Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.


First published Thu Dec 4, 2008; substantive revision Tue Feb 5, 2013

“Panentheism” is a constructed word composed of the English equivalents of the Greek terms “pan”, meaning all, “en”, meaning in, and “theism”, meaning God. Panentheism considers God and the world to be inter-related with the world being in God and God being in the world. It offers an increasingly popular alternative to both traditional theism and pantheism. Panentheism seeks to avoid either isolating God from the world as traditional theism often does or identifying God with the world as pantheism does. Traditional theistic systems emphasize the difference between God and the world while panentheism stresses God's active presence in the world. Pantheism emphasizes God's presence in the world but panentheism maintains the identity and significance of the non-divine. Anticipations of panentheistic understandings of God have occurred in both philosophical and theological writings throughout history (Hartshorne and Reese 1953; Cooper, 2006). However, a rich diversity of panentheistic understandings has developed in the past two centuries primarily in Christian traditions responding to scientific thought (Clayton and Peacocke 2004). While panentheism generally emphasizes God's presence in the world without losing the distinct identity of either God or the world, specific forms of panenethism, drawing from a different sources, explain the nature of the relationship of God to the world in a variety of ways and come to different conclusions about the significance of the world for the identity of God.

1. Terminology

Because modern “panentheism” developed under the influence of German Idealism, Whiteheadian process philosophy, and current scientific thought, panentheists employ a variety of terms with meanings that have specialized content.

Theological terms as understood by panentheists:

1. Classical or Traditional Theism
The understanding that ultimate reality is a being which is distinct from the world and any other reality. This distinction often develops into an ontological separation between God and the world that makes any interaction between God and the world problematic.
2. Pantheism
A type of theism that stresses the identity of God and the world ontologically. This identity is expressed in different manifestations so distinctions can be made, but the distinctions are temporary. There is often a strong sense of necessity in God's creation of the world so that God as God must express deity in creation.
3. Transcendence
Generally, God's externality to the world so that God is unlimited by any other being or reality. Hegel and then Hartshorne understand transcendence as including all that is in order to avoid any reality external to God that limits God.
4. Immanence
God's presence and activity within the world. Panentheists assert that traditional theism limits its affirmation of God's immanence by understanding immanence as the transcendent presence of the supernatural Being within the natural realm. When this divine presence is understood as distinctly transcendent, God's presence and activity within the world as natural is an intervention of the supernatural within the natural. God, then, is absent from the natural except in specific cases of intervention.
5. Kenosis
Divine self-emptying, or withdrawal, of infinite being while present in the world.

Terms influenced by the German Idealism of Hegel and Schelling:

1. Dialectic
The presence of contradictory realities where the contradiction is overcome by including elements from each of the contradictory elements in a synthesis that is more than the combination of each member of the contradiction. Whitehead's understanding of God's redemption of evil by placing an evil event in the context of good events expresses a similar understanding although he is not as explicit as Hegel in understanding all of reality as a dialectical development.
2. Perichoresis
The ontological intermingling of the members of the Trinity so that the Father is part of the Son and the Spirit, the Son part of the Spirit and Father, and the Spirit part of the Father and Son. Moltmann utilizes this concept to describe the presence of God in the world and the world in God.

Terms influenced by Whiteheadian process philosophy:

1. Internal and External Relations
Internal relations are relations that affect the being of the related beings. External relations do not change the basic nature or essence of a being. For panentheism, the relationship between God and the world is an internal relationship in that God affects the nature of the world and the world changes the nature of God. Classical theism affirms an external relationship between God and the world in that God responds to events in the world but those events do not change God's essence, necessary existence, or basic nature.
2. Dipolar
Refers especially to God as having two basic aspects. Schelling identified these aspects as necessary and contingent. Whitehead referred to God's primordial and consequent natures meaning that God has an eternal nature and a responsive nature. Whitehead understood all reality to be dipolar in that each event includes both physical and mental aspects in opposition to a mind-body dualism. Hartshorne identified these aspects as abstract and concrete.

Terms related to current scientific thought:

