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Peirce's Logic

First published Fri Dec 15, 1995; substantive revision Fri Aug 9, 2013

There are two different ways to approach Peirce's logic. One is to focus on how the main topics of logic evolved and were shaped within Peirce's framework. This ‘bottom-up’ approach not only provides us with genuine insight into Peirce's logic, but also contributes to another, even greater body of research—Peirce's philosophy. However, the bottom-up method faces a serious obstacle because the enormous nexus of Peircean ideas is difficult to unravel and separate.

The other approach is to highlight Peirce's achievements in logic and to locate Peirce's contributions within the context of modern logic. This ‘top-down’ approach has merit both in its defined scope and in its appeal to those who are interested in the development of logic in general. On the other hand, the top-down approach carries with it the risk of isolating Peirce's logic from his greater philosophy.

The entry aims to mix these two methods so that we may present Peirce's logic both for Peirce scholars and for those interested in the development of modern logic. Without getting lost in Peirce's ambitious blueprint for philosophy, we will connect his main views in logic within his own philosophy so that a coherent picture of Peirce's logic may emerge. We single out the common theme of Peirce's various contributions to modern logic, namely, to extend logic, as characterized by the following three different dimensions:

Though these three contributions of Peirce's logic have been discussed in the literature (see generally Houser et al. 1997), the main goal of the present entry is to provide the reader with a wide perspective by outlining themes which run through his three ambitious enterprises. By carefully examining how Peirce proposed each of the three historical achievements, we find that Peirce was determined to carry out an important mission—to extend the horizon of logic.

1. Extension of logic and logical systems

Charles Sanders Peirce was a philosopher, but it is not easy to classify him in philosophy because of the breadth of his work. Logic was one of the main topics on which Peirce wrote. If one focuses on logic, however, it becomes apparent that Peirce's concept of logic and his work on logic were much broader than his predecessors', his contemporaries', and ours. Peirce located logic in his large architectonic framework of philosophy, which is why some philosophers strongly believe that Peirce's logic cannot be properly understood without understanding his pragmatism and his semiotics, to mention but two of his other contributions. Even within the traditional boundaries of logic, Peirce made too many contributions to outline in a single article.

Acknowledging the nature of this next-to-impossible task, we focus on Peirce's revolutionary achievements as follows: extending the horizon of logic in two dimensions, one from monadic properties to relations and the other from symbolic to diagrammatic systems. While the former contribution has positioned Peirce as a founder of modern logic along with Frege, it took much longer for Peirce's latter achievement to receive proper attention from logicians. The main goal of this entry is not only to present Peirce's accomplishments in extending both logic and logical systems, but also to explore the relation between these two novel developments.

In the next section, we locate the root of Peirce's introduction of quantifiers and bound variables. Starting with his 1870 paper “Description of a Notation for the Logic of Relatives, Resulting from an Amplification of the Conceptions of Boole's Calculus” (DNLR), we follow the steps Peirce took until he presented the final form of his first-order logic in his 1885 paper “On the Algebra of Logic: A Contribution to the Philosophy of Notations.” Our focus is on the main motivation behind Peirce's search for a new logic rather than on the details of the final product that could represent relations. Interestingly enough, we find that the same goal—when viewed from a slightly different angle—is also a driving force behind Peirce's new diagrammatic system, Existential Graphs (‘EG’ henceforth), that is, how to represent relational states of affairs in a better way. This is the topic of the third section. Again, it is important to remember that Peirce's Existential Graphs are not just an expansion of logical languages but also underline Peirce's new approach to logic and formalization.

Finally, there is a brief discussion of Peirce's notes on developing semantics for three-valued logic in the supplement: Peirce's Three-Valued Logic.

2. From monadic to dyadic/polyadic logic

Independently of one another, Peirce and Frege introduced quantifiers and bound variables in a large leap from the traditional Aristotelian logic to modern logic. What is the essence of the leap made by Peirce and Frege? Is it just a matter of introducing new notation, i.e., quantifiers and variables, so that we may more easily formalize our reasoning? Nobody could deny the power of formalization which has led early 20th century mathematicians to surprising achievements and results.[1]

If so, modern logic would simply be Aristotelian logic plus quantifiers/variables. This would equate one of Peirce's main contributions to logic to the simple increase of the scope of formalization. Thus, those who believe that increasing the scope of formalization is equivalent to increasing the scope of logic would agree with this evaluation.

While acknowledging the enormous impact of the adoption of quantifiers and bound variables on the world of logic and mathematics, we will explore Peirce's insight behind the new formalism. In this section, we will show how Peirce's conviction about the novelty of the logic of relatives led him to the invention of quantifiers/variables. Hence, quantification theory, according to Peirce, is not a matter of an extension of formal vocabulary, but an expansion into territory that is qualitatively different from what Aristotelian logic covers.

Peirce's 1885 paper “On the Algebra of Logic: A Contribution to the Philosophy of Notations” has been considered to be the place where Peirce's quantification theory was fully presented. This is why we hear that there is a six year interval between Frege's Begriffsschrift (1879) and Peirce's quantification theory. Since Peirce was not aware of Frege's work on the topic, it is correct give credit to both logicians for their work on the foundations of modern logic. Nonetheless, there are two main reasons why Frege's contribution to the foundations of modern logic is distinctive: (i) Frege's Begriffsschrift was published before Peirce's “On the Algebra of Logic,” and (ii) Frege presented a logical system equipped with axioms and rules. Though the matter is controversial, we do not plan to pursue it in this entry.

