of the trend toward advocating liberal eugenics—whether regarding permission or obligation—come from a variety of corners. Disability rights advocates highlight the problematic conceptions of disability that underlie many of the arguments as well as the negative effects liberal eugenics is likely to have on existing people with disabilities (Asch 1999; Saxton 2000; Amundson 2005). Other theorists—attentive to the pervasive unjust discrimination in respect to sexism, racism, classism, and heterosexism—emphasize the broadly negative consequences of promoting or allowing liberal eugenics policies, given the aggregation of many individual choices, and the slippery slope to an older style of coercive eugenics (Duster 1990; De Melo Martin 2004; Sparrow 2011a). Some highlight potential damage to the parent-child relationship in a world where particular features of children are chosen, fearing both a loss of openness to the unbidden and of unconditional love (Sandel 2007). When parents attempt to design their children, critics argue, they demonstrate a lack of humility in the face of nature, and more specifically, an attempt to control where they should instead appreciate novelty (Kass 2003).
The disability right critique of the “new” eugenics takes on current practices such as prenatal testing and selective abortion, as well as futuristic options such as enhancement and design.
In what is known as the expressivist argument, disability theorists have argued that prenatal testing followed by selective abortion sends a negative message—“It is better not to exist than to have a disability” (Saxton 2000), “We do not want any more like you” (Wendell 1996)—to existing people with disabilities, particularly those living with disabilities for which testing is routinely done. The negative message is harmful and might be considered a form of discrimination. The expressivist argument is often defended by theorists who are staunchly pro-choice about abortion; they typically defend a woman's legal right to choose abortion for any reason, but present a moral argument against particular reasons for abortion. In making this distinction, they rely on the “any/particular” distinction proposed by Asch (2000); a woman who does not want any child because she is not ready to be a mother is different from one who is eager to be a mother but then rejects this particular fetus, based on prenatal testing. A different version of the expressivist argument looks beyond the individual act of testing to focus on the social offer of prenatal testing, particularly in a society where it has become routinized, to consider the negative evaluation it expresses about the lives of existing people with disabilities (Press 2000).
Objections have been raised regarding the meaning of such “expressions” (see, for instance, Buchanan 1996; Nelson 2000), and the necessity of the message (Baily 2000; McMahan 2005), as well as the relative moral significance of the message even if it is negative and expressed (Edwards 2004). Many theorists emphasize that one can value the person with a disability, while devaluing the disability (Savulescu 2001; Glover 2006; McMahan 2005). Glover, for instance, is careful to note that we should be very clear about expressing support for existing people with disabilities even as we seek prenatal testing or other genetic interventions:
[W]e need to send a clear signal that we do not have the ugly attitudes about disability. It is important to show that what we care about is our children's flourishing: that this, and not shrinking from certain kinds of people, or some horrible project of cleansing the world of them, is what motivates us. To think that a particular disability makes someone's life less good is not one of the ugly attitudes. It does not mean that the person who has it is of any less value, or is less deserving of respect, than anyone else. (2006: 35)
That distinction however, can be difficult to accept for individuals who experience their disability as a central part of their identity (for discussion, see Wendell 1996; Saxton 2000; Edwards 2004). Furthermore, as Holm (2007) notes, even if we could conceptually separate prenatal testing from the disrespectful and discriminatory messages about people with disabilities, that doesn't mean they aren't deeply intertwined in the current practice.
Some disability rights advocates reject the expressivist argument, and are more concerned with the fairness and completeness of the information provided in the context of prenatal testing than in the practice as a whole (Shakespeare 2006). On that note, Klein (2011) finds evidence of “a disregard for disability experience and sustained ignorance of disability issues” in the attitudes, practices, education and research of professionals involved in administering prenatal testing. In sum, the expressivist argument highlights the ways in which prenatal testing feels threatening to people with disabilities and their allies/advocates. As Parens and Asch point out,
If one thinks for even a moment about the history of our society's treatment of people with disabilities, it is not difficult to appreciate why people identified with the disability rights movement might regard such testing as dangerous. … living with disabling traits need not be detrimental either to an individual's prospects of leading a worthwhile life, or to the families in which they grow up, or to society at large. (2000: 4)
The expressivist argument applies equally to the use of pre-implantation diagnosis, and similar concerns about misperceptions regarding potential quality of life for people with disabilities or non-typical modes of functioning apply to the quest for enhancement technologies as well.
