Supplement to Probabilistic Causation

Suppes' Motivation for the No-screening-off Condition

Recall the Reichenbach-Suppes theory of causation:

Ct is a cause of Et if and only if:
  1. P(Et | Ct) > P(Et | ~Ct); and
  2. There is no further event Bt, occurring at a time t″ earlier than or simultaneously with t, that screens Et off from Ct.

Reichenbach added condition (ii) to rule out spurious correlations. Suppes motivates condition (ii) in a different way. Suppose that a system has two possible states at time t1, B and ~B; it has three possible states at time t2, C, C′ and C″; and two possible states at t3, E and ~E, with t1 < t2 < t3. Suppose the probabilities are as follows: P(B) = P(~B) = .5. P(C | B) = P(C′ | B) = .5, P(C″ | B) = 0; P(C | ~B) = P(C′ | ~B) = .25, P(C″ | ~B) = .5; P(E |C) = P(E | C′) = .5, P(E | C″) = 0. Suppose moreover that C, C′, and C″ screen B and ~B off from E and ~E. Suppose that B, C, and E occur at times t1, t2, and t3 respectively. Now ~C is logically equivalent to C′ ∨ C″. Then P(E | C) = .5 > P(E | ~C) = P(E | C′ ∨ C″) = .3, in accord with condition (i). However, P(E | C & B) = .5 = P(E | ~C & B), in violation of condition (ii). Intuitively, the idea is this. Overall, C raises the probability of E, because in one of the alternatives to C, namely C″, the probability of E is much lower. However, once B occurs, the only possible alternative to C is C′. Thus, given that B has already occurred, the occurrence of C (as opposed to C′) does not make a difference to the probability of E. Thus, Suppes argues that C is not a cause of E, since the probability of E was already fixed by B. But this example does not have a common cause structure; the structure is like the causal chain depicted in Figure 2 in the main text.

Copyright © 2010 by
Christopher Hitchcock <>

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