But the story has some twists. One is that Peirce's 1870 paper exhibits his struggle for the essential feature of modern logic—the algebra of relations and quantified phrases, as we will see in section 2.1. The other interesting fact is that Peirce's work and notations were much better known to contemporary logicians, and we had to wait for Russell to reintroduce Frege's first ‘discovery’ of quantifiers (Putnam 1982). For example, Ernst Schröder's Vorlesungen über die Algebra der Logik (1895) adopted Peirce's notation. Hence, strictly speaking, the Frege-first view seems to be a more recent phenomenon than Peirce's/Frege's era.

Some Peirce scholars have also claimed that Peirce's invention of quantifiers is a product of Peirce's own philosophy of logic, which is different from Frege's.[2] Hintikka's (1997) proposal to explain a main difference between Frege's and Peirce's contribution to modern logic is quite intriguing. Borrowing van Heijenoort's distinction between Boole's logic as a calculus and Frege's universality of logic, Hintikka locates Peirce in Boole's camp, calling it the model-theoretic tradition. Unlike Frege's view of the universe, the model-theoretic tradition allows us to reinterpret a language and thus assign different universes to quantifiers. Acording to Hintikka, Peirce's development of modal logic is a good piece of evidence to show how fruitful Peirce's way of understanding quantifiers could be (Hintikka 1997). At the same time, Hintikka suggests that the recent Frege-first view is symptomatic of a larger prejudice against the model-theoretic tradition and a bias towards the universalist tradition of logic. Some have speculated that the somewhat unique and unfortunate circumstances surrounding Peirce's life might be related to his reputational lag. Perice had no regular academic job and no luck with the publication of the major portion of his work on logic; he was unpopular among mainstream academics, and a certain obscurity was found in his writings.

It is not a goal of the present entry to settle this debate. The point is not to determine who deserves the credit as the founder of modern logic, but rather to appreciate the novelty of the contribution that each logician made to overall development of modern logic. In what follows, we focus on Peirce's own developments and aim to show that Peirce's insight about special features of relations (as opposed to non-relations, i.e., properties) is the main driving force behind his inventions of both his quantification theory and his graphical systems. Hence, we claim that Peirce's invention of quantifiers/variables is not just an introduction of new notation, but a reflection of Peirce's deep insight into a new logic to come. First, we will examine how Peirce's work on relations transformed into quantification theory.

2.1 Formalization of relations

Peirce's 1870 paper “Description of a Notation for the Logic of Relatives, Resulting from an Amplification of the Conceptions of Boole's Calculus” (DNLR) is the first place where Peirce presented the logic of relations in a full length, and his 1885 paper “On the Algebra of Logic: A contribution to the Philosophy of Notations” is where his quantification theory was presented in a comprehensive together with axiomlike “icons”.[3]

As the title suggests, DNLR extends the territory of logic from non-relations to relations while remaining faithful to Boole's algebraic notation.[4] First, it is well-known that a problem with Boole's existential propositions (as opposed to universal propositions) motivated Peirce and others to go beyond Boole's logic.[5] It is somewhat instructive to compare the following three notations for Aristotelian statements:[6]

  Boole (1854) Peirce (1870) Mitchell (1883)
All a are b. a = 0 ab ( + b)1
No a is b. ab = 0 a ( + )1
Some a is b. va = vb [a] (ab)u
Some a is not b. va = v [ab] (a)u

It is clear that all three logicians had quantification (i.e., “all” and “some”) in mind, but it is far from clear whether Boole's problematic representation of existential statements caused Peirce to invent or move on to a notation for quantifiers and variables in something like a first-order logic. In light of Mitchell's more elaborate representation for two-dimensional propositions (Mitchell 1883: 87), some who believe that this is the case have argued that Mitchell's use of quantifiers was the direct source for Peirce's introduction of quantifiers and bound variables (Geraldine Brady 1997). There is a strong possibility that Mitchell influenced Peirce's notation for quantifiers and bound variables (which appear in his 1885 paper). But, we need to note that Mitchell's subscript does not function as a bound variable. More importantly, this view might overlook one crucial aspect of Peirce's quantification logic, namely his effort to mathematize and/or formalize relations. Hence, we cannot talk about Peirce's quantification logic without mentioning De Morgan's influence, in particular with regards to his writing on relations in logic.

