## Three Results Concerning Statistical Distinguishability

### 1. Time-ordered variables

If the variables in V are ordered from ‘earlier’ to ‘later’, such that only earlier variables can cause later ones; if the probability P assigns positive probability to every assignment of values of the variables in V; and the probability measure P satisfies the Causal Markov and Minimality Conditions with respect to the graph G; then it will be possible to uniquely identify the graph G on the basis of P. (Pearl 1988, Chapter 3.) This is a very strong result. If the variables in V are time-indexed, and we disallow any graph with an arrow from a later variable to an earlier variable, then causation does reduce to probability if the CMC and Minimality Conditions hold.

### 2. Linear Functions with Non-Gaussian Errors

If the variables in V are continuous; each variable is a linear function of its parents, together with an error distribution that is non-Gaussian; and the probability P on V satisfies the CMC and Minimality Condition with respect to the graph G; then it will be possible to uniquely identify G on the basis of P. (Shimizu, Hoyer, Hyvärinen, and Kerminen (2006).) If the way in which each variable in V depends upon its parents has the right functional form, then it is possible to recover the causal structure from the probability even without temporal information.

### 3. Statistical Distinguishability via Embedding Graphs

Let G and G′ be any two graphs over the vertex set V such that every probability distribution on V that satisfies the CMC and Minimality Condition with respect to G also satisfies these conditions with respect to G′, and vice versa. Then there exists a variable set WV, and graphs G*, G on W such that: (a) if X and Y are both in V, then G* will have an arrow from X to Y just in case G does and G will have an arrow from X to Y just in case G′ does; and (b) if at least one of X or Y is not in V but both are in W, then G* will have an arrow from X to Y just in case G does (so intuitively, G* and G are embeddings of G and G′ (respectively) into the same external structure); and (c) some probability measure on W that satisfies the CMC and Minimality Condition with respect to G* does not satisfy these conditions with respect to G , or vice versa. (Spirtes, Glymour and Scheines (2000), Chapter 4.) Thus if we are not able to determine from probabilities alone whether G or G′ is the correct causal graph over V, we may be able to settle the matter by looking for the right sort of additional variables.

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