First published Wed Jul 3, 2002; substantive revision Sat Mar 23, 2013

Confucius (551?-479? BCE), according to Chinese tradition, was a thinker, political figure, educator, and founder of the Ru School of Chinese thought.[1] His teachings, preserved in the Lunyu or Analects, form the foundation of much of subsequent Chinese speculation on the education and comportment of the ideal man, how such an individual should live his life and interact with others, and the forms of society and government in which he should participate. Fung Yu-lan, one of the great 20thcentury authorities on the history of Chinese thought, compares Confucius' influence in Chinese history with that of Socrates in the West.

1. Confucius' Life

The sources for Confucius' life were compiled well after his death and taken together paint contradictory pictures of his personality and of the events in his life. The early works agreed by textual authorities to be relatively reliable sources of biographical material are: the Analects, compiled by Confucius' disciples and later followers during the centuries following his death; the Zuozhuan, a narrative history composed from earlier sources sometime in the fourth century; and the Mengzi or Mencius, a compilation of the teachings of the well-known eponymous fourth century follower of Confucius' thought put together by his disciples and adherents.[2] The Confucius of the Analects appears most concerned with behaving morally even when this means enduring hardship and poverty. Mencius' Confucius is a politically motivated figure, seeking high office and departing from patrons who do not properly reward him.[3] A third Confucius is found in the pages of the Zuozhuan. This one is a heroic figure courageously facing down dangers that threaten the lord of Confucius' native state of Lu.

Many of the stories found in these three sources as well as the legends surrounding Confucius at the end of the 2ndcentury were included in a biography of Confucius by the Han dynasty court historian, Sima Qian (145-c.85), in his well-known and often-quoted Records of the Grand Historian (Shiji).[4] This collection of tales opens by identifying Confucius' ancestors as members of the Royal State of Song, a genealogy Sima Qian borrows from the Zuozhuan.[5] This same account notes as well that his great grandfather, fleeing the turmoil in his native Song, had moved to Lu, somewhere near the present town of Qufu in south-eastern Shandong, where the family became impoverished. Confucius' father is usually identified as Shu He of Zhou who, according to the Zuozhuan, led Lu armies in 563 and again in 556, acting with great valor and extraordinary strength (qualities for which his son would later be known according to the same historical source). Nothing of certainty is known of his mother; she may have been a daughter of the Yan family. Confucius was born in the walled town of Zhou in the state of Lu in 552 or in 551 according to the earliest sources that preserve such information about him. If the year of his birth was 551—the date most scholars favor—then, since that year was a gengxu year according to the traditional system of cyclical designations for years, Confucius was born under the sign of the dog. This may account for why, according to Sima Qian's biography, Confucius accepted as true the observation that in his sad and forlorn appearance he resembled a “stray dog.”[6]

Confucius is described, by Sima Qian and other sources, as having endured a poverty-stricken and humiliating youth and been forced, upon reaching manhood, to undertake such petty jobs as accounting and caring for livestock.[7] Sima Qian's account includes the tale of how Confucius was born in answer to his parents' prayers at a sacred hill (qiu) called Ni. Confucius' surname Kong (which means literally an utterance of thankfulness when prayers have been answered), his tabooed given name Qiu, and his social name Zhongni, all appear connected to the miraculous circumstances of his birth. This casts doubt, then, on Confucius' royal genealogy as found in the Zuozhuan and Shiji. Similarly, Confucius' recorded age at death, ‘seventy-two,’ is a ‘magic number’ with far-reaching significance in early Chinese literature. It is not surprising that we can say little about Confucius's childhood beyond noting that he probably spent it in the Lu town where he is reported to have been born. There are many important figures in early Chinese history about whose youth we know even less. Almost as if to provide something to fill this lacuna in his account of Confucius, Sima Qian says that, “As a child [of five, according to some highly imaginative hagiographers], Confucius entertained himself by habitually arranging rituals vessels and staging ceremonies,” thus prefiguring the philosopher's famous interest in rites.

