Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Trust

1. Philip Pettit offers some opposition to this common view about trust (1995, 208).

2. Other uncontroversial elements of trust are that trust can be unconscious or tacit (Lagerspetz 1998) and that trust and distrust are “contraries but not contradictories; between them lies a neutral space” (Jones 1996, 16). Elements of trust that specifically concern its epistemology, its value, or what sort of mental attitude it is appear under The Epistemology of Trust, The Value of Trust, and Trust and the Will, respectively.

3. Accounts of trust as a three-place relation can vary. For example, Baier describes the relation as “A trusts B with valued item C” (1986); in other words, A entrusts B with C. (For objections to Baier's entrusting model, see Jones 1996, 10, 17–19.) Interestingly, in “Trust and Terror,” Karen Jones objects to “three-place analyses” of trust for failing to account for a basic kind of trust that terror often undermines: what Jones calls “basal trust” (2004).

4. To return to a previous example: a sexist employer might truly care about his female employees, even though his caring attitude is informed by sexist stereotypes about female intelligence. Such stereotypes may prevent him from giving women hard tasks that he thinks would frustrate them, but that they would welcome. His female employees might recognize that he means well, but still fail to trust him.

5. Insofar as they see trustworthiness as a moral disposition, philosophers have modeled it on theories other than Aristotle's, including Kant's moral theory and consequentialism (see e.g. Hardin 2002, 36–40).

6. Points of convergence among philosophical theories of trustworthiness have to do with assumptions they make about the influence of social norms or conventions on who can be trustworthy. Philosophers tend to agree that if society is set up in such a way that it is difficult for people to be trustworthy, people are less likely to be that way. Feminist philosophers in general concur that in oppressive societies, oppressed people are stereotyped as untrustworthy, making it difficult in many contexts for these people to be trustworthy (because they are rarely trusted) or to be acknowledged as trustworthy (see e.g. Friedman 2004, 228; Webb 1992, 390, Daukas 2006).

7. Notice that the end to which the trust is directed need not be the trusting person's end alone. Trust may be rational in an end-directed way because it contributes to ends shared by people in relationships or even in whole communities. While some philosophers assume that trust is rational only if it conforms to what a rational egoist would do (i.e. someone who acts on a conception of the good that is purely individual), others say that the trust of socially embedded agents (who act on conceptions of the good that are social as well as individual) can be rational, and indeed more rational than the trust of egoists (Hollis 1998).

8. Pettit offers such an explanation as well, although McGeer is not satisfied with it. He argues that people “who desire the good opinion of others” will respond favorably to being trusted, which can give other people reason to think they will be trustworthy without having independent evidence of this fact. But McGeer claims that trust grounded in the “esteem-seeking mechanism” of wanting others' good opinion is not rational because it is not dependable; as soon as the trustees see it for what it is—a cunning attempt to get them to behave in a certain way—they will refuse to live up to it (252).

9. For simplicity's sake, I do not distinguish here between trust that is well-grounded and trust that is justified. I assume that to benefit overall from trusting, or from being trusted, the trust only needs to be justified.

10. Another good often associated with trust is language, or the ability to acquire language (Hertzberg 1988, 308; Webb 1993, 260). This good is only available if one can trust people to use words correctly.