Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Xunzi

1. This article adopts the pinyin romanization system, based on modern standard Mandarin, for all Chinese expressions. This system is not always intuitive, and Xunzi's name in particular is better served by “Hsün-tzǔ” (Wade-Giles) or “Syun-dz” (Yale). “Shoon dzuh” is close enough for most purposes, and in any case no one knows enough about how Chinese was pronounced by Xunzi's contemporaries to be finicky. (Variations in how Xunzi's name was written in early texts, including in the Xunzi itself, may indicate that even at the time there was no truly standard way to pronounce it.)

2. John Knoblock has made an ambitious attempt to date each book of the Xunzi, and to construct an intellectual biography of Xunzi on that basis; see the biographical chapters in the first volume of his translation of the Xunzi.

3. The interpretation of the term ru is a matter of some debate. It is often translated as “Confucian.” However, though the ru tradition was widely associated with Confucius—for example, in the “Against the Ru” book of the Mozi (Book 39)—he was not regarded as the founder of the tradition, and the Chinese term incorporates no reference to him.

4. The Mohist movement had been founded by Mozi in the fifth century B.C.E., and had defended views inimical to Xunzi's philosophy long before Xunzi was born. However, Mohists continued to be active throughout Xunzi's lifetime, and it is likely that some of them did argue specifically against his views (though no surviving Mohist text mentions him by name).

5. Several of the most important figures associated with the Daoist and Legalist traditions lived well before Xunzi's birth (assuming they really existed, a genuine issue with the Daoists Laozi and Zhuangzi). As with the Mohists, Xunzi was probably responding both to earlier objections to views similar to his own and to contemporary arguments aimed specifically at him, though once again no surviving text argues against him by name. Note that Daoism and Legalism were probably not recognized as distinctive traditions or schools until the Han dynasty, perhaps a century after Xunzi's death, and this way of classifying Warring States thinkers is not always helpful.

6. Shen Dao is sometimes depicted as a Daoist rather than a Legalist; this appears to be one point at which the traditional classifications break down. Unfortunately, extant sources on Shen Dao do not make it possible to reconstruct his views with any confidence.

7. Edward Machle's Nature and Heaven in the Xunzi provides a sophisticated defense of a religious interpretation that is sensitive to many of the difficulties faced by such readings. Robert Eno argues in his The Confucian Creation of Heaven that Xunzi's conception of heaven (like that of other early Confucians) is sometimes religious, but that he adjusted it in different contexts to suit his rhetorical needs. Paul Goldin's Rituals of the Way asserts what is probably the most extreme religious interpretation in the English-language literature, though without much argument.

8. The reader should be warned that this essential point can be obscured when, as is common, “xing” gets translated into English as “nature.” Still, “nature” is a sufficiently vague term and the context is often sufficiently plain that readers sensitive to this issue will usually be able to avoid missing the point of Xunzi's claims.

9. Two passages contradict the claims made in this paragraph. A passage in Book 1 says that a gentleman does not have desires for what is not right, and a passage in Book 21 says that sages entirely lack desire. One possibility is that in his discussions of human nature Xunzi gives “desire” a technical sense, to refer specifically to those desires that are the spontaneous products of human xing, but in his discussion of the gentleman in Book 1 he uses it in a more popular sense. It is hard to see how this could make sense of the passage in Book 21, however; perhaps this is an issue on which Xunzi changed his mind. (Note that in Book 23 Xunzi insists that sages have the same xing as other people, which implies that they do have the same spontaneous desires as others.)

10. The word “e” has often been translated as “evil” in this context, but it is now widely recognized that this exaggerates Xunzi's view. For example, Xunzi is certainly not agreeing with St. Augustine's belief in a evil human nature that manifests itself in a desire to do wrong for the sake of doing wrong (though like Augustine he uses his pessimism about human nature to defend authoritarian political structures).

11. On this issue see especially the essays by Bryan W. Van Norden and David Wong in Kline and Ivanhoe, eds., Virtue, Nature, and Moral Agency in the Xunzi. (Van Norden takes Xunzi to be saying that approval is independent of desire. Wong argues to the contrary that approval must be somehow grounded in desire, and reads Xunzi as advocating enlightened self-interest.)

12. This discussion takes advantage of a pun in classical and written Chinese: the words “le” (“enjoyment”) and “yue” (“music”) sounded the same, and were written with the same character. Today the pun is easier to hear in Cantonese than in Mandarin, on which the pinyin system of romanization adopted in this article is based. In Cantonese, the words are pronounced “lok” and “ngok,” respectively.

13. The argument against Mohist economic policy that appears in Book 10 of the Xunzi is also thoroughly consequentialist: Xunzi argues that the Mohist policy of frugality would lead to the very poverty it was intended to prevent.

14. See especially the treatment in Chad Hansen's A Daoist Theory of Chinese Thought.

15. More specifically, he writes that recognizing the shi as shi and the fei as fei is what is called knowledge. The terms “shi” and “fei,” could be used to mean “right” and “wrong,” respectively, but they were also often used in early Chinese philosophy of language to stand in for distinctions in general.

16. However, he goes on to refer to the five sense organs, though the heart is sixth on his list. This may mean that the heart was inserted into the list after the rest of the discussion had more or less reached its current form. Cf. the further discussion of this passage above in Section 8, Epistemology.

17. Xunzi here is presumably thinking about proper names. If so, then like the Later Mohists, he is distinguishing proper names from general terms only on the grounds of their smaller extensions. (It is also interesting that both presuppose the view, also dominant in contemporary discussions of the semantics of proper names, that a proper name—what the Mohists called a “private name”—is an expression that applies to just one person. That this view is so widespread, and in otherwise extremely different philosophical traditions, is interesting in part because the normal case, in both traditions, is for proper names to be shared by many different people.)