We do not know how Confucius himself was educated, but tradition has it that he studied ritual with the fictional Daoist Master Lao Dan, music with Chang Hong, and the lute with Music-master Xiang. In his middle age Confucius is supposed to have gathered about him a group of disciples whom he taught and also to have devoted himself to political matters in Lu. The number of Confucius' disciples has been greatly exaggerated, with Sima Qian and other sources claiming that there were as many as three thousand of them. Sima Qian goes on to say that, “Those who, in their own person, became conversant with the Six Disciplines [taught by Confucius], numbered seventy-two.” The Mencius and some other early works give their number as seventy. Perhaps seventy or seventy-two were a maximum, though both of these numbers are suspicious given Confucius' supposed age at death.

In 525, when Confucius was twenty-seven or twenty-eight, he is supposed by the authors of the Zuozhuan to have visited the ruler of the small state of Tan in order to learn bureaucratic history from him and then to marvel, with reflexive condescension, at how such knowledge was lost to the Son of Heaven but “may still be studied among the distant border peoples of the four quarters.” The theme of the extreme inquisitiveness of the young Confucius is also reflected in the Analects: “When the Master entered the Grand Temple he asked questions about everything. Someone said, ‘Who said that this son of a man from Zhou knows about ritual? When he entered the Grand Temple he asked about everything.’ When the Master learned of this he observed, ‘Doing so is prescribed by ritual’” (Lunyu 3.15).[8]

Two Zuozhuan passages—that relate to events that took place in 522 when Confucius would have been thirty or thirty-one—lay claim to what appear to be among the first times when Confucius uttered judgment on the behavior or reputation of others. The first of these has to do with Duke Jing of Qi (r. 547–490) whom Confucius criticized for becoming angry with an underling determined to fulfil his official responsibilities even when that meant disobeying a direct order from his ruler. The other is his “tearful” comment when he learned of the death of the Zheng statesman Zi Chan: “The love for others seen among the ancients survived in him.”[9]

In another Zuozhuan passage that occurs not long after these two, the Lu nobleman Ming Xizi, immediately before his death in 518, praised Confucius as “the descendant of a sage” and instructed the grand officers who attended him that, upon his death, they should entrust his two sons to Confucius. These are strong signals that in the eyes of the authors of the Zuozhuan, Confucius was by this time in his life established as a person of significance in Lu. Meng Xizi went on, however, and declared that what another Lu nobleman named Zang Sunhe had once said was true in the case of Confucius: “If a sage possessed of bright virtue does not fit the age in which he lives then surely among his descendants there will be one who is successful.” Meng Xizi's Zuozhuan speech should be read not only as indicative of a turning point in Confucius' early career—his emergence from obscurity—but also as the first of many ancient declarations that Confucius was worthy of a crown that he would not receive in his lifetime.

Politics in Confucius' native Lu were extremely unstable because of the challenge to the ruler posed by the “three Huan families” which had the hereditary right to occupy the most powerful ministerial offices in the Lu government. In 517 Duke Zhao of Lu moved against the head of the most powerful—and the wealthiest— of the families: the Ji clan. But the attack failed and the duke was forced to flee from Lu and spend the remaining years of his reign in exile, first in Lu's large neighbor Qi and then in a town in the state of Jin where he died in 510. According to Sima Qian, when Duke Zhao was first forced into exile, Confucius also went to Qi to serve as a retainer in the household of the nobleman Gao Zhaozi. The Analects mentions how, during this period in Qi, Confucius heard for the first time a performance of the sacred Shao music and was overwhelmed by the experience and then had an audience with Duke Jing of Qi in which Confucius observed that what Qi required was that “The ruler should be a ruler, his subjects subjects, the father should be a father, and his son a son” (Lunyu 12.11). He was no doubt commenting on politics in Qi where—as was also the case in Lu—power rested not in the hands of the ruler but instead in the hands of the powerful ministerial families who were supposed to serve him. Some unidentified adversity probably precipitated Confucius' departure from Qi. And it seems that back home in Lu he was fairing poorly in locating employment. So noteworthy was this failure that a passage in the Analects comments on it: “Someone asked Confucius, ‘Why is it that you are not in government?’ Confucius replied, ‘The Documents say, ”Be filial, oh, only be filial! Be friendly toward your brothers and extend this to governing.“ Practicing this is also to govern. Why must one be in office to govern?’” (Lunyu 2.21). As noted earlier, what mattered to the Confucius of the Analects was not winning an official position but remaining faithful to the moral behavior he valued.[10]

