Notes to Essential vs. Accidental Properties

Notes to the Supplement on the Arguments for Origin Essentialism

1. It may be worth pointing out that the intuition that if one's parents had not gotten together, then one would never have existed does not straightforwardly offer support for origin essentialism. Compare: the fact that if Ed had not lit the cigarette, then the house would never have burned down does not mean that it is impossible for the house to have burned down without Ed's lighting the cigarette. In general it is one thing to say that B would not have happened had A not happened and another to say that B could not have happened without A's happening.

2. The three versions of the argument that appear in this section are taken—with some minor changes—from Salmon (1981, Chapter 7 and Appendix I). Salmon offers translations of the argument into the language of quantified modal logic. Those who are so inclined may verify their validity by means of the formal translations. For those who are not so inclined, I hope my explanation makes the reasoning clear.

Copyright © 2013 by
Teresa Robertson <>
Philip Atkins <>

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