Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Units and Levels of Selection

1. Sandra Mitchell also argues for the importance of keeping the interactor issue separate from issues involving replicators (1987).

2. Methods of relating interactor traits with genotypic or genic fitness include those of Arnold and Fristrup 1982; Heisler and Damuth 1987; Damuth and Heisler 1988, Sober and Wilson 1998; Wade 1985. Other approaches include Colwell 1981; Craig 1982; Crow and Aoki 1982; Crow and Kimura 1970; Hamilton 1975; Lande and Arnold 1983; Li 1967; Lloyd 1988; Ohta 1983; Price 1972; Uyenoyama 1979; Uyenoyama and Feldman 1980; Wade 1978, 1980; Wade and Breden 1981; Wade and McCauley 1980; Wilson 1983; Wilson and Colwell 1981; Wimsatt 1980, 1981. See discussion of some of the model differences in Lloyd [1988] 1994; Okasha 2004a,c. See Sober and Wilson 1994, 1998 and Okasha 2006 for extended discussions.

3. See Aoki 1982; Boorman and Levitt 1973; Fisher 1930; Ghiselin 1974; Leigh 1977; Levin and Kilmer 1974; Maynard Smith 1964, 1976, Uyenoyama 1979, Williams 1966.

4. Lewontin 1970, 1974; Franklin and Lewontin 1970; Slatkin 1972; see discussion in Wimsatt 1980, Brandon 1982.

5. Brandon (1985) argues that such a view, which separates the level of adaptation from that of beneficiary, cannot be explanatory. Although I sympathize with Brandon's conclusions, they follow only under his set of definitions, which Dawkins and other genic selectionists would certainly reject.

6. For explicit assumptions that being a unit of selection involves having an adaptation at that level, see Brandon 1982, 1985; Burian 1983; Mitchell 1987; Maynard Smith 1976; Vrba 1984.

7. For example, Williams 1966, Bock 1980, Dunbar 1982, Ghiselin 1974, Gould and Lewontin 1979, Hull 1980, Lewontin 1978, Mayr 1978.

8. Note that Williams says that “natural selection would produce or maintain adaptation as a matter of definition” (1966, p. 25; cf. Mayr 1976). This comment conflicts with the conclusions Williams draws in his discussion of Waddington; however Williams later retracts his bithorax analysis (1985). Williams is committed to an engineering definition of adaptation (personal communication 1989).

9. For example, Heisler and Damuth 1987; Damuth and Heisler 1988; Slatkin and Wade 1978; Uyenoyama 1979; Uyenoyama and Feldman 1980; Wade 1978, 1985; Wilson 1975, 1983. See Goodnight and Stevens 1997 for review.

10. As Williams himself has acknowledged, in a discussion on species selection: “The answer to all these difficulties must be Lloyd's…idea that higher levels of selection depend, not on emergent characters, but on any and all emergent fitnesses” (1992, p. 27).

11. (1982b, p. 81, my emphasis; see Pp. 4, 5, 52, 84, 91, 113, 114). Compare an alternative formulation of Dawkins' central question: “When we say that an adaptation is ‘for the good of’ something, what is that something?…I am suggesting that the appropriate ‘something,’ the ‘unit of selection’ in that sense, is the active germ-line replicator” (1982a, p. 47). This particular formulation, I think, asks two questions, one about who the beneficiary of the selection process is and one about who possesses adaptations. Griesemer and Wimsatt's studies (1989) on Weismannism are of great help here.

12. Note that Williams, even though he “keeps his books” in terms of genes, argued against the notion that particular group traits were group adaptations because these group traits are not properly understood as benefiting the group in the proper historical selection scenario (Williams 1966).

13. Equal, that is, except for when Sterelny and Kitcher slip over into a genuinely reductionist genic view, when they state that it is an error to claim “that selection processes must be described in a particular way, and their error involves them in positing entities, ‘targets of selection,’ that do not exist” (1988, p. 359). Here they seem to be denying the existence of interactors altogether. If interactors don't exist, then clearly a genic level account of the phenomena would be preferable to, not merely equivalent to, a hierarchical view.

14. It is taken as given that there are a variety of ways to model any selection process in population genetics; the question here concerns specific information structured into those models. For example, Kerr and Godfrey-Smith (2002) investigate various consequences of pursuing research using, alternatively, organismic and trait group models, and their paper is a useful modern application and explanation of Ilan Eschel's 1972 work. But note that the authors help themselves at the start of the paper to all the higher level information. See Lloyd [1988] 1994, Ch. 4, for a discussion of structured population models and the consequences of various parameter changes.

15. It should be noted that this result does not eliminate the possibility of the genic level acting as interactors in a given case; the results rather refer to the reduction of genotypic and higher level models to the allelic level.