1. Reductionism
All of reality is one type of existence. Ordinarily reductionism holds that all of reality can be explained by using only physical, sub-atomic, entities. Any reference to a higher being or cause results from a lack of information about the physical entities that are involved. Modern reductionism denies the existence of mental realities as a separate type of existence. Panentheism critiques reductionism as an oversimplification of reality and the experience of reality.
2. Supervenience
One reality arises out of another reality. For example, mental activity arises out of physical reality. While reductionistic understandings agree that supervenience occurs, reductionistic supervenience maintains that there are consistent principles that function in the same way at both levels. Panentheists generally understand supervenience to give rise to new principles that are effective at one level but not present at the simpler level.
3. Emergence
Emergence, as the process involved in supervenience, occurs when a new property arises out of a combination of elements. The traditional example is that water emerges out of the combination of oxygen and hydrogen atoms in certain proportions. There are a variety of types of emergence that have been identified. In part-whole emergence, the whole is more than the total of all the parts (Corning 2002). Strong emergence understands evolution to produce new and ontologically distinct levels characterized by their own laws or regularities and causal forces. Weak emergence holds that the new level follows the fundamental causal processes of physics (Clayton 2004, 9). Strong emergence is also known as ontological emergence and weak as epistemological emergence.
4. Top-Down Causation
More complex levels of objects or events affect less complex elements. Causation is ordinarily understood as being from the bottom-up meaning from the simple to the complex. Physical elements cause other, often more complex, objects or events. A common example of top-down causation is the effect of thought upon a person's body. Scientists heatedly debate the possibility of top-down causation (Davies 2006).
5. Entanglement
In quantum theory, the correlation of two particles that originate in a single event even though separated from each other by significant distance. Entangled objects behave in ways that cannot be predicted on the basis of their individual properties. The impossibility of prediction can be understood epistemically if behavior is considered the result of an average of many similar measurements or ontologically if behavior results from the existence of the world in an indefinite state prior to measurement. Both Bohr's indeterministic and Bohm's deterministic understandings of quantum theory accept this relational understanding of physical processes. Understanding the world as persistent relationships as well as separation provides a model based in science for understanding God's relation to the world. God's influence can be present at the level of individual events although this entanglement would remain hidden from a local perspective. However, the implications of entanglement for concepts of causality become even more complex when considering the relation between God and the world. Polkinghorne suggests that causality may be active information rather than an exchange of energy (2010, 9).

Although numerous meanings have been attributed to the “in” in panentheism (Clayton 2004, 253), the more significant meanings are:

1. Locative meaning
Location that is included in a broader location. For example, something may be located in a certain part of a certain room. Such a meaning is problematic in reference to God because of the common understanding that God is not limited by spatial categories. If spatial categories do not apply to God in ordinary usage, to say something is located in God becomes problematic. “In” then takes on special meanings with metaphysical content or as an analogy for God's relationship to the world.
2. Metaphysical basis for being
Beings come into existence and continue to exist due to the presence of divine Being. The concept of participation often includes the understanding that the world comes into being and continues to exist through taking part in God's Being (Clayton 2008, 118–119).
3. Metaphysical-Epistemological basis for being
Presence in God provides both identity and being. Karl Krause's panentheism asserted a metaphysical structure that involved both how an entity differs from other entities (epistemological identity) and what it is in itself (ontological status) (Göcke 2013).
4. Metaphysical interactive potential
Active indeterminacy of commingling unpredictable development of self-organizing relations derived from prior actualizations (Keller 2003, 219).
5. Emergence metaphor
A more complex entity comes from at least a partial source.
6. Mind/Body analogical meaning
The mind provides structure and direction to the organization of the organism of the body. The world is God's body in the sense that the world actualizes God and manifests God while being directed by God as different from the world. Many, but not all, panentheists utilize the mind/body analogy to describe the God/world relation in a manner that emphasizes the immanence of God without loss of God's transcendence.
7. Part/Whole analogical meaning
A particular exists in relation to something that is greater and different from any and all of its parts. The world is in God by participating in God's being and action.

2. History

Although Panentheism lacked a clear label in philosophical and religious reflection about God until Karl Krause's (1781–1832) creation of the term in the Eighteenth century (Gregersen 2004, 28), various advocates and critics of panentheism find evidence of incipient or implicit forms of panentheism present in religious thought as early as 1300 BCE. Hartshorne discovers the first indication of panentheistic themes in Ikhnaton (1375–1358 BCE), the Egyptian pharaoh often considered the first monotheist. In his poetic description of the sun god, Ikhnaton avoids both the separation of God from the world that will characterize traditional theism and the identification of God with the world that will characterize pantheism (Hartshorne 1953, 29–30). Early Vedantic thought implies panentheism in non-Advaita forms that understand non-dualism as inclusive of differences. Although there are texts referring to Brahman as contracted and identical to Brahman, other texts speak of Brahman as expanded. In these texts, the perfect includes and surpasses the total of imperfect things as an appropriation of the imperfect. Although not the dominant interpretation of the Upanishads, multiple intimations of panentheism are present in the Upanishads (Whittemore 1988, 33, 41–44). Hartshorne finds additional religious concepts of God that hold the unchanging and the changing together in a way that allows for the development and significance of the non-divine in Lao-Tse (fourth century BCE) and in the Judeo-Christian scriptures (1953, 32–38).

