Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Process Philosophy

1. Among the main theoretical alternatives for an ontological interpretation of the temporal existence of things, contemporary analytical ontology discusses so-called “four-dimensionalism,” “eternalism,” and the “stage theory,” which, interestingly, are all static varieties of Leibniz' analysis.

2. On the first three topics see Fortescue 2001, Brown 2005, and Herstein 2005, respectively, on the fourth see note 5 below. Process philosophy in the letter or spirit of Whitehead has been the most visible strand of contemporary process philosophy, carried by a larger group of philosophers (see section 7. on institutionalization). Without wanting to diminish the significance of Whiteheadian process philosophy, either in itself nor for process philosophy, the authors of this entry nevertheless think it an important aim to convey that process philosophy is a longstanding and highly diversified enterprise that should not be too closely associated with any particular school or movement.

3. After Whitehead's Process and Reality (which surely offers a plethora of observations, arguments, and analyses in support of all three of these claims), the various steps of a process-philosophical theory revision have been rarely explicitly envisaged, let alone systematically undertaken. Rescher 1996 and 2000 offer the—to date—only introductions to a (non-Whiteheadian) systematic process philosophy.

4. The following reconstruction and discussion of Strawson's argument is based on Rescher 1962 and 1996, ch. 3.

5. A noteworthy forerunner of these efforts to clarify the logical features of processes vis-à-vis other categories can be found in Zemach 1970. Seibt has developed a Vendler-style classification of basic occurrence types in terms of inferential networks, i.e., independently of the features of a particular language, which is integrated into a more comprehensive approach for a general classifcation of processes based on five parameters that address various structural and compositional aspects (2004, 2009). Galton and Mizoguchi (2009) explore in greater detail the logical differences between processes and events. In parallel, the Vendler/Kenny classification also launched and reinforced research on actions per se, i.e., on the logic of action discourse for different types of actions, see e.g. Stout 1996, Kühl 2008. Based on Kenny's classification, Fink (1973) argues that only certain types of occurrences can be the subject of value judgments — an important result for the ontology of values.

6. For further details on issue (ii) see, e.g., Rescher 1996 and Rubenstein 1997.— The process-philosophical dissolution of the problem of persistence (issue iii) is even more striking perhaps. In the current discussion developmental processes are frequently used to elucidate the difference between “perdurance” and “endurance” (Mark Johnston, David Lewis) in time. But, at a closer look (and one not tinted by the presuppositions of substance metaphysics), the distinction between endurance and perdurance sits badly with ‘activity-like’ processes (e.g., boiling) that take time like perdurants yet are “wholly present” like endurants. Several authors thus have pointed out that processes behave like continuants (Zemach 1970, Seibt 1990, Stout 1997, Galton 2006). For a more fully worked out process-ontological account of persistence (“recurrence theory”) see Seibt 1998 and 2008. — The idea that a process philosophy can put (rudimentary forms of) normativity into nature is further developed in Campbell's (2011) study on truth as a property of actions. — For a process view of God as sketched in (v) see Rescher 1996, ch. 9. In connection with this issue it might be useful to restate the caveat from section 2, drawing attention to the fact that this entry does not detail the contributions of process thought to process theism. While many American process philosophers, especially Whiteheadians, have been inclined to address general theological questions within the exposition of a process metaphysics, it should be noted that in the current international research landscape that this article is trying to do justice to, theism is not an integral element of a process philosophy. Many researchers currently working on process-philosophical themes do not consider the nature of God an inevitable or even legitimate subject for their research. This need not be taken as an indication of the increasing atheism among process philosophers, but merely as an effect of the increasing specialization of academic research. Guided by the philosophy of Charles Hartshorne and, more recently, stimulated and promoted by the work of J. L. Cobb and D.R. Griffin, the area of “process theology” by now has become a diversified field of inquiry of its own, combining philosophy of religion and theology (often Christian theology but more recently also the theology of religions).

7. For the use of process ontology for an interpretation of certain concepts of chemistry see Needham 1999, 2003. The strongest arguments for a process ontology in biology are perhaps those that operate at the level of cell biology, see the collection by Koutroufinis (2012) and Dupré (2012, ch. 10 and 11, partly co-authored with Maureen O'Malley). Since Dupré is not a card-carrying process philosopher, his observations may be taken to carry particular force. Surveying results from the biology of microbes and metagenomics, Dupré argues that phenomena of horizontal or lateral gene transfer as well as fundamental symbiotic dependencies between microbes and their embedding multicellular communities present a severe challenge to the traditional notion of the monogenomic biological individual (organism) as the focal unit of inheritance and selection. “Life is in fact a hierarchy of processes (e.g., metabolic, developmental, ecological, evolutionary) and...any abstraction of an ontology of fixed entities must do some violence to this dynamic reality” (p. 188f), which displays more the form of a net than single lineages within a ‘tree of life.’

8. But compare Hättich (2004) who adapts the Whiteheadian framework for an interpretation of axiomatic quantum field theory. For more general expositions of a Whiteheadian approach to the interpretation of quantum physics see, e.g., Eppersen 2004 and Stapp 2007.

9. Non-Whiteheadian process metaphysics would seem to fit best with the 'decoherence' approach to the measurement problem. That processes, both microphysical and macrophysical, are best conceived of as non-particular and indeterminate individuals is argued by Seibt (1990, 2002).

10. See in particular Bickhard 2000 and Campbell/Bickhard 2011, as well as Wimsatt 1997, where emergence and reducibility are defined in terms of types of interactions with a physical system.

11. For an extensive and in-depth treatment of questions of complexity see Rescher's 1998; for the axiological question addressed here see in particular his 2012.

12. In Whiteheadian process metaphysics such mutual dynamic dependencies are introduced by way of informal definitional characterizations—they are included in the description of how prehensions, subjective aim and subjective form of an actual entity relate to each other. Some non-Whiteheadian process ontologists explore formal theories of circular and impredicative definitions to make these dependencies claims more precise.