The following picture emerges: Inspired by Boole's algebra of logic, but at the same time taking his father's (Professor Benjamin Peirce) negative view of logic seriously,[7] Peirce explored a way to extend Boole's spirit to a larger domain of our reasoning. The title of the 1870 paper spells out the project: “Description of a notation for the logic of relatives, resulting from an amplification of the conceptions of Boole's calculus of logic.” The paper started with mentioning De Morgan's work on relations (1864) but after several examples concluded that “[t]his system [De Morgan's system] still leaves something to be desired.” By praising Boole's work in the next sentence, Peirce hinted at his plan to bring in the algebra of logic to improve the shortcomings of De Morgan's system. On the other hand, Boole's algebra of logic is “restricted to that simplest and least useful part of the subject, the logic of absolute terms” (DNLR CP:3.45). Hence, Peirce's project is

to inquire whether it [Boole's algebra of logic] cannot be extended over the whole realm of formal logic … [and] to show that an affirmative answer can be given to this question. (DNLR CP:3.45)

What does he mean by ‘the whole realm of formal logic’? Peirce answers: “Deductive logic can really not be understood without the study of the logic of relatives” (1902 CP:3.641).

Correctly believing that traditional Aristotelian logic was too limited to be used for comprehensive deductive reasoning, Peirce sought to extend the algebra of logic beyond monadic predicates (which correspond to Boole's classes) so that our reasoning involving relations could be formalized in a system. In that sense, Peirce's pioneering work on modern logic started in the 1870 paper. This is not to raise the Frege-first or Peirce-first debate again, but rather to draw our attention to the goal of Peirce's project—that is, to broaden the scope of formalization in logic. Peirce's main contribution to modern logic does not simply lie in the introduction of new vocabulary for quantifiers and bound variables, but also in his sharp appreciation of the distinction between properties and relations. Peirce's early insight into the importance of reasoning involving relations is a key element in understanding the difference between Peirce's and Frege's developments of first-order logic.[8] Furthermore, in the next section we will show how Peirce's obsession with the logic of relations led him to the invention of Existential Graphs.

Peirce intuited a fundamental difference between the logic of non-relatives versus the logic of relations.[9] Peirce makes an insightful remark about the distinct logical nature for relations when negation is combined:

[W]hile in non-relative logic negation only divides the universe into two parts, in relative logic the same operation divides the universe into 2n parts, where n is the number of objects in the system which the relative supposes. (1880 CP:3.221)

Suppose P is a monadic predicate (which is non-relative). Then, given an object in the universe, we know it is either P or not-P. However, in the case of relations, negation complicates the division of the universe. With a binary relation on a given pair of objects,[10] there are four possible combinations, depending on whether it is “yes” or “no” to first and second elements of the pair. In the same manner, a ternary relation has eight ways to carve up the given universe. It seems obvious that the complication that relations bring in our reasoning pushed Peirce to develop new notational systems. In other words, Peirce's invention of quantifiers and bound variables was an outcome of his struggle to expand the scope of formalization to cover relations. Merrill's paragraph is a nice summary for the matter:

It is widely recognized that Peirce's two most important contributions to logic were the logic of relations and the theory of quantification. It is also clear that these two aspects of his logic are closely connected, since Peirce's search for an adequate logic of relations stimulated his development of quantification theory. The quantification complexities of many relational statements cried out for quantifiers. (Merrill 1997: 158)

Hence, Peirce and Frege approached the project of modern logic from different directions: Peirce struggled with the formalization of reasoning involving relations and produced the representation of quantifiers/variables, while Frege aimed to present a system comprehensive enough to represent arithmetic. Peirce's battle for a new system of logic between 1870 and 1885 could remind us that propositional logic is as powerful as monadic predicate logic, and that quantifiers are needed for non-monadic predicates. In the entry of Dictionary of Philosophy and Psychology (1902), Peirce himself summarizes the literature on the logic of relatives in the following way:

C.S. Peirce, in 1870, extended Boole's algebra of logic, so as to apply to them, and after many attempts produced a good general algebra of logic, together with another algebra specially adapted to dyadic relations (Studies in Logic, by members of the Johns Hopkins University, 1883, Note B, 187–203). (1902 CP:3.643)

His 1870 paper is far from being a final product of modern logic, but represents a milestone as the first attempt to formalize relations and to introduce quantified phrases. As Peirce states at the beginning of the paper, the goal of the project is to apply Boole's algebra of logic to the realm of relations which De Morgan was interested in. As we now know, first-order logic is a logic of relations insofar as quantifiers and bound variables are dispensable for a logic of monadic predicates. Along with a notational distinction between monadic versus relational predicates in terms of plain fonts and italics, “lw” denotes “whatever is lover of a woman” (DNLR CP:3.68) and “lw” means “a lover of every woman” (DNLR CP:3.77). By connecting multiplication with the phrase ‘every’ and addition with ‘some,’ the following passage is a precursor for the notations which appear in his 1885 paper:

From this [Π′ ≺ Σ′, where Π′ signifies logical multiplication and Σ′ signifies logical addition] it follows that swsw [i.e., a servant of every woman is a servant of a woman] … From this we have (ls)wlsw [i.e., a lover-of-a-servant of every woman is a lover-of-a-servant of a woman]. (DNLR CP:3.97)

These notations and algebra led Dipert to the following statement:

C.S. Peirce was the first person in the history of logic to use quantifier-like variable-binding operators (briefly in 1870, W2, 392f, pre-dating Frege's Begriffsschrift (1879)). (Dipert 2004: 290)

However, the limit of the project of the 1870 paper is clear. It does not present a calculus for the logic of relations:

