Notes to Probabilistic Causation

1. For many applications, it is useful to assume that the domain has the form of a sigma-field, which means that it is closed under countable unions and intersections.

2. This is the additivity property of probability. In some applications, it is useful to assume that probability is countably additive. That is, if A1, A2,… are all in the domain of P, and P(Ai & Aj) = 0 for all ij, then P(A1 ∨ A2 ∨ …) = P(A1) + P(A2) + …

3. When P(~C) = 0, both inequalities will fail, but for different reasons. (PR1) fails because the two probabilities are equal; (PR2) fails because the second term is undefined.

4. Reichenbach's condition was actually stronger: there must be no set of events, all occurring earlier than or simultaneously with Ct, such that their conjunction screens off C from E.

5. Eells also claims (p. 139 ff.) that some factors that are causally neutral for E also need to be held fixed. These are always factors that are component causes of E in the sense of Section 2.9.

6. As stated, causal sufficiency is a very strong assumption, and is not strictly necessary for the MC to hold. What we want is that a causally sufficient set of variables include all closest common causes. C is a closest common cause of A and B if there is a path from C to A and a path from C to B with no variable other than C in common. Suppose, for example, that F causes C, which is in turn a common cause of A and B (as shown in Figure 7 of the supplementary document Common Confusions Involving the Common Cause Principle). Then C is a closest common cause of A and B, while F is not. Suppose that the variable F were excluded from V. Even though F is a common cause of A and B, its exclusion would not create a violation of the MC, since A and B would still be screened off by C.

7. Technically, this exclusion follows from the definition of what it is for a graph to ‘represent’ a causal structure.

8. Thanks to Richard Scheines for the example.

Copyright © 2010 by
Christopher Hitchcock <>

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