Whether or not Confucius held any important office in Lu is a much-debated point, but from the Mengzi onward, there is consistent ancient testimony that he was director of crime (si kou). The Zuozhuan confirms that he held the post starting sometime around 509.[11] We know very little of what Confucius accomplished in the job and nothing about his understanding of his responsibilities. Given what one might expect a director of crime to do—to enforce the law and impose corporal punishments on those found guilty of crime—it is odd to think that Confucius served in the role given his famous opposition to the use of fines and punishments, dismissing them as ineffective and counterproductive in governing people: “If they are led by virtue, and uniformity sought among them through the practice of ritual propriety, the people will possess a sense of shame and come to you of their own accord” (Lunyu 2.3). The contradiction among our sources is paradigmatic of the problems we face in figuring out the events in Confucius' life. Perhaps the claims that Confucius served as director of crime are fictional. Perhaps he did serve in the role and learned from the experience the ineffectiveness of punishment in maintaining order in society. Or perhaps the Analects passage is an interpolation—something Confucius himself never said—added by a branch of his school that wanted to represent their master as strongly opposed to legalistic measures in spite of his having served as a law enforcement officer in Lu.

As it is presented in the Zuozhuan, the single most important event in Confucius' official career in Lu, and perhaps even in his lifetime, was the 500 BCE meeting at Jiagu in the state of Qi when he was called upon to protect the life of Duke Ding of Lu (r. 509–495) and defend the honor of his native state. To formalize a peace agreement between Lu and Qi, the rulers of the two states met at Jiagu and signed an oath promising to abide by certain terms and conditions lest they be harshly dealt with by the gods and spirits. Confucius' role in the event is described in the text as that of “overseer” of the protocols of the meeting. The Qi ruler and his lieutenants had plotted to use the occasion to humiliate Lu and perhaps even to seize Lu's ruler. The Confucius of the Zuozhuan is shown as adroit and skilful in dealing with these dangerous circumstances. He succeeds not only in getting Qi to withdraw its armed men from the meeting but also to return to Lu lands that Qi had previously appropriated in return for Lu's future participation in Qi's military adventures.[12]

If Confucius in fact experienced some sort of triumph at Jiagu, tales about the period following his return to Lu speak of intense conflict among the three Huan families and between them and Duke Ding. The duke attempted to have the families tear down the walls of the fortresses that secured their fiefs—the duke's argument was that the fortresses might be seized by lower-ranking stewards and thus were more of a threat than a benefit to the families—but the population of the Ji family fortress at Bi rebelled and attacked the Lu capital threatening the life of the duke. Again, Confucius came to the duke's rescue and the rebellion by the Bi masses was eventually put down by the army of Lu. However, the Meng family simply refused to tear down the walls that protected their family fortress at Cheng. Duke Ding led an army to lay siege to Cheng and level its walls but he failed to do so and his weakness and ineptitude were made all the more obvious by this failure.