I regret that I am not in a situation to be able to perform this labor [a calculus, or art of drawing inferences based on the notation I am to describe]. (DNLR CP:3.45)

Hence, as Dipert said,

this [no concern with axioms for logic or any ordering of theorems] causes for the modern reader an appearance of casualness, even sloppiness. (Dipert 2004: 297)

Here is Putnam's observation:[11]

Peirce gave no system of axioms for first-order logic, although his “existential graphs” are a complete proof procedure for first-order logic (an early form of natural deduction). (Putnam 1982: 298)

While a good portion of that paper was devoted to classification among relations, the paper has important notions which became consistent themes throughout Peirce's numerous writings on logic: assigning logical interpretations to mathematical (i.e., algebraic in this case) operations,[12] relations as sets of ordered pairs, logical sum and logical product, compositions among relations, and matrix representation.[13]

2.2 Introduction of vocabulary

In a more comprehensive and survey-style paper written ten years later entitled “On the algebra of logic” (Peirce 1880). we find the introduction of Σ and Π to express logical sums and logical products, and existential and universal quantifiers, respectively (1880 CP:3.223, 3.247, 3.249). Interestingly enough, Peirce again focuses on compositions of relations and predicts when complexity arises, which must have pushed him to the invention of a new notation. In 1882, we see the appearance of these two quantifiers with bound variables:

If l denotes any general dual relative, then the coefficient of the pair I:J in l is written (l)i j. (CP:3.309)

Every relative term, x, is separable into a part called ‘self-x,’ Sx, such that Sx = Σx(x)ii(I : I). (CP:3.310)

One more significant step towards the completion of Peirce's notation of first-order logic was taken in his 1883 appendix “The logic of relatives.” Even though it is not a complete paper but rather a note, the key notions of his new notation are spelled out more clearly than in previous papers. A relation is modeled by a pair of objects:

A dual relative term, such as ‘lover,’ ‘benefactor,’ ‘servant,’ is a common name signifying a pair of objects. (1883 CP:3.328)

Even though the basic idea for ordered pairs existed in the 1870 paper, we can see more clearly how it is combined with quantifiers and bound variables in the 1883 Note (CP:3.329):

A general relative may be conceived as a logical aggregate of a number of such individual relatives. Let l denote “lover”; then we may write

l = ΣiΣj(l)ij(I : J)

where (l)ij is a numerical coefficient, whose value is 1 in case I is a lover of J, and 0 in the opposite case, and where sums are to be taken for all individuals in the universe. (1883 CP:3.329)

With these tools, Peirce started formalizing sentences which require multiple quantifiers:


ΣiΣj(l)ij > 0

means that something is a lover of something; and

ΠiΣj(l)ij > 0

means that everything is a lover of something. (1883 CP:3.351)

In the same paragraph, another significant move was made toward the modern style of first-order logic, that is, to remove algebraic representation:

We shall, however, naturally omit, in writing the inequalities, the ‘> 0’ which terminates them all; and the above two propositions will appear as

ΣiΣj(l)ij and ΠiΣj(l)ij

(1883 CP:3.351)

It is worthwhile to note that multiple quantifiers, i.e., both universal and existential quantifiers, are introduced in one sentence, and as we all know, this complicates the matter a great deal. It did not escape Peirce's attention:

The logic of relatives is highly multiform; it is characterized by innumerable immediate inferences, and by various distinct conclusions from the same sets of premises. … The effect of these peculiarities is that this algebra cannot be subjected to hard and fast rules like those of the Boolian calculus; and all that can be done in this place is to give a general idea of the way of working with it. (1883 CP:3.342)

When the relative and non-relative operations occur together, the rules of the calculus become pretty complicated. (1883 CP:3.351)

Obviously, Peirce noticed a fundamental difference between the logic of non-relatives and the logic of relatives, which corresponds to a difference between propositional and first-order logic. I suspect this is one of the reasons why Peirce did not share Frege's interest in developing an axiomatic system—at least for a while—until his EG was invented. For the rest of the Note, Peirce presents examples in the new notation involving multiple quantifiers (1883 CP:3.352–3.357).

By reading one of Peirce's best-known logic papers, the 1885 paper “On the algebra of logic: A contribution to the philosophy of notation” (1885a), we realize that as far as first-order logic goes, the key concepts and vocabulary were already formed in his previous work discussed above. We also note that the goal of the 1885 paper outlined in the first section is more or less the same as the proposal made in his 1870 paper: “The first is the extension of the power of logical algebra over the whole of its proper realm” (1885a CP:3.364). Also, he almost reiterates the limit of the project which he “regrets” in 1870: “I shall not be able to perfect the algebra sufficiently to give facile methods of reaching logical conclusions” (1885a CP:3.364). That is, we should not expect a full-blown deductive system in this paper, but “I can only give a method by which any legitimate conclusion may be reached and any fallacious one avoided” (1885a CP:3.364). He carries out his promise in section 3 of the paper by suggesting a list of methods of transformation, which is not complete. The following are some of the rules involving quantifers (1885a CP:3.396):[14]

3. From symbolic to iconic representation

So far, we have argued that Peirce's insight on relations pushed him to extend the territory of logic from monadic, non-relational, propositional logic to relational quantification logic. This represented the beginning of modern logic as we know it. In this section, we take up a different angle of Peirce's adventure—to extend forms of representation from symbolic systems to diagrammatic systems. Believing that this aspect of Peirce's project is not yet fully appreciated, we present a story where his two different kinds of extension—one from non-relations to relations and the other from symbolic to diagrammatic—are connected with each other.