In philosophical reflection, Plato (427/428–348/347 BCE) plays a role in the development of implicit panentheism although there is disagreement about the nature of that role. Hartshorne drew a dipolar understanding of God that includes both immutability and mutability from Plato. Hartshorne understood Plato's concept of the divine to include the Forms as pure and unchanging being and the World soul as changing and in motion. Although he concluded that Plato never reconciled these two elements in his understanding of the divine, both aspects were present (1953, 54). Cooper, instead, thinks that Plato retained an essential distinction between the Good and the other beings that Plato called gods. According to Cooper, Plotinus (204–270 CE) rather than Plato provided the basis for panentheism with his description of the physical world as an emanation of being from the One making the world part of the Ultimate (2006, 35–39). Baltzly finds evidence in the Timaeus of a polytheistic view that can be identified as panentheistic (2010).

From Plato to Schelling (1775–1854 CE), various theologians and philosophers developed ideas that are similar to themes in contemporary panentheism. These ideas developed as expressions of traditional theism. Proclus (412–485 CE) and Pseudo-Dionysus (late Fifth to early Sixth century) drawing upon Plotinus developed perspectives that included the world in God and understood the relationship between God and the world as a dialectical relationship (Cooper 2006, 42–46). In the Middle Ages, the influence of Neoplatonism continued in the thought of Eriugena (815–877 CE), Eckhart (1260–1328 CE), Nicholas of Cusa (1401–1464 CE), and Boehme (1575–1624 CE). Although accused of pantheism by their contemporaries, their systems can be identified as panentheistic because they understood God in various ways as including the world rather than being the world and because they used a dialectical method. The dialectical method involved the generation of opposites and then the reconciliation of the opposition in God. This retained the distinct identity of God in God's influence of the world (Cooper 2006, 47–62). During the early modern period, Bruno (1548–1600 CE) and Spinoza (1631–1677 CE) responded to the dualism of traditional theism by emphasizing the relationship between God and the world to the point that the nature of any ontological distinction between God and the world became problematic. Later thinkers such as the Cambridge Platonists (Seventeenth century), Jonathan Edwards (1703–1758 CE) (Crisp 2009), and Friedrich Schleiermacher (1768–1834 CE) thought of the world as in some way in God or a development from God. Although they did not stress the ontological distinction between God and the world, they did emphasize the responsive relationship that humans have to God. Human responsiveness assumed some degree of human initiative if not freedom, which indicates some distinction between God and humans. The assumption of some degree of human initiative was a reaction against the loss of freedom due to Spinoza's close identification between God and the world (Cooper 2006, 64–90).

The nineteenth and twentieth centuries saw the development of panentheism as a specific position regarding God's relationship to the world. The awareness of panentheism as an alternative to theism and pantheism developed out of a complex of approaches. Philosophical idealism and philosophical adaptation of the scientific concept of evolution provided the basic sources of the explicit position of panentheism. Philosophical approaches applying the concept of development to God reached their most complete expression in process philosophy's understanding of God being affected by the events of the world.

Hegel (1770–1831) and Schelling (1775–1854) sought to retain the close relationship between God and the world that Spinoza proposed without identifying God with the world. Their concept of God as developing in and through the world provided the means for accomplishing this. Prior to this time, God had been understood as unchanging and the world as changing while existing in God (Cooper 2006, 90). Schelling's understanding of God as personal provided the basis for the unity of the diversity in the world in a manner that was more open than Hegel's understanding. Schelling emphasized the freedom of the creatures in relation to the necessity of God's nature as love. For Schelling, God's free unfolding of God's internal subjective necessity did not result in an external empirical necessity determining the world (Clayton 2000, 474). This relationship resulted in vitality and on-going development. Hartshorne classified this as a dipolar understanding of God in that God is both necessary and developing (1953, 234). Cooper describes Schelling's thought as dynamic cooperative panentheism (2006, 95). Hegel found Schelling inadequate and sought a greater unity for the diversity. He united Fichte's subjective idealism and Schelling's objective idealism to provide a metaphysics of subjectivity rather than substance (Clayton 2008, 125. Hegel's unification of Fichte and Schelling resulted in a more comprehensive and consistent system still based upon change in God. God as well as nature is characterized by dialectical development. In his rejection of pantheism, Hegel understood the infinite as including the finite by absorbing the finite into its own fuller nature. This retained divine transcendence in the sense of the divine surpassing its parts although not separate from the parts (Whittemore 1960, 141–142). The divine transcendence provided unity through the development of the Absolute through history. Karl Krause (1781–1832) in 1828 labeled Schelling's and Hegel's positions as “panentheism” in order to emphasize their differences from Spinoza's identification of God with the world (Reese 2008, 1). Cooper describes Hegel's panentheism as dialectical historical panentheism (2006, 107).