What role Confucius played in the duke's plans is difficult to determine. It seems rather that, at least according to the Zuozhuan, his disciple Zi Lu, in the employ of the Ji family, played a more significant part. Whatever the case may be, in the stories that follow this dramatic tale, Confucius, along with Zi Lu and other disciples, departed Lu late in 498 and went into exile.[13] As in other ancient cultures, exile and suffering are common themes in the lives of the heroes of the early Chinese tradition. In the company of his disciples, Confucius travelled in the states of Wei, Song, Chen, Cai, and Chu, purportedly looking for a ruler who might employ him but meeting instead with indifference and, occasionally, severe hardship and danger. Several of these episodes, as preserved in Sima Qian's account, appear to be little more than prose retellings of songs found in the ancient Chinese Book of Songs. Confucius' life is thus rendered a re-enactment of the suffering and alienation of the personas of the poems. Analects 6.28 claims that while he was in Wei, Confucius visited its ruler's wicked consort Nanzi. Confronted by Zi Lu's displeasure, Confucius swore he did not do anything wrong with the woman. While it is possible to suspect that the story is a later addition to the Analects, that does not mean that it is less believable than anything else the text says about events in Confucius' life. Later on, in the state of Song, Confucius just barely escaped with his life from an attack by Marshal Huan, a formidable Song nobleman, who for unknown reasons was intent on killing him.[14] During these difficulties Confucius got separated from his favorite disciple Yan Hui. When they were subsequently reunited, Confucius said, “I assumed you were deadl” Yan Hui responded, “While the Master is alive, how would I, Hui, dare to die?” (Lunyu 11.21). Still later in his exile, while in the tiny state of Cai, Confucius is supposed to have encountered the disreputable Shen Zhuliang, better known by his title “duke of She,” who along with other noblemen from the great southern state of Chu were occupying Cai and herding about its population. According to passages in the Analects, the duke of She asked Confucius about the art of governing and also asked Zi Lu about Confucius' character. Both passages are meant to suggest that Confucius found the duke lacking in virtue and learning.[15]

Their time in the small state of Chen was especially precarious for Confucius and his followers: “While in Chen, food supplies for the journey were cut off. Followers fell ill and none was able to rise to his feet. Zi Lu, indignant, saw Kongzi and asked, ‘Is it right that even the superior man should be reduced to poverty?’ The Master replied, ‘A superior man remains steadfast in the face of poverty; the small man, when impoverished, loses all restraint’” (Lunyu 15.2). Confucius' reply to Zi Lu is not merely a lesson on the distinction between the superior man's endurance of hardship and the tendency of his opposite, the petty individual, to resort to crime. Confucius is drawing the distinction when all were in straitened circumstances and as such his words should be read as a pointed reminder to Zi Lu and the other disciples traveling with him at the time that, in spite of the difficulties they were facing, they should adhere to the highest standards of ethical behavior. Perhaps it was Zi Lu's indignation that triggered in Confucius a worry that his followers might take extreme and even immoral measures to find food. Either inspired by this story or informed by tales and traditions that are lost to us, a passage in the Mozi—a text that preserves a political and social philosophy greatly at odds with the teachings of Confucius and the Ru school—claims that Confucius, who had a reputation for being scrupulous about his meals, ate pork given him by Zi Lu even though he had reason to believe that Zi Lu had stolen it.[16] Other passages in the Analects hint that Confucius was disturbed by the behavior of some of his followers while they were abroad with him and by their failure to make more progress in the cultivation of the moral values he prized.[17]

In any case, by most traditional accounts, after a brief second visit to Wei, Confucius returned to Lu in 484. The Ji family was still the most powerful in Lu as they had been when Confucius had departed in the aftermath of Duke Ding's aborted efforts to dismantle the fortresses of the three Huan families. While he had some interaction with the head of the Ji family as well as with the reigning Lu ruler, Duke Ai, Confucius appears to have spent the remainder of his life teaching, putting in order the Book of Songs, the Book of Documents, and other ancient classics, as well as editing the Spring and Autumn Annals, the court chronicle of Lu. Sima Qian's account also provides background on Confucius' connection to the early canonical texts on ritual and on music (the latter of which was lost at an early date). Sima Qian claims, moreover, that, “In his later years, Confucius delighted in the Yi”—the famous divination manual popular to this day in China and in the West. The Analects passage which appears to corroborate Sima Qian's claim seems corrupt and hence unreliable on this point. Confucius' traditional association with these works led them and related texts to be revered as the “Confucian Classics” and made Confucius himself the spiritual ancestor of later teachers, historians, moral philosophers, literary scholars, and countless others whose lives and works figure prominently in Chinese intellectual history.