In spite of Peirce's own evaluation of EG as ‘my chef d'oeuvre,’ EG had to wait to be understood for a half century until two philosophers—Don Roberts and Jay Zeman—produced their impressive work.[15] In the 1980's, EG was receiving attention from new disciplines—computer science and artificial intelligence—thanks to John Sowa's novel application of EG to knowledge representation. More recently, interdisciplinary research on multi-modal reasoning has drawn our attention to non-symbolic systems (see, e.g., Barwise & Allwein (eds.) 1996 and Barwise & Etchemendy 1991) and EG, not surprisingly, occupied the top of their list. In that context, Shin (2002) focused on differences between symbolic versus diagrammatic systems and suggested a new way of understanding the EG system, though this was criticized in Pietarinen 2006.

While Peirce mainly presented linear expressions in his official writings from 1870 to 1885,[16] the notation adopted in Frege's 1879 Begriffsschrift is more iconic; it is at least not as linear as Peirce's in the above period. However, it is Peirce, not Frege, who invented a full-blown non-symbolic system for first-order logic—Existential Graphs. As the EG system has been investigated more rigorously, philosophical questions involving Peirce's invention of the system have been raised as well. The discovery of EG's power and novelty has naturally led us to other parts of Peirce's philosophy. Why and how did the invention of EG come about? What does EG reveal about Peirce's view of logic and representation?

Many of us have pointed out Peirce's theory of signs, which classifies signs as being of three kinds—symbols, indices, and icons—as the foremost theoretical background for Peirce's EG.[17] It is natural to connect Peirce's interest in icons with his invention of graphical systems. We do think the connection is real, and the more we explore his view on signs the better we understand his EG (Shin 2002: 22–35). But we do not think his sign theory could provide us with everything we need for the story of EG. There is a big gap between Peirce's talk about icons[18] and his invention of full-blown graphical systems; something else has to be brought into the picture to explain how Peirce arrived at EG from his talk about icons.

From a slightly different perspective, van Heijenoort's's distinction between Boole's calculus ratiocinator versus Frege's lingua characteristica could be related to the topic. Agreeing with both Hintikka's and Goldfarb's evaluation that Peirce belongs to Boole's tradition, Shin found a connection between the model-theoretic view of logic (where Boole and Peirce are placed) and EG's birth (see Shin 2002: 14–16, and Pietarinen 2006). However, Peirce's awareness of the re-interpretation of language is necessary, but not sufficient, for his pursuit of a different form of representation. While the acknowledgment of the possibility of different models of a given system was presupposed by Peirce's project for various kinds of systems, not every Boolean has presented multiple systems.

3.1 Pragmatic maxim

Without challenging these existing explanations involving Peirce's EG, in this entry we bring in one overlooked but crucial aspect of Peirce's journey to EG so that our story may fill in part of the puzzle of Peirce's overall philosophy. Peirce's mission for a new logic started with the question of how to represent relations, which led him to invent quantifiers and bound variables, as we discussed in the previous section. We claim that the same commitment—that is, to represent relations in a logical system—was a main motivation behind Peirce's search for a new kind of sign system: the iconic representation of relations. Peirce's work on Euler/Venn diagrams provides us with another piece of evidence to support our claim that the main motivation behind EG was to represent relations. While improving Venn systems, Peirce realizes that the following defect cannot be eliminated:

[T]he system [Venn's] affords no means of exhibiting reasoning, the gist of which is of a relational or abstractional kind. It does not extend to the logic of relatives. (Peirce 1911 CP:4.356)

Again, we do not think this is the crucial ingredient for the creation of EG, but one key element which works well with his theory of signs and his model-theoretic view of logic.

Peirce's graphical representation was first published in his 1897 paper “The Logic of Relatives”. After his own new notation came out in 1885 as seen above, why did Peirce revisit the logic of relations? The first paragraph of the paper provides a direct answer:

I desire to convey some idea of what the new logic is, how two “algebras,” that is, systems of diagrammatical representation by means of letters and other characters, more or less analogous to those of the algebra of arithmetic, have been invented for the study of the logic of relatives, and …. (1897 CP:3.456)

Two things should be noted. One is that diagrammatic systems are also called ‘algebra’ by Peirce. That is, according to Peirce, algebra is not limited to symbolic systems. The other is that Peirce makes it clear that two different forms of algebra carry out the new logic of relations, not new logics.

In thinking about the scope of the logic of relations, the question arises: Why did Peirce feel the need for another form of representation different from the 1885 notation? “I must clearly show what a relation is” (1897 CP:3.456). The clear understanding of ‘relations,’ Peirce believes, is a guide for his excursion into different forms of logical systems. To the reader's surprise, Peirce devotes three sections to the three grades of meaning presented in his well-known paper “How To Make Our Ideas Clear” (1878). (See the entry on Peirce's Theory of Signs.)