As Darwin's theory of evolution introduced history into the conceptualization of biology, Samuel Alexander (1859–1938), Henri Bergson (1859–1941), and C. Lloyd Morgan (1852–1936) introduced development into the ways in which all of physical reality was conceptualized. They then worked out positions that in a variety of ways understood God and the world as growing in relationship to each other. Although Hartshorne's classification of “panentheism” did not include Alexander in the category of “panentheism,” only occasionally mentioned Bergson, and made no reference to Morgan, Whitehead referred to all three of these thinkers positively. Although it may be too strong to claim that they influenced Whitehead (Emmett 1992), they did provide the background for Whitehead's and then Hartshorne's systematic development of process philosophy as an expression of panentheism. Hartshorne popularized the modern use of the term “panentheism” and considered Whitehead to be the outstanding panentheist (Hartshorne 1953, 273). Although Hartshorne made several modifications to Whitehead's understanding of God, the basic structures of Whitehead's thought were continued in Hartshorne's further development of Whitehead's philosophy (Ford 1973, Cobb, 1965). God, for process philosophy, is necessary for any actual world. Without God, the world would be nothing more than a static, unchanging existence radically different from the actual world of experience. God as both eternal and temporal provides possibilities that call the world to change and develop. God as eternal provides an actual source of those possibilities. However, if God is only eternal, the possibilities would be unrelated to the actual world as it presently exists. Thus, Whitehead and Hartshorne understand the world to be present in God in order for the possibilities that lead to development to be related to the world (Hartshorne 1953, 273). The implication of God's inclusion of the world is that God is present to the world and the world influences God. Although the presence of the world in God could be understood as a form of pantheism, process philosophy avoids collapsing the world into God or God into the world by maintaining a distinction between God and the world. This distinction is manifest in the eternality of God and the temporality of the world. It is also apparent in the freedom of the events in the world. Although God presents possibilities to the events in the world, each event “decides” how it will actualize those possibilities. The freedom of each event, the absence of divine determination, provides a way for process thought to avoid God being the cause of evil or containing evil as evil. Since God includes the events of the world, God will include the evil as well as the good that occurs in the world and this evil will affect God since the world affects God's actualization. But, because God does not determine the response of each event to the possibilities that God presents, any event may reject God's purpose of good through the intensification of experience and actualize a less intense experience. God does take this less intense, evil, experience into God's self, but redeems that evil by means of relating it to the ways in which good has been actualized. Thus, God saves what can be saved from the world rather than simply including each event in isolation from other events (Cooper 2006, 174, 180).

3. Recent Developments

Protestant theologians have contributed to recent developments of panentheism by continuing the German Idealist tradition or the tradition of process philosophy. Although the majority of the contemporary expressions of panentheism involve scientists and protestant theologians or philosophers, articulations of forms of panentheism have developed among feminists, in the Roman Catholic tradition, in the Orthodox tradition, and in religions other than Christianity.

Utilizing resources from the tradition of German Idealism, Jürgen Moltmann developed a form of panentheism in his early work, The Crucified God in 1974 (1972 for the German original), where he said that the suffering and renewal of all humanity are taken into the life of the Triune God. He explicated his understanding of panentheism more fully in The Trinity and the Kingdom in 1981. Theological concerns motivate Moltmann's concept of panentheism. Panentheism avoids the arbitrary concept of creation held by traditional theism and the loss of creaturely freedom that occurs in Christian pantheism (Cooper 2006, 248). Moltmann understands panentheism to involve both God in the world and the world in God. The relationship between God and the world is like the relationship among the members of the Trinity in that it involves relationships and communities (Molnar 1990, 674). Moltmann uses the concept of perichoresis to describe this relationship of mutual interpenetration. By using the concept of perichoresis, Moltmann moves away from a Hegelian understanding of the trinity as a dialectical development in history (Cooper 2006, 251). The relationship between God and the world develops because of God's nature as love that seeks the other and the free response of the other (Molnar 1990, 677). Moltmann does not consider creation necessary for God nor the result of any inner divine compulsion. Instead creation is the result of God's essential activity as love rather than the result of God's self-determination (Molnar, 1990, 679). This creation occurs in a process of interaction between nothingness and creativity, contraction and expansion, in God. Because there is no “outside” of God due to God's infinity, God must withdraw in order for creation to exist. Kenosis, or God's self-emptying, occurs in creation as well as in the incarnation. The nothing in the doctrine of “creation from nothing” is the primordial result of God's contraction of God's essential infinity (Cooper, 2006, 247). Moltmann finds that panentheism as mutual interpenetration preserves unity and difference in a variety of differences in kind such as God and human being, person and nature, and the spiritual and the sensuous (Moltmann, 1996, 307).