Our best source for understanding Confucius and his thought is the Analects. But the Analects is a problematic and controversial work, having been compiled in variant versions long after Confucius' death by disciples or the disciples of disciples. Some have argued that, because of the text's inconsistencies and incompatibilities of thought, there is much in the Analects that is non-Confucian and should be discarded as a basis for understanding the thought of Confucius.[18] Benjamin Schwartz cautions us against such radical measures: “While textual criticism based on rigorous philological and historic analysis is crucial, and while the later sections [of the Analects] do contain late materials, the type of textual criticism that is based on considerations of alleged logical inconsistencies and incompatibilities of thought must be viewed with great suspicion… . While none of us comes to such an enterprise without deep-laid assumptions about necessary logical relations and compatibilities, we should at least hold before ourselves the constant injunction to mistrust all our unexamined preconceptions on these matters when dealing with comparative thought.”[19] The difficulties in reading and interpreting the text of the Analects have given rise to numerous extensive commentaries that struggle to untangle the complexities of its language and thought.[20]

Book X of the Analects consists of personal observations of how Confucius comported himself as a thinker, teacher, and official. Some have argued that these passages were originally more general prescriptions on how a gentleman should dress and behave that were relabelled as descriptions of Confucius. Traditionally, Book X has been regarded as providing an intimate portrait of Confucius and has been read as a biographical sketch. The following passages provide a few examples of why, more generally, it is difficult to glean from the Analects a genuinely biographical, let alone intimate, portrait of the Master.

Confucius, at home in his native village, was simple and unassuming in manner, as though he did not trust himself to speak. But when in the ancestral temple or at Court he speaks readily, though always choosing his words with due caution. (Lunyu 10.1)

When at court conversing with the officers of a lower grade, he is friendly, though straightforward; when conversing with officers of a higher grade, he is restrained but precise. When the ruler is present he is wary, but not cramped. (Lunyu 10.2)

On entering the Palace Gate he seems to contract his body, as though there were not sufficient room to admit him. If he halts, it must never be in the middle of the gate, nor in going through does he ever tread on the threshold. (Lunyu 10.4)

When fasting in preparation for sacrifice he must wear the Bright Robe, and it must be of linen. He must change his food and also the place where he commonly sits. He does not object to his rice being thoroughly cleaned, nor to his meat being finely minced. (Lunyu 10.7, 10.8)

When sending a messenger to enquire after someone in another country, he bows himself twice while seeing the messenger off. (Lunyu 10.15)

In bed he avoided lying in the posture of a corpse … On meeting anyone in deep mourning he must bow across the bar of his chariot. (Lunyu 10.24, 10.25)

Analects passages such as these may not satisfy a modern reader looking for some entry into understanding the connection between Confucius the man and Confucius the thinker, but they did succeed in rendering Confucius the model of courtliness and personal decorum for countless generations of Chinese officials.

By the fourth century, Confucius was recognized as a unique figure, a sage who was ignored but should have been recognized and become a king. At the end of the fourth century BCE, Mencius says of Confucius: “Ever since man came into this world, there has never been one greater than Confucius.” And in two passages Mencius implies that Confucius was one of the great sage kings who, according to his reckoning, arises every five hundred years. Confucius also figures prominently as the subject of anecdotes and the teacher of wisdom in the writings of Xunzi, a third century follower of Confucius' teachings. Indeed chapters twenty-eight to thirty of the Xunzi, which some have argued were not the work of Xunzi but compilations by his disciples, look like an alternative, and considerably briefer, version of the Analects.

Confucius and his followers also inspired considerable criticism from other thinkers. The anecdote quoted earlier from the Mozi is an example. The authors of the Zhuangzi took particular delight in parodying Confucius and the teachings conventionally associated with him. But Confucius' reputation was so great that even the Zhuangzi appropriates him to give voice to Daoist teachings.

2. Confucius' Ethics

Confucius' teachings and his conversations and exchanges with his disciples are recorded in the Lunyu or Analects, a collection that probably achieved something like its present form around the second century BCE. While Confucius believes that people live their lives within parameters firmly established by Heaven—which, often, for him means both a purposeful Supreme Being as well as ‘nature’ and its fixed cycles and patterns—he argues that men are responsible for their actions and especially for their treatment of others. We can do little or nothing to alter our fated span of existence but we determine what we accomplish and what we are remembered for.