Part of what concerns disability rights advocates is the questionable relation between the existence of certain impairments or bodily anomalies and the availability of equality of opportunity or well-being (Silvers, Wasserman, and Mahowald 1998; Amundson 2005; Asch and Wasserman 2005) that seems to be a common presumption in liberal eugenics theories. Broadly, they worry that many theorists are relatively uninformed about the life experiences of people with disabilities, or unfairly dismissive of their claims (Amundson 2005; Goering 2008), and thus rely on an overly negative evaluation of their quality of life. As such, efforts to promote “good birth” undervalue existing people with disabilities. Additionally, advocates of liberal eugenics, it is argued, allow one trait to stand in for all of what a potential person can be (Asch and Wasserman 2005), and underestimate the value of human diversity that includes non-standard modes of human functioning linked to disability (Silvers 1998), and the possibility of “gains” made possible through living with disability (Garland-Thomson 2012). (For more discussion, see SEP entries on disability: definitions, models, experience; and feminist perspectives on disability.)
Other critics point to potentially troubling assumptions in the theoretical framework of liberal eugenics. Bennett, for instance, looks at whether an appeal to impersonal or non-person-affecting harm can get us out of the non-identity problem without resorting to troubling social justifications for a purportedly individualistic eugenics. She claims,
What this obligation [for PPB] is built on is an idea of making the world a better place than it could otherwise have been, not in terms of any individual person's welfare, but in terms of creating the greatest total score for what is regarded as the goods of life. If a project is not interested in the welfare of particular people but in creating what those proposing this project believe is the best world possible, then this is exactly what eugenics is—promoting social and not personal goods. (Bennett 2008: 272)
So, even though advocates of procreative beneficence claim to value people equally (while acknowledging that their lives can go better or worse), this does not square with the idea of some worlds being morally preferable simply because they do not contain even mild disabilities.
Sparrow (2011a) targets the arguments for an obligation to enhance by pointing to the “profound tension” between their consequential justifications and assurances about the preservation of reproductive liberties. For example, he highlights the fact that in order to get out of the problem of colluding with unjust social norms—which he does by admitting that in certain cases parents ought not choose the “best” child for their social environment, given sexism, racism, etc.—Savulescu must revert to attending to social consequences, rather than individual welfare. Liberal eugenics is supposed to be about promoting individual well-being.
As soon as we begin sacrificing the well-being of individuals for the sake of social goals, such as diversity, we are firmly back in the territory of old eugenics. (2011a: 35–36)
Sparrow also questions the justification for the assumption that parents ought to have the best child they could have. If we are morally obligated to produce the best, and if any embryos we can produce are not likely to rank very high relative to those of others, wouldn't there also be an obligation to use a donated embryo (or a clone of the embryo that is the best) (Sparrow 2011a)? To be fair, Savulescu argues that other moral reasons can trump the PPB, and some degree of reproductive autonomy will surely fit there. Sparrow limits his criticism to what we are apparently morally obligated to do under the PPB, pointing to the odd consequences of the maximizing feature of the principle. Finally, Sparrow suggests that even if advocates of an obligation to enhance—like Savulescu and Harris—deny any requirement for the government to coerce individuals to participate in genetic interventions for the sake of enhancement, governments might be obligated to implement policies that are not strictly coercive, e.g., systems of incentives and targeted health campaigns. Doing so would be a form of state-sponsored control—even if only through non-coercive pressure—of reproduction, and thus much more like troubling old-style eugenics.