The first grade of understanding the word ‘relation’ comes from our ordinary experience, and the second grade is to have a more abstract and general definitional understanding. According to Peirce, that is not enough to achieve a full understanding of the word ‘relation’. Finally, Peirce's hallmark of the pragmatic maxim leads us to the third grade of clarity:

It appears, then, the rule for attaining the third grade of clearness of apprehension is as follows: Consider what effects, which might conceivably have practical bearings, we conceive the object of our conception to have. Then the whole of our conception of those effects is the whole of our conception of the object. (1878 CP:5.402)

In order to understand what a relation is, we need to know what follows from it. Then, the question is how we know what its consequences are. Here is one answer given by Peirce in the 1897 paper, as far as the term “relation” goes:

The third grade of clearness consists in such a representation of the idea that fruitful reasoning can be made to turn upon it, and that it can be applied to the resolution of difficult practical problems. (1897 CP:3.457)

Therefore, how a relation is represented is crucial in figuring out what follows from a relational state of affairs. Better representations will yield more ‘fruitful reasoning’ and hence will be more helpful for solving practical problems. It is obvious that in the paper Peirce intends to search for more desirable representations. Importantly, in section 4 when the third grade of clearness of the meaning ‘relation’ is discussed, diagrammatic representation of relations makes its first appearance.

Influenced by A. B. Kempe's graphic representation,[19] Peirce finds an analogy between relations and chemical compounds:

A chemical atom is quite like a relative in having a definite number of loose ends or ‘unsaturated bonds,’ corresponding to the blanks of the relative. (1897 CP:3.469)

A chemical molecule consists of chemical atoms, and the manner in which atoms are connected with one another is based on the number of loose ends of each atom. For example, chemical atom H has one loose end and chemical atom O has two. So, the following combination is possible, and it is a representation of the water molecule, H2O:

H ─  O

An analogy to the logic of relations goes like this, putting Peirce's ideas into more modern terms: A proposition consists of names (proper names or indices) and predicates, and each predicate has a fixed arity. For example, the predicate ‘love’ needs two names and ‘gives’ three. Hence, the following diagrammatic representation is grammatical and it is a representation of the proposition “John loves Mary.”

John ─  Loves

Peirce created a novel and productive analogy in representation between chemistry and the logic of relation by adopting the doctrine of valency as the key element for the analogy, as shown in the above two diagrams. Believing that this graphic style of representation would help us conceive the consequences or effects of a given relation in a more efficient way, Peirce presents Entitative Graphs, which is a predecessor of EG.[20]

EG keeps the representation of a relation developed in Peirce's 1897 paper, and it remains as his final and the most cherished notation for the logic of relations (CP: 3.456–3.552). EG consists of three parts—Alpha, Beta, and Gamma—which respectively correspond roughly to propositional, first-order, and modal logic. After presenting the Alpha system in a formal way, we discuss the Beta system of EG focusing on Peirce's novel ideas in expanding a propositional graphic system to a quantificational graphic system. For more details, we recommend works on EG by Roberts, Zeman, Sowa, and Shin.

3.2 Alpha system

Below we introduce Alpha Graphs as a formal system in a standard way, that is, to present its syntax (inductively) and its semantics (recursively). In order to place Peirce's graphic systems in the traditional well-developed discourse of logic, we introduce an intermediate stage, that is, to read off Peirce's graphs into symbolic language. This will make Peirce's graphs more accessible, and at the same time support our claim that Peirce extended forms of representations under the same scope of logic.

As a result, the reader might notice some differences between Peirce's terminology and ours since some of Peirce's terms are modified versions of familiar phrases. Inevitably we will end up simplifying many of Peirce's ideas behind EG. We also would like to emphasize that this is not the only way to approach Peirce's EG. For example, some claim that game-theoretic semantics were foreshadowed by Peirce, and thus argue for a more dynamic understanding of EG from the game-theoretic point of view (Burch 1994; Hilpinen 1982; Hintikka 1997; Pietarinen 2006).

Sentence symbols: A1, A2, …
Cut: [an empty ellipse]
Well-formed diagrams
  1. An empty space is a well-formed diagram.
  2. A sentence symbol is a well-formed diagram.
  3. If D is a well-formed diagram, then so is a single cut of D (we write ‘[D]’) .
  4. If D1 and D2 are well-formed diagrams, then so is the juxtaposition of D1 and D2 (write ‘D1D2’).
  5. Nothing else is a well-formed diagram.

Here we present two equivalent reading methods for the system. The Endoporeutic reading algorithm, formalized based on Peirce's suggestion, is a traditional way to understand EG. An alternative reading method, the Multiple reading algorithm, was more recently presented to approach EG in a more efficient way (for more details, see Shin 2002, §4.3).