Confucius represented his teachings as lessons transmitted from antiquity. He claimed that he was “a transmitter and not a maker” and that all he did reflected his “reliance on and love for the ancients” (Lunyu 7.1). Confucius pointed especially to the precedents established during the height of the royal Zhou (roughly the first half of the first millennium BCE). Such justifications for one's ideas may have already been conventional in Confucius' day. Certainly his claim that there were antique precedents for his ideology had a tremendous influence on subsequent thinkers many of whom imitated these gestures. But we should not regard the contents of the Analects as consisting of old ideas. Much of what Confucius taught appears to have been original to him and to have represented a radical departure from the ideas and practices of his day.

Confucius also claimed that he enjoyed a special and privileged relationship with Heaven and that, by the age of fifty, he had come to understand what Heaven had mandated for him and for mankind. (Lunyu 2.4). Confucius was also careful to instruct his followers that they should never neglect the offerings due Heaven. (Lunyu 3.13) Some scholars have seen a contradiction between Confucius' reverence for Heaven and what they believe to be his skepticism with regard to the existence of ‘the spirits.’ But the Analects passages that reveal Confucius' attitudes toward spiritual forces (Lunyu 3.12, 6.20, and 11.11) do not suggest that he was skeptical. Rather they show that Confucius revered and respected the spirits, thought that they should be worshipped with utmost sincerity, and taught that serving the spirits was a far more difficult and complicated matter than serving mere mortals.

Confucius' social philosophy largely revolves around the concept of ren, “compassion” or “loving others.” Cultivating or practicing such concern for others involved deprecating oneself. This meant being sure to avoid artful speech or an ingratiating manner that would create a false impression and lead to self-aggrandizement. (Lunyu 1.3) Those who have cultivated ren are, on the contrary, “simple in manner and slow of speech” (Lunyu 13.27). For Confucius, such concern for others is demonstrated through the practice of forms of the Golden Rule: “What you do not wish for yourself, do not do to others;” “Since you yourself desire standing then help others achieve it, since you yourself desire success then help others attain it” (Lunyu 12.2, 6.30). He regards devotion to parents and older siblings as the most basic form of promoting the interests of others before one's own. Central to all ethical teachings found in the Analects of Confucius is the notion that the social arena in which the tools for creating and maintaining harmonious relations are fashioned and employed is the extended family. Among the various ways in which social divisions could have been drawn, the most important were the vertical lines that bound multigenerational lineages. And the most fundamental lessons to be learned by individuals within a lineage were what role their generational position had imposed on them and what obligations toward those senior or junior to them were associated with those roles. In the world of the Analects, the dynamics of social exchange and obligation primarily involved movement up and down along familial roles that were defined in terms of how they related to others within the same lineage. It was also necessary that one play roles within other social constructs—neighborhood, community, political bureaucracy, guild, school of thought—that brought one into contact with a larger network of acquaintances and created ethical issues that went beyond those that impacted one's family. But the extended family was at the center of these other hierarchies and could be regarded as a microcosm of their workings. One who behaved morally in all possible parallel structures extending outward from the family probably approximated Confucius's conception of ren.

It is useful to contrast this conception of ren and the social arena in which it worked with the idea of jian ai or “impartial love” advocated by the Mohists who as early as the fifth century BCE posed the greatest intellectual challenge to Confucius' thought. The Mohists shared with Confucius and his followers the goal of bringing about effective governance and a stable society, but they constructed their ethical system, not on the basis of social roles, but rather on the self or, to be more precise, the physical self that has cravings, needs, and ambitions. For the Mohists, the individual's love for his physical self is the basis on which all moral systems had to be built. The Confucian emphasis on social role rather than on the self seems to involve, in comparison to the Mohist position, an exaggerated emphasis on social status and position and an excessive form of self-centeredness. While the Mohist love of self is also of course a form of self-interest, what distinguishes it from the Confucian position is that the Mohists regard self-love as a necessary means to an end, not the end in itself, which the Confucian pride of position and place appears to be. The Mohist program called for a process by which self-love was replaced by, or transformed into, impartial love—the unselfish and altruistic concern for others that would, in their reckoning, lead to an improved world untroubled by wars between states, conflict in communities, and strife within families. To adopt impartial love would be to ignore the barriers that privilege the self, one's family, and one's state and that separate them from other individuals, families, and states. In this argument, self-love is a fact that informs the cultivation of concern for those within one's own silo; it is also the basis for interacting laterally with those to whom one is not related, a large cohort that is not adequately taken into account in the Confucian scheme of ethical obligation.