A further concern about the general framing of the “best child” obligation regards the possibility of creating a clear ranked list of traits. To identify the best possible child with the best possible chance at life one must not simply have a general view of traits that can make life go well or poorly. Rather, one must be able to rank collections of such traits in relation to their capacity to bring about the best possible life. The limited information we get from prenatal testing or preimplantation diagnosis could incline parents toward particular choices, but would be underdetermining for identifying the best possible child. Parker notes that
[C]omplex concepts, such as those of the good life, the best life, and human flourishing, are not reducible to simple elements or constituent parts which might be identified through the testing of embryos. (Parker 2007: 281)
Further, given the diversity of preferences for different combinations of traits and beliefs about how they relate to the likelihood of a good life—given differing conceptions of the good life—it is difficult to envision how rationality could point us to only one best possible child. Even if many circumstances produce a variety of equally good possible options, as Savulescu suggests, identifying what makes that set of options equally good is not clear. Parker takes this objection to show that while parents might have an obligation to consider whether a child they bring into existence will have a reasonable chance at a good life, it does not require them to produce the best possible child.
A third variety of critic highlights what might be called the troubling aggregate effect of individual choices, particularly when they are often ill-informed or relatively biased (De Melo Martin 2004; Goering 2000). Such theorists need not be against all forms of enhancement, but they emphasize the need for strict regulation given the deeply entrenched social injustices that pervade many societies, and that would typically inform individual free choices. Tremain (2006) discusses this effect in relation to disability. Russell (2010) argues that taking race to be a morally neutral feature (as Harris does) is only a “veiled attempt” to distinguish contemporary from historical eugenics practices. Perhaps race should be morally neutral, but it is not commonly treated as such, and opening up “choice” for people who harbor explicit or implicit biases related to race allows for those biases to shape the next generation. Oliver (2010) likewise highlights the trick of labeling gender a morally neutral category in a world filled with sexism, and also rightly emphasizes the levels of surveillance and control over women that are likely to follow the implementation of liberal eugenics. The unintended negative effects on pregnant women of increased attention to prenatal testing and surveillance of pregnancy generally are explored in Katz Rothman (1986), Rapp (1999), and Kukla (2008), but tend not to be widely discussed by liberal eugenics advocates (see Oliver 2010). (See also SEP entry on pregnancy, birth and medicine.)
Sparrow (2011b) suggests that the advocate of liberal eugenics faces a dilemma: if parents should be the ones determining future well-being of children, then they will likely choose in ways that a) some liberals find counter-intuitive, as with Deaf kids, and b) may, through market pressures and social norms, lead to homogeneity from “tyranny of the majority” (2011b: 515); if, however, parents should not have this leeway, then we end up putting decisions about enhancements in the hands of the state, and then “new” eugenics looks a lot like old eugenics, with all its attendant concerns. While most advocates of liberal eugenics express concern about the problem of aggregate effects of individual choices, they often end up seeming to dismiss them (Green 2007), presuming that education or other modes of dealing with the problems will be sufficient (Savulescu 2001), or just adding a qualification about the need to avoid reinforcing unjust social norms (Agar 2004), without fully exploring the difficulty of doing so.
Still other critics (Sandel 2007; Kass 2003) highlight the ways in which the motivations for the enhancement project express hubris, a “drive to mastery” (Sandel 2007: 27) that, left unchecked, threatens to alter the nature and meaning of parent-child relationships, from openness to the “unbidden” and unconditional love to design and manufacture (Kass 2003). As Sandel puts it, “the deepest moral objection to enhancement lies less in the perfection it seeks, than in the human disposition it expresses and promotes” (2007: 46).
The problem with a drive to mastery, for Sandel, is that we think we can (and should) control everything, and in so doing, we fail to appreciate the “gifted character of human powers and achievements” (2007: 29). To appreciate our giftedness, he says, we must understand that our abilities are not “wholly of our own doing, nor even fully ours” (2007: 27). We recognize, in other words, how indebted we are to good luck, and how we and others may be unfortunate, rather than simply irresponsible. In so doing, we remain humble, and we build solidarity with other people through recognition of our shared situation. If we lose that appreciation for giftedness, as he thinks we will by employing enhancement technologies that create precise expectations about how our children will be, we may lose important human goods (humility, reasonable responsibility, solidarity). Even though we might undertake enhancement for the benefit of our offspring, in so doing, we make them into creatures who must be indebted to us for their gifts, and for whom our love may be conditional on fulfilling our intentions. Sandel recognizes that many parents already exert excessive influence on their children's lives, and may fail to love them unconditionally, but he worries that genetic enhancement technologies will only exasperate that tendency. If a parent designs a child to be a certain way, her investment will increase her demands. In a similar vein, Kass notes that parental hopes will become parental expectations if we allow the designing of children (Kass 2003). The concern about parental expectations, prenatal testing, and how choice might affect the unconditional love we envision for parents is also explored by disability scholars (Kittay and Kittay 2000; Asch and Wasserman 2005).