Utilizing process philosophy, David Ray Griffin assumes that scientific understandings of the world are crucial and recognizes the implications of scientific understanding for theology. However, his concept of panentheism builds on the principles of process philosophy rather than scientific concepts directly. Griffin traces modern atheism to the combination of understanding perception as exclusively based on physical sensations, accepting a naturalistic explanation of reality, and identifying matter as the only reality. But, the emergence of mind challenges the adequacy of this contemporary worldview (2004, 40–41). He claims that the traditional supernaturalistic form of theism with its emphasis upon the divine will does not provide an adequate alternative to the atheism of the late modern worldview because God becomes the source of evil. Griffin argues that traditional theism makes God the source of evil because God's will establishes the general principles of the universe (2004, 37). Process panentheism provides a way to avoid the problems of both traditional theism and materialistic naturalism (2004, 42). Griffin substitutes panexperientialism for materialism and a doctrine of perception that bases sensory perception on a non-sensory mode of perception in order to explain both the mind-body interaction and the God-world interaction. God is numerically distinct from the world but is ontologically the same avoiding dualism and supernaturalism. God and events in the world interact through non-sensory perception (2004, 44–45). Through this interaction, God can influence but not determine the world, and the world can influence God's concrete states without changing God's essence. Process panentheism recognizes two aspects of the divine, an abstract and unchanging essence and a concrete state that involves change. Through this dipolar concept, God both influences and is influenced by the world (2004, 43–44). Griffin understands God as essentially the soul of the universe although distinct from the world. The idea of God as the soul of the world stresses the intimacy and direct relationship of God's relationship to the world, not the emergence of the soul from the world (2004, 44). Relationality is part of the divine essence, but this does not mean that this specific world is necessary to God. This world came into existence from relative nothingness. This relative nothingness was a chaos that lacked any individual that sustained specific characteristics over time. However, even in the chaos prior to the creation of this world, events had some degree of self-determination and causal influence upon subsequent events. These fundamental causal principles along with God exist naturally since these causal principles are inherent in things that exist including the nature of God. The principles cannot be broken because such an interruption would be a violation of God's nature. An important implication of the two basic causal principles, a degree of self-determination and causal influence, is that God influences but does not determine other events (2004, 43). Griffin's understanding of naturalism allows for divine action that is formally the same in all events. But this divine action can occur in a variable manner so that some acts are especially revelatory of the divine character and purpose (2004, 45).

Much of the contemporary discussion and development of panentheism occurs in the context of the science and religion discussion. The early modern concept of an unchanging natural order posed a challenge to understandings of divine action in the world. The current discussion draws on the development of scientific information about the natural world that can contribute to religious efforts to explain how God acts in the world. In the contemporary discussion, Arthur Peacocke and Paul Davies have made important contributions as scientists interested in, and knowledgeable about, religion. Peacocke developed his understanding of panentheism beginning in 1979 and continuing through works in 2001, 2004, and 2006. Peacocke starts with the shift in the scientific understanding of the world from a mechanism to the current understandings of the world as a unity composed of complex systems in a hierarchy of different levels. These emergent levels do not become different types of reality but instead compose a unity that can be understood naturally as an emergentist monism. At the same time, the different levels of complexity cannot be reduced to an explanation of one type or level of complexity. The creative dynamic of the emergence of complexity in hierarchies is immanent in the world rather than external to the world (Peacocke 2004, 137–142). Similarly, Paul Davies describes the universe by talking about complexity and higher levels of organization in which participant observers bring about a more precise order (2007). An important scientific aspect of this concept of complexity and organization is the notion of entanglement especially conceptual level entanglement (Davies 2006, 45–48). Again, the organization, which makes life possible, is an internal, or natural, order rather than an order imposed from outside of the universe (Davies 2004). Peacocke draws upon this contemporary scientific understanding of the universe to think about the relationship between God and the natural world. He rejects any understanding of God as external to nature whether it is a traditional theistic understanding where God intervenes in the natural world or a deistic understanding where God initiates the natural world but does not continue to be active in the world. For Peacocke, God continuously creates through the processes of the natural order. God's active involvement is not an additional, external influence upon events. However, God is not identified with the natural processes, which are the action of God as Creator (Peacocke 2004, 143–144). Peacocke identifies his understanding of God's relation to the world as panentheism because of its rejection of dualism and external interactions by God in favor of God always working from inside the universe. At the same time, God transcends the universe because God is infinitely more than the universe. This panentheistic model combines a stronger emphasis upon God's immanence with God's ultimate transcendence over the universe by using a model of personal agency (Peacocke 2004, 147–151). Davies also refers to his understanding of the role of laws in nature as panentheism rather than deism because God chose laws that give a co-creative role to nature (2004, 104).

