Notes to The Ergodic Hierarchy

1. The use of the term ‘space’ in physics might cause confusion. On the one hand the term is used in its ordinary meaning to refer to the three-dimensional space of our everyday experience. On the other hand, an entire class of mathematical structures are referred to as ‘spaces’ even though they have nothing in common with the space of everyday experience (except some abstract algebraic properties, which is why these structures earned the title ‘spaces’ in the first place). Phase spaces are abstract mathematical spaces.

2. Note that the time dimension of the ball’s motion is not an explicit part of the phase space.

3. Sometimes a fourth component is mentioned in the definition: a sigma algebra σ. Although in certain circumstances it is convenient to add σ, it is not strictly necessary since the main purpose of σ is to provide a basis to define the measure μ, and so σ is always present in the background when there is a measure μ and it is not necessary to mention it explicitly. For a discussion of sigma algebras and measures see Appendix B.

4. By using ℜ and ℤ we assume that time extends to the past as well as to the future, and we also assume that the time evolution is reversible. This need not be the case and these assumptions can be relaxed in different ways. Nothing in what follows depends on this.

5. Strictly speaking A has to be measurable. In what follows we always assume that the sets we consider are measurable. This is a technical assumption that has no bearing on the issues that follow since the relevant sets are always measurable.

6. First appearances notwithstanding, this is not a substantial restriction. Systems in statistical mechanics are all measure preserving. Some systems in chaos theory are not measure preserving, but these systems, if they are chaotic on a certain part of the phase space (which can be an attractor or an interval, for instance), then there is an invariant measure on this part and EH is applicable with respect to that measure. For a discussion of this point see Werndl (2009b).

7. There are also other types of systems; e.g. topological ones. These are not considered here since the concepts of EH are essentially tied to there being a measure.

8. The basic idea of an integral is the following: slice up the space into m small cells c1;…,cm (e.g. by putting a grid on it), then choose a point in each cell and take the value of f for that point. Then multiply that value with the size of the cell (its measure) and add them all up: f(x1)μ(c1) + … + f(xm)μ(cm), where x1 is a point in c1 etc. Now we start making the cells smaller (and as result we need more of them to cover X) until they become infinitely small (in technical terms, we take the limit). That is the integral. Put simply, the integral is just f(x1)μ(c1) + … + f(xm)μ(cm) for infinitely small cells.

9. The concept of ergodicity has a long and complex history. For a sketch of this history see Sklar (1993, Ch. 2) and the Appendix, Section A.

10. Sometimes EH is presented as having another level, namely C-systems (also referred to as Anosov systems or completely hyperbolic systems). Although interesting in their own right, C-systems are beyond the scope of this review. They do not have a unique place in EH and their relation to other levels of EH depends on details, which we cannot discuss here. Paradigm examples of C-systems are located between K- and B-systems; that is, they are K-systems but not necessarily B-systems. The cat map, for instance, is a C-system that is also a K-system (Lichtenberg & Liebermann, 1992, p. 307); but there are K-systems such as the so-called stadium billiard which are not C-systems (Ott, 1993, p. 262). Some C-systems preserve a smooth measure (where ‘smooth’ in this context means absolutely continuous with respect to the Lebesgue measure), in which case they are Bernoulli systems. But not all C-systems have smooth measures. It is always possible to find other measures such as SRB (Sinai, Ruelle, Bowen) measures. However, matters are more complicated in such cases, as such C-systems need not be mixing and a fortiori they need not be K- or B-systems (Ornstein & Weiss, 1991, pp. 75–82).

11. To be precise, a second condition has to be satisfied: α must be T-generating (Mañé 1983, 87). However, what matters for out considerations is the independence condition.

12. A formal proof can be found in Cornfeld et al. (1982, 9–10).

13. A similar situation exists for quantum field theory, which has a number of inequivalent formulations including (to name just a few) the canonical, algebraic, axiomatic, and path integral frameworks.

14. For detailed reviews of SM see Frigg (2008), Sklar (1993) and Uffink (2007). Those interested in the long and intricate history of SM are referred to Brush (1976) and von Plato (1994).

15. It is a common assumption in the literature on Boltzmannian SM that there is a finite number of macrostates that system can possess. We should point out, however, that this assumption is based on an idealisation if the relevant macro variables are continuous. In fact, we obtain a finite number of macrostates only if we coarse-grain the values of the continuous variables.

16. Uffink (2004, 2007) provides an overview over the tangled development of Boltzmann’s constantly changing views. Frigg (2009a) discusses probabilities in Boltzmann’s account.

17. For details see, for instance, Tolman (1938 Chs. 3 and 4).

18. An energy hypersurface is an hypersurface in the system’s phase space on which the energy is constant.

19. To be more precise: what we are after is a proof for cases where there are nontrivial interaction terms, meaning those for which there does not exist a canonical transformation that effectively eliminates such terms.

20. See for instance Lichtenberg & Liebermann, 1992; Ott, 1993; Tabor, 1989.

21. Provided that μ is normalised, which is the case in most systems studied in ergodic theory. Due to their connection to μ some maybe inclined not to interpret the p(At) as epistemic probabilities; in fact, in particular in the literature on ergodic theory μ is often interpreted as a time average and so one could insist that p(At) be a time average as well. While this could be done, it is not conducive to our analysis. Our goal is explicate randomness in terms degrees of unpredictability and to this end one needs to assume that p(At) be epistemic probabilities. However, contra radical Bayesianism, we posit that the values of these probabilities be constrained by objective facts about the system (here the measure μ). But this does not make these probabilities objective.

22. We would also like to mention that the analysis of randomness in Bernoulli and K-systems is based on implications of the definitions of these systems, but they do not exhaust these definitions (or provide verbal restatements of them) because there are parts of the definition that have not been used (in the case of Bernoulli systems the condition that there be a generating partition and in the case of K-systems sets in σ(n,r) other than ones of the form TkAj0Tk+1Aj1Tk+2Aj2 ∩ …. By contrast, the analyses of SM, WM, and E in the following paragraphs exhaust the respective definitions. In the case of Bernoulli this has the consequence that the characterisation given here also applies to some systems that are not ergodic. For a discussion of such cases see Werndl (2009a, section 4.2.2).

23. They are not the only systems occupying the zero level. Periodic systems, for instance, are not random either. We do not discuss other non-random systems here because they are not part of EH.

24. This bit of conventional wisdom is backed-up by a theorem by Markus and Mayer (1974), which is based on KAM theory, and basically says that generic Hamiltonian dynamical systems are not ergodic.

25. We would like to point out that an analysis of chaos in terms of positive KS-entropy needs further qualifications. A system whose dynamics is, intuitively speaking, chaotic only on a part of the phase space can still have positive KS-entropy. A case in point is a system with X = [−1, 1] where dynamics on [−1,0) is the identity function and the tent map on [0, 1]. This system has positive KS-entropy, but dynamics of the entire systems is not chaotic (only the part on [0, 1] is). This problem can be circumvented by adding extra conditions, for instance that the system be ergodic (which the above system clearly is not).

Notes to Appendix

26. Not all subsets of phase space points are measurable—see (Royden 1968, pp. 52–65) for an explanation

Copyright © 2011 by
Roman Frigg <>
Joseph Berkovitz <>
Fred Kronz <>

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