[Endoporeutic Reading Algorithm]
  1. If D is an empty space, then it is translated into ???.
  2. If D is a sentence letter, say Ai, then it is translated into Ai.
  3. Suppose the translation of D is α. Then, [D] is translated into (¬α).
  4. Suppose the translation of D1 is α1 and the translation of D2 is α2. Then, the translation of D1D2 is (α1 ∧ α2).
[Multiple Readings Algorithm][21]
  1. If D is an empty space, then it is translated into ???.
  2. If D is a sentence letter, say Ai, then it is translated into Ai.
  3. Suppose the translation of D is α. Then, [D] is translated into (¬α).
  4. Suppose the translation of D1 is α1 and the translation of D2 is α2.
    1. the translation of D1D2 is (α1 ∧ α2),
    2. the translation of [D1D2] is (¬α1 ∨ ¬α2),
    3. the translation of [D1 [D2]] is (α1 → α2), and
    4. the translation of [[D1] [D2]] is (α1 ∨ α2).

Each of these two readings has its own strength. The Endopreutic reading assures us that the Alpha system is truth-functionally complete, since it has power to express conjunction and negation. However, this traditional method has been partly responsible for the following two incorrect judgments about Alpha diagrams: (i) There is not much difference between the Alpha system and a propositional language with only two connectives, ∧ and ¬, except that Alpha diagrams have cuts instead of symbolic connectives. (ii) When it comes down to practical use, we have no reason to adopt the Alpha system over propositional languages with more connectives justlike how we do not want to use only two connectives in a language.

Challenging these misconceptions, the Multiple readings algorithm shows that Alpha diagrams do not have to be read off as a sentence with ‘∧’ and ‘¬’ only, but can be directly read off in terms of other connectives as well. Two questions may be raised: (i) Is there a redundancy in the Multiple readings method? For example, is 4(b) above dispensable in terms of 3 and 4(a)? (ii) Does this new reading show that the Alpha system is just like a propositional language with various connectives?

Let us answer these questions through the following simple example:

The following graph is translated into the following four formulas:
[a large ellipse enclosing two disjoint smaller ellipses.  One with 'R' in it and one with 'S']
¬(¬R ∧ ¬S) Endoporeutic Reading
RS 4(d) of Multiple Readings
¬RS 3 and 4(c) of Multiple Readings
¬¬R ∨ ¬¬S 3 and 4(b) of Multiple Readings

The Endoporeutic reading allows us to get the first reading only, but we may obtain different sentences by the Multiple Readings. Of course, all of these sentences are logically equivalent. Here is an interesting point: In the case of symbolic systems, we need to prove the equivalence among the above sentences by using inference rules. But, derivation processes are dispensable in the case of the Alpha system when the Multiple readings are adopted.[22] Hence, having the clause 4(b) above in addition to clauses 3 and 4(a) is not redundant, but instead highlights a fundamental difference between Alpha diagrams and a symbolic language with various connectives (see Shin 2002: §§4.3.2, 4.4.4, and 4.5.3).

Since we have the semantics for propositional logic and our reading methods translate Alpha diagrams into a propositional language, we can live without the direct semantics. However, if one insists on the direct semantics:

Let v be a truth function such that it assigns T or F to each sentence letter and T to an empty space. Now, we extend this function to as follows:
  1. (D) = v(D) if D is a sentence symbol or an empty space.
  2. ([D]) = T iff (D) = F.
  3. (D1 D2) = T iff (D1) = T and (D2) = T.

Since it is a deductive system, we need inference rules (see Roberts 1973: 40–45).

[Transformation Rules]
The rule of erasure. Any evenly enclosed graph may be erased.
The rule of insertion. Any graph may be scribed on any oddly enclosed area.
The rule of iteration. If a graph P occurs on SA or in a nest of cuts, it may be scribed on any area not part of P, which is contained by {P}.[23]
The rule of deiteration. Any graph whose occurrence could be the result of iteration may be erased.
The rule of the double cut. The double cut may be inserted around or removed (where it occurs) from any graph on any area.

Emphasizing the symmetry both in erasure versus insertion and in even versus odd number of cuts, Shin rewrote the rules (2002, 84–85):

[Reformulated Transformation Rules]
In an E-area, say, area a,
  1. we may erase any graph, and
  2. we may draw graph X, if there is a token of X either
    1. in the same area, i.e., area a, or
    2. in the next-outer area from area a.
In an O-area, say, area a,
  1. we may erase graph X, if there is another token of X either
    1. in the same area, i.e., area a, or
    2. in the next-outer area from area a, and
  2. we may draw any graph.
A double cut may be erased or drawn around any part of a graph.

For examples of deduction sequences, refer to Roberts' pp. 45–46 and Shin 2002, p. 91.

3.3 Beta system

In §2, we showed that formalizing relations was a key motivation behind Peirce's new logic—first-order logic. In §3.1, we established a connection between Peirce's own pragmatic maxim and his graphic representation of relations. Peirce did not aim to present a new logic by inventing a graphic system, but rather to present another new notation for the logic carried out by quantifiers and bound variables. He almost took it for granted that a graphic representation of relations helps us observe their consequences in a more efficient way. Hence, the Beta system may be considered to be the final stop of Peirce's long journey, which started in 1870 at the latest.