One difficulty with these arguments is that much of what we attempt to do in medicine to create treatments for disease could itself fit under a “drive to mastery” and might likewise question our commitment to being “open to the unbidden” (see Buchanan 2011). Also, if the point is simply that we must be attentive to our inclinations to hubris—we might get carried away in thinking we can enhance appropriately—then we could heed that warning without rejecting the enhancement project entirely. Other critics simply deny the value of humility (Glover 2006: 113).
Kamm (2005) dismisses Sandel's worries about mastery and openness to the unbidden, but she raises a different kind of worry about the enhancement project (one related to the worry about aggregate effects of individual choice). Her fear is that we may “lack imagination” to see how a variety of traits (and different combinations of traits) can create goods we have yet to envision or experience.
[W]hen creatures of limited imagination do not design themselves and others, they are likely to extend the range of their appreciation of goods because the range of goods is likely to be larger. A parent who might have designed his child to have the good trait of composing classical music, could not have conceived that it would be good to have a child who turns out to be one of the Beatles. (To have conceived it, would have involved creating the style before the Beatles did.) …[T]oo much control will limit the number and combination of goods from what is possible. (Kamm 2005: 14)
Figuring out how to heed these warnings based on hubris and mastery—what they mean for the enhancement project—is not at all clear.
Another worry linked to the desire for control comes from Habermas (2003) who grounds his arguments in a deontological framework. He argues that by engineering our children in very specific ways—beyond the treatment of disease—we may undermine their capacity for self-definition, their sense of being responsible for themselves (in respect to creating their own identities), and their freedom (2003: 12–13). He claims that it is not genetic engineering per se that is the problem, but rather the
mode and scope of its use….[and] moreover the attitude in which interventions in the genetic makeup of members of our moral community are carried out that provides the standards for an assessment of their admissibility. (2003: 43)
In this case, the wrong attitude is one that is not attentive to likely second person consent to the changes—would the child have granted approval for the selected traits? For Habermas, what matters is the attitude of appreciating the need for the future person's presumed consent, rather than the idea of making the change merely according to parental preferences. Further, he worries that parents who engineer their children will have expectations of their children “without, however, providing the addressee [the child] with an opportunity to take a revisionist stand” (2003: 51). Why not?
The genetic program is a mute, and in a sense, unanswerable fact; for unlike persons born naturally, someone who is at odds with genetically fixed intentions is barred from developing, in the course of a reflectively appropriated and deliberately continued life history, an attitude toward her talents (and handicaps) which implies a revised self-understanding and allows for a productive response to the initial situation. (2003: 62)
The basis for this claim seems to rest on a distinction between “the grown and the made” p. 52—being created to be a particular way is being made, and so objectified, a product of the parents. Being grown, by contrast, recognizes the individual subjectivity of the new person, who is equal to her parents and not defined by them. This objection shares much with Kass's concerns about genetic despotism—control of one generation by the previous one (2003).
As many critics (Buchanan 2011; Glover 2006; Green 2007) point out, though, it is unclear why the genetically designed child could not be revisionist in her response to her parents. Designing a child to have features that make, for example, an athletic career possible (even likely) is not the same as ensuring such a career, or even an athletic body. Parenting would not lose its challenges simply because of the origins of the features of the child in question. However, perhaps there are some morally relevant differences in the means parents take to try to shape their children, such that the longer iterative process of educating a child enforces a kind of communicative engagement that simply cannot be part of engineering an embryo, and that negatively affects the parent-child relationship (Malmqvist 2011). Of course, as Hayry notes, deciding not to enhance a child is also a decision that would seem to require consent from the future child, and we surely do not want to insist that the only way to respect future generations is not to produce them at all (Hayry 2010: 42).
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