Philip Clayton begins with contemporary scientific understandings of the world and combines them with theological concepts drawn from a variety of sources including process theology. He describes God's relationship with the world as an internal rather than an external relationship. Understanding God's relationship as internal to the world recognizes the validity of modern scientific understandings that do not require any external source in order to account for the order in the world. At the same time, God's internal presence provides the order and regularity that the world manifests (2001, 208–210). Clayton agrees that the world is in God and God is in the world. Panentheism, according to him, affirms the interdependence of God and the world (2004b, 83). This affirmation became possible as a result of the rejection of substantialistic language, which excludes all other beings from any one being. Rejection of substantialistic language thus allows for the interaction of beings. Clayton cites Hegel's recognition that the logic of the infinite requires the inclusion of the finite in the infinite and points towards the presence of the world in God (Clayton 2004b, 78–79). Clayton, along with Joseph Bracken (1974, 2004), identifies his understanding of panentheism as Trinitarian and kenotic (Clayton 2005, 255). It is Trinitarian because the world participates in God in a manner analogous to the way that members of the trinity participate in each other although the world is not and does not become God. God freely decides to limit God's infinite power in an act of kenosis in order to allow for the existence of non-divine reality. The divine kenotic decision results in the actuality of the world that is taken into God. But, for Clayton, God's inclusion of finite being as actual is contingent upon God's decision rather than necessary to God's essence (2003, 214). Clayton affirms creation from nothing as a description of creaturely existence prior to God's decision. The involvement of the world in an internal relationship with God does not completely constitute the divine being for Clayton. Instead, God is both primordial, or eternal, and responsive to the world. The world does constitute God's relational aspect but not the totality of God (2005, 250–254). The best way to describe the interdependence between God and the world for Clayton is through the concept of emergence. Emergence may be explanatory, epistemological, or ontological. Ontological understandings of emergence, which Clayton supports, hold that 1) reality is made up one type of being, physical existence, rather than two or more types of being but this physicality does not mean that only physical objects exist because, 2) properties emerge in objects from the potentiality of an object that cannot be previously identified in the object's parts or structure, 3) the emergence of new properties give rise to distinct levels of causal relations, which leads to 4) downward causation of the emergent level upon prior levels (2006a, 2–4). Emergence recognizes that change is important to the nature of the world and challenges static views of God (Clayton 2006b, 320).

A number of feminist contribute to the development of panentheism by critiquing traditional understandings of transcendence for continuing dualistic ways of thinking. Feminist panentheists conceive of the divine as continuous with the world rather than being ontologically transcendent over the world (Frankenberry 2011). Sallie McFague's use of metaphors in both theology and science led her to describe the world as God's body. McFague bases the metaphorical nature of all statements about God upon panenethiesm (2001, 30). Further more, for McFague, panentheism sees the world as in God which puts God's name first but includes each person's name and preserves their distinctiveness in the divine reality (2001, 5). God's glory becomes manifest in God's total self-giving to the world so that transcendence becomes immanence rather than being understood as God's power manifest in distant control of the world. Grace Jantzen also uses the metaphor of the world as God's body. Additionally, Jantzen (1998) and Schaab (2007) have proposed metaphors about the womb and midwifery to describe God's relation to the world. Anna Case–Winters challenges McFague's metaphor of the world as God's body. Case–Winters acknowledges that his metaphor maintains God's personal nature, offers a coherent way to talk about God's knowledge of and action in the world, recognizes God's vulnerable suffering love, and revalues nature and embodiment. But at least McFague's early use of the world-as-God's-body metaphor tended towards pantheism and even her later introduction of an agential role for the divine still retains the possibility of the loss of the identity of the world. Case–Winters uses McDaniel's (1989) distinction between emanational and relationsal understandings of God's immanence in the world to establish a form of panentheism with a clearer distinction between God and the world. The world is an “other” in relation to God rather than being a direct expression of God's own being through emanation for Case–Winters (30–32). Frankenberry contrasts McFague's and Case–Winter's two concepts of transcendence to the traditional hierarchical concept of transcendence. McFague's concept is one of total immanence while Case–Winters holds a dialectic between individual transcendence and immanence (2011). Frankenberry suggests that pantheism may provide a more direct repudiation of male domination than panentheism provides (1993).

The feminist discussion about the adequacy of the metaphor of the world as God's body plays a role in the broader panentheistic discussion about how to describe the relationship between God and the world and the adequacy of the specific metaphors that have been used. Many panentheists find that metaphors provide the most adequate way to understand God's relation to the world. McFague argues that any attempt to do theology requires the use of metaphor (2001, 30). Clayton proposes different levels of metaphor as the most adequate way to reconcile the conflict between divine action and the integrity of the created realm (2003, 208). For Peacocke, the limitation of language requires the use of models and metaphors in describing either God or the cosmos (Schabb 2008, 13). The dominant metaphor in panentheism has been the world as God's body. The primary objection to the world as God's body is the substantialistic implications of the term “body” that lead either to an ontological separation between the world and God or to a loss of identity for God or the world. Bracken proposes a Trinitarian field theory to explain the world's presence in God. The world is a large but finite field of activity within the all–comprehensive field of activity constituted by the three divine persons in ongoing relations with each other and with all the creation (2009, 159). Bracken accepts that other metaphors have been utilized but concludes that the world as God's body and field theory have proven the most helpful. However, more clearly metaphysical panentheistic understandings of God's relation to the world have been articulated. Schelling's German Idealism understood God as freely unfolding as emanation by introducing subjectivity. There is no ontological separation between God and the world because the world participates in the infinite as its source (Clayton 2000, 477–481). Krause understood the world's participation in God both ontologically and epistemically. The particularity of each existent being depends upon the Absolute for its existence as what it is (Göcke 2013). The metaphysical concept of participation occurs as a description of world's relation to God but lacks precision and can be understood either metaphorically or literally. Keller offers another metaphysical understanding by arguing for creation out of chaos. She rejects substance metaphysics and describes the relation between God and the world as a complex relationality involving an active indeterminacy and past realities (2003, 219). Finally the science and religion discussion provides another metaphysical understanding by drawing upon scientific concepts such as supervenience, emergence, downward causation, and entanglement to provide a ground for theological concepts explaining God's relation to the world.