We will not go into the formal details of the Beta system in this entry but will instead refer to Chapter 5 of Shin, where three slightly different approaches to Beta graphs—Zeman's, Roberts', and Shin's—are discussed at a full length. While Zeman's reading is comprehensive and formal, Roberts' method seems to appeal to a more intuitive understanding of the system. Taking advantage of the merits of these two existing works, Shin developed a new reading method of Beta graphs and reformulated the transformation rules of the system.[24] Her approach focuses on visual features of Beta graphs and highlights fundamental differences between symbolic versus diagrammatic systems. In the remaining part of the entry, we would like to examine how the essence of the logic of relations is graphically represented in the Beta system so that the reader may place EG in the larger context of Peirce's enterprise.

The introduction of quantifiers and bound variables is believed to be one of the key steps of first-order logic in symbolic systems. This is why some logicians take Peirce's 1885 paper “On the Algebra of Logic: A contribution to the Philosophy of Notations” to be the birthplace of modern logic. If this is the case, then how does Peirce represent quantifiers and bound variables in Beta graphs?

Interestingly enough, when Peirce considered a graphic system his first concern was representation of relations, not representation of quantifiers. As we said in §3.1, Peirce presented diagrammatic representation based on an analogy to chemical molecules for a full understanding of relations. Hence, the arity of a predicate is represented by the number of lines radiating from the predicate term. Next, Peirce extends the use of a line to connect predicates:

In many reasonings it becomes necessary to write a copulative proposition in which two members relate to the same individual so as to distinguish these members.… [I]t is necessary that the signs of them should be connected in fact. No way of doing this can be more perfectly iconic than that exemplified in [the following graph] (1903b CP:4.442):

[the phrase 'A is greater than' is to the upper left and the phrase 'is greater than B' is to the lower right.  A stepped line connects the two phrases.]

The line connecting two predicates, representing one and the same object, is called a line of identity by Peirce. That is, the sameness is represented visually in Beta diagrams.[25] In the case of a symbolic language, we may adopt one and the same quantified variable-type to represent the identity. For example, the above diagram says ∃x(x<AB<x), and hence, the variable-type x (roughly) corresponds to the identity line. However, the same variable-type is not sufficient for expressing the sameness in other cases, e.g., ∃x(x<AB<x) → ∃x(x<C).

The way universal and existential statements are represented in the Beta system highlights a difference between graphic and symbolic systems. Rather than adopting one more syntactic device for quantification, Peirce relies on the following visual features:

[A]ny line of identity whose outermost part is evenly enclosed refers to something, and any one whose outermost part is oddly enclosed refers to anything there may be. (1903b CP:4.458[26])

Let us borrow the two following graphs from Roberts (1973: 51):[27]

[two diagrams.  The first has the phrases 'is good' and 'is ugly' one above the other and a curve line connectst the two.  The second is a large ellipse enclosing a duplicate of the first diagram with, in addition, the second phrase 'is ugly' enclosed in a smaller ellipse.]

The first graph (where the outermost part of the line is evenly, zero, enclosed) says that something good is ugly, and the second graph (where the outermost part is enclosed once) says that everything good is ugly.[28]

How about the scope problem which arises when multiple quantifiers are used? In the case of a symbolic system, the linear order takes care of the problem. Peirce's solution for EG is to read off another kind of visuality: The less enclosed the outermost part of a line is, the larger the scope that the line gets.

Roberts' following example illustrates the scope matter nicely (1973: 52):

[Two diagrams.  Both have in command the first phrase 'is Catholic' above and connected on the left by a curve line to the the second phrase 'adores' to the right and connected by a straight line is the third phrase 'is a woman'. In the first diagram the second and third phrases are enclosed by an ellipse and the entire diagram is enclosed by another ellipse.  In the second diagram, the second phrase is enclosed by an ellipse and the first and second phrase are in turn enclosed by a larger ellipse; the third phrase is outside of any ellipses.]

The first graph says ∀x(Catholic(x) →∃y(Adores(x,y) ∧ Woman(y))) and the second ∃y(Woman(y) ∧ ∀x(Catholic(x) → Adores(x,y))). In the first graph, the line whose outermost part is oddly enclosed is less enclosed than the line whose outermost part is evenly enclosed. Therefore, the universal quantifier has larger scope than the existential quantifier. In the second graph, it is the other way around.

Let us summarize three interesting features of the Beta system:

  1. Relations are represented graphically, not symbolically, in the Beta system, in terms of a line. We argued that ultimately Peirce's pragmatic maxim was behind this alternative way of representation.
  2. A distinction between universal versus existential statements is represented by the visual fact about whether the outermost part of a line lies in an area enclosed by either an odd number or by an even number of cuts.
  3. The order of quantification is represented by the following visuality: The less enclosed a line is, the more extensive scope it has.


A. Primary Sources

Primary sources for C. S. Peirce's work

See the list of primary sources in the entry on Charles Sanders Peirce.

Works by C. S. Peirce cited in this entry

B. Secondary Sources

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Frege, Gottlob: logic, theorem, and foundations for arithmetic | Peirce, Benjamin | Peirce, Charles Sanders | Peirce, Charles Sanders: theory of signs


We would like to thank Randall Dipert for his excellent comments on the present entry. The main text of this entry is by Sun-Joo Shin but the supplement on three-valued logic is from the previous entry on this topic by Eric Hammer. He is thus credited as a co-author for this entry.