Confucius taught that the practice of altruism he thought necessary for social cohesion could be mastered only by those who have learned self-discipline. Learning self-restraint involves studying and mastering li, the ritual forms and rules of propriety through which one expresses respect for superiors and enacts his role in society in such a way that he himself is worthy of respect and admiration. A concern for propriety should inform everything that one says and does:

Look at nothing in defiance of ritual, listen to nothing in defiance of ritual, speak of nothing in defiance or ritual, never stir hand or foot in defiance of ritual. (Lunyu 12.1)

Subjecting oneself to ritual does not, however, mean suppressing one's desires but instead learning how to reconcile one's own desires with the needs of one's family and community. Confucius and many of his followers teach that it is by experiencing desires that we learn the value of social strictures that make an ordered society possible (See Lunyu 2.4.). And at least for Confucius' follower Zi Xia, renowned in the later tradition for his knowledge of the Book of Songs, one's natural desires for sex and other physical pleasures were a foundation for cultivating a passion for worthiness and other lofty ideals (Lunyu 1.7).[21]

Confucius' emphasis on ritual does not mean that he was a punctilious ceremonialist who thought that the rites of worship and of social exchange had to be practiced correctly at all costs. Confucius taught, on the contrary, that if one did not possess a keen sense of the well-being and interests of others his ceremonial manners signified nothing. (Lunyu 3.3) Equally important was Confucius' insistence that the rites not be regarded as mere forms, but that they be practiced with complete devotion and sincerity. “He [i.e., Confucius] sacrificed to the dead as if they were present. He sacrificed to the spirits as if the spirits were present. The Master said, ‘I consider my not being present at the sacrifice as though there were no sacrifice’” (Lunyu 3.12).

3. Confucius' Political Philosophy

Confucius' political philosophy is also rooted in his belief that a ruler should learn self-discipline, should govern his subjects by his own example, and should treat them with love and concern. “If the people be led by laws, and uniformity among them be sought by punishments, they will try to escape punishment and have no sense of shame. If they are led by virtue, and uniformity sought among them through the practice of ritual propriety, they will possess a sense of shame and come to you of their own accord” (Lunyu 2.3; see also 13.6.). It seems apparent that in his own day, however, advocates of more legalistic methods were winning a large following among the ruling elite. Thus Confucius' warning about the ill consequences of promulgating law codes should not be interpreted as an attempt to prevent their adoption but instead as his lament that his ideas about the moral suasion of the ruler were not proving popular.

Most troubling to Confucius was his perception that the political institutions of his day had completely broken down. He attributed this collapse to the fact that those who wielded power as well as those who occupied subordinate positions did so by making claim to titles for which they were not worthy. When asked by a ruler of the large state of Qi, Lu's neighbor on the Shandong peninsula, about the principles of good government, Confucius is reported to have replied: “Good government consists in the ruler being a ruler, the minister being a minister, the father being a father, and the son being a son” (Lunyu 12.11). I should claim for myself only a title that is legitimately mine and when I possess such a title and participate in the various hierarchical relationships signified by that title, then I should live up to the meaning of the title that I claim for myself. Confucius' analysis of the lack of connection between actualities and their names and the need to correct such circumstances is often referred to as Confucius' theory of zhengming. Elsewhere in the Analects, Confucius says to his disciple Zilu that the first thing he would do in undertaking the administration of a state is zhengming. (Lunyu 13.3). In that passage Confucius is taking aim at the illegitimate ruler of Wei who was, in Confucius' view, improperly using the title “successor,” a title that belonged to his father the rightful ruler of Wei who had been forced into exile.[22] Xunzi composed an entire essay entitled Zhengming. But for Xunzi the term referred to the proper use of language and how one should go about inventing new terms that were suitable to the age. For Confucius, zhengming does not seem to refer to the ‘rectification of names’ (this is the way the term is most often translated by scholars of the Analects), but instead to rectifying the behavior of people and the social reality so that they correspond to the language with which people identify themselves and describe their roles in society. Confucius believed that this sort of rectification had to begin at the very top of the government, because it was at the top that the discrepancy between names and actualities had originated. If the ruler's behavior is rectified then the people beneath him will follow suit. In a conversation with Ji Kangzi (who had usurped power in Lu), Confucius advised: “If your desire is for good, the people will be good. The moral character of the ruler is the wind; the moral character of those beneath him is the grass. When the wind blows, the grass bends” (Lunyu 12.19).