Although most of the advocates for panentheism work in the context of Christian belief or responses to Christian belief, indications of panentheism in other religions have been recognized especially in the Vedic tradition. Hartshorne in his discussion of panentheism included a section on Hinduism (1953). The concept of the world as the body of the divine offers a strong similarity to Western panentheism. The Gita identifies the whole world, including all the gods and living creatures, as the Divine body. But the Divine Being has its own body that contains the world while being more than the world. While the Upanishads acknowledge the body of the Divine at times, the body of the divine is never identified as the cosmos. Most of the Tantrics hold a pantheistic view in which the practitioner is a manifestation of the divine. Abhinavagupta, in the tenth century, provided the first panentheistic understanding of the world as God's body. For him, differentiation is Shiva concealing his wholeness. Abhinavagupta also insisted that Shiva transcends the cosmos (Bilimoria and Stansell 2010, 244–258). Abhinavagupta and Hartshorne think of the Divine as immanent in the world and as changing but they understood God's mutability in different ways (Stansell and Phillips 2010, 187). Ramunuja in the twelfth century also considered the world to be God's body and the thoughts of ultimate reality, individual selves, and the cosmos as identical (Ward 2004, 62 and Clayton 2010, 187–189).

4. Criticisms and Responses

In spite of more than one hundred years of development, panentheism continues to grow and change. Much of this growth has taken place as a result of advances in science. Another impetus for change has been criticisms raised by the major alternatives to panentheistic understandings of the God-world relation. Panentheism faces challenges both from those who find that any lessening of the emphasis upon divine transcendence to be inadequate and from those who find some form of pantheism more adequate than any distinction between God and the world. Finally, the variety of the versions of panentheism have led to an active internal discussion among the various versions.

Both pantheists and scientists working with naturalist assumptions criticize panentheism for its metaphysical claim that there is a being above or other than the natural world. At times, this criticism has been made by claiming that a thorough-going naturalism does not need a transcendent, individualized reality. Corrington describes the development of his thought as a growing awareness that panentheism unnecessarily introduces a being above nature as well as in nature (2002, 49). Drees expresses a similar criticism by arguing that all contemporary explanations of human agency, including non-reductionist explanations, are naturalistic and do not require any reference to a higher being. For panentheists to claim that divine agency is analogous to human agency fails both to recognize that human agency requires no additional source or cause and to explain how a divine source of being could act in the realm of physical and mental processes (1999). Frankenberry makes this objection more specific. Panentheism offers a more complex relationship between God and the world than is necessary. This unnecessary complexity is revealed by the problems that panentheism has with the logic of the freedom of parts in wholistic relations, the possibility of the body-soul analogy relapsing into gender inflected ideas of the soul as the male principle, the problem with simultaneity of events in the divine experience in relation to the principle of the relativity of time, the necessity of the everlasting nature of value, and finally the use of the ontological argument to establish the necessity of the abstract pole of the divine nature (1993, 36–39). Gillett points out that panentheism lacks an explanation for a causal efficacy higher than the causal efficacy realized by microphysical causation (2003, 19). Generally, panentheists respond to these criticisms by affirming the inadequacy both scientifically and metaphysically of any type of reductionistic naturalism. Such a naturalism whether articulated in scientific categories or religious categories fails to recognize the emergence of levels of complexity in nature. The emergence of higher levels of organization that cannot be completely explained in terms of lower levels renders non-differentiated accounts of being inadequate. Panentheists often argue that the emergence of higher levels of order makes possible downward causation. Davies describes the difficulties in coming to a clear description of downward causation and concludes that the complexity of systems open to the environment makes room for downward causation but has not yet provided an explanation of how downward causation works (2006, 48). The concepts of entanglement and divine entanglement may offer new perspective on causation and especially the role of the divine in natural causation (Wegter–Mcnelly 2011).

