Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Naturalism

1. It should be noted that philosophers concerned with religion tend to be less enthusiastic about ‘naturalism’. See the essays in Craig and Moreland (eds) (2000) Naturalism a Critical Analysis.

2. Philosophers who understand ‘naturalism’ in a generous sense include John McDowell (1996), David Chalmers (1996) and Jennifer Hornsby (1997).

3. ‘The flood of projects over the last two decades that attempt to fit mental causation or mental ontology into a “naturalistic picture of the world” strike me as having more in common with political or religious ideology than with a philosophy that maintains perspective on the difference between what is known and what is speculated. Materialism is not established, or even deeply supported, by science’ (Burge 1993).

4. Scarcely any contemporary philosophers are prepared to query this thesis, even those who wish to resist the apparent physicalist consequences.  However, see Lowe 2000 and 2003.

5. According to the historian F.M. Turner 1974 ‘the contemporary significance of this law [conservation of energy] was immense and probably more destructive to a supernatural interpretation of nature than was evolution by natural selection’. We would like to thank Daan Wegener for