For Confucius, what characterized superior rulership was the possession of de or ‘virtue.’ Conceived of as a kind of moral power that allows one to win a following without recourse to physical force, such ‘virtue’ also enabled the ruler to maintain good order in his state without troubling himself and by relying on loyal and effective deputies. Confucius claimed that, “He who governs by means of his virtue is, to use an analogy, like the pole-star: it remains in its place while all the lesser stars do homage to it” (Lunyu 2.1). The way to maintain and cultivate such royal ‘virtue’ was through the practice and enactment of li or ‘rituals’—the ceremonies that defined and punctuated the lives of the ancient Chinese aristocracy. These ceremonies encompassed: the sacrificial rites performed at ancestral temples to express humility and thankfulness; the ceremonies of enfeoffment, toasting, and gift exchange that bound together the aristocracy into a complex web of obligation and indebtedness; and the acts of politeness and decorum—such things as bowing and yielding—that identified their performers as gentlemen. In an influential study, Herbert Fingarette argues that the performance of these various ceremonies, when done correctly and sincerely, involves a ‘magical’ quality that underlies the efficacy of royal ‘virtue’ in accomplishing the aims of the ruler.

4. Confucius and Education

A hallmark of Confucius' thought is his emphasis on education and study. He disparages those who have faith in natural understanding or intuition and argues that the only real understanding of a subject comes from long and careful study. Study, for Confucius, means finding a good teacher and imitating his words and deeds. A good teacher is someone older who is familiar with the ways of the past and the practices of the ancients. (See Lunyu 7.22) While he sometimes warns against excessive reflection and meditation, Confucius' position appears to be a middle course between learning and reflecting on what one has learned. “He who learns but does not think is lost. He who thinks but does not learn is in great danger” (Lunyu 2.15).[23] He taught his students morality, proper speech, government, and the refined arts. While he also emphasizes the “Six Arts” — ritual, music, archery, chariot-riding, calligraphy, and computation — it is clear that he regards morality as the most important subject. Confucius' pedagogical methods are striking. He never discourses at length on a subject. Instead he poses questions, cites passages from the classics, or uses apt analogies, and waits for his students to arrive at the right answers. “Only for one deeply frustrated over what he does not know will I provide a start; only for one struggling to form his thoughts into words will I provide a beginning. But if I hold up one corner and he cannot respond with the other three I will not repeat myself” (Lunyu 7.8).

Confucius' goal is to create gentlemen who carry themselves with grace, speak correctly, and demonstrate integrity in all things. His strong dislike of the sycophantic “petty men,” whose clever talk and pretentious manner win them an audience, is reflected in numerous Lunyu passages. Confucius finds himself in an age in which values are out of joint. Actions and behavior no longer correspond to the labels originally attached to them. “Rulers do not rule and subjects do not serve,” he observes. (Lunyu 12.11; cf. also 13.3) This means that words and titles no longer mean what they once did. Moral education is important to Confucius because it is the means by which one can rectify this situation and restore meaning to language and values to society. He believes that the most important lessons for obtaining such a moral education are to be found in the canonical Book of Songs, because many of its poems are both beautiful and good. Thus Confucius places the text first in his curriculum and frequently quotes and explains its lines of verse. For this reason, the Lunyu is also an important source for Confucius' understanding of the role poetry and art more generally play in the moral education of gentlemen as well as in the reformation of society. Recent archaeological discoveries in China of previously lost ancient manuscripts reveal other aspects of Confucius's reverence for the Book of Songs and its importance in moral education. These manuscripts show that Confucius had found in the canonical text valuable lessons on how to cultivate moral qualities in oneself as well as how to comport oneself humanely and responsibly in public.


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