Rather than criticizing an unnecessary transcendence, traditional theism charges panentheism with an inadequate transcendence due to failing to distinguish God from the world. Grounds recognized that panentheists hold that God includes the world but is not identical to the world. Craig recognizes that Clayton claims that God is infinite. But Grounds describes Hartshorne's distinction between God and the world as a distinction that is not consistently held because Hartshorne includes accidents within God's nature. Grounds argues that according to Hartshorne God would cease to be if the world ceased to exist. Such a position lacks an adequate distinction between God and the world since God and the world are interdependent (Grounds, 1970, 154). Craig challenges the understanding of the term “infinite” within panentheistic thought by arguing that understanding the infinite as including all reality in a monistic sense confuses the definition of “infinite” with identifying what is infinite (2006, 137). Even though Clayton seeks to retain a distinction between God and the world, he fails to be consistent because he fails to recognize that “infinite” is an umbrella concept that captures all the qualities that identify God as the perfect being rather than identifying God as an absolutely unlimited reality (Craig 2006, 142–150). Rowe responds to Craig by arguing that Clayton would reject understanding the distinction between God and the world as requiring that the world limits God by being distinct. Instead, distinct from God means having an essential property that God lacks or lacking an essential property that God has which agrees with Craig's notion of the infinite as an umbrella concept (Rowe 2007, 67). Clayton describes the infinite as present in finite minds although ungraspable (2008, 152). Vail finds that Keller's panentheism blurs the line between the cosmic and the divine leading to a distinction of degree rather than of quality (2012, 164, 177).

The basic response of panentheists to these criticisms that the distinction between God and the world cannot be maintained is a dipolar concept of God. In a dipolar understanding of God, the essence of God is different from the world because God is infinite and the world is finite; God is everlasting and the world is temporal. Griffin additionally affirms the numerical difference between God and the world even though there is no ontological difference of kind (2004, 44–45). Cooper recognizes that the panentheist does actually describe a distinction between God and the world but criticizes panentheism because it does not hold an unqualified ontological distinction between God and the world. Only an ontological distinction between God and the world makes it possible to identify and affirm God's saving presence. According to Cooper, if God's transcendence does not infinitely exceed God's immanence, God's presence, knowledge, and power are limited rather than complete, immediate, and unconditioned. Cooper recognizes that prioritizing divine transcendence raises the problem of evil but thinks that God's unlimited power provides hope that God will provide an ultimate solution to the problem of evil. The basic issue for traditional theism is that panentheism understands a balance between transcendence and immanence to involve the world influencing and affecting God. If God is affected by the world, then God is considered incapable of providing salvation (Cooper 2006, 322–328). Peacocke and Eastern Orthodox thinkers (Louth 2004, 184; Nesteruk 2004, 173–176; Ware 2004, 167) respond by affirming a weak form of emergence in which the world does not affect God. Clayton and Bracken respond by maintaining that the world does influence God but God's will, expressed through the decisions that God makes, protects God's ability to save (Clayton 2005). Moltmann describes God's essence as directing God's activity in order to maintain the reliability of God as love acting on behalf of creation. Moltmann does not find it necessary to protect divine freedom by giving it priority over divine love but rather understands freedom as acting according to the divine nature of love (Moltmann 1981, 98, 99). Cooper also criticizes panentheism for holding a concept of God that can save through the general processes of nature but not in any distinctive way. Vanhoozer's concern for divine freedom is based on a similar concern (1998, 250). But, Griffin's discussion of divine variable action does allow for specific and distinctive manifestations of divine love (2004, 45). Ultimately, the panentheist response is that God's nature as love directs God's actions bringing salvation. God's nature as love is the crucial aspect of divine action rather than a causal efficacy. The emphasis of traditional theism on divine will misses that the divine will is directed by divine love. Some responses by traditional theists have claimed that traditional theism is not guilty of separating God from the world and thus panentheism is not needed as a corrective (Carroll 2008, Finger 1997). Wildman acknowledges that traditional theism does hold that God has a meaningful presence in the world but has an inadequate ontological basis for that presence. An adequate basis for the active presence of God int he world requires some role for the world in the constitution of God (Wildman 2011, 186).

The varieties of panentheism participate in internal criticism. Clayton (2008, 127) and Crain (2006) emphasize the dependence of the world upon God rather than the dependence of God upon the world although they maintain that God is influenced, and changed, by the world. They criticize understandings of God that limit God by making God subject to metaphysical principles. Griffin emphasizes the regularity provided by metaphysical principles. This regularity recognizes the order in reality that the reliability of God's love provides. Panentheists also caution that the emphasis upon the ontological nature of the relation between God and the world can lead to a loss of the integrity of the world. Richardson warns against losing the discrete identity of finite beings in God (2010, 345). Case-Winters calls for maintaining a balance between the distinction between God and the world and God's involvement with the world. Over–emphasis upon either side of the balance leads to positions that are philosophically and theologically inadequate (Case–Winters 2007, 125).


Academic Tools

sep man icon How to cite this entry.
sep man icon Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society.
inpho icon Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO).
phil papers icon Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

emergent properties | feminist (interventions): philosophy of religion | feminist philosophy of religion | Japanese Philosophy: Kyoto School | monotheism | pantheism | process theism | religion: philosophy of | Schopenhauer, Arthur | Spinoza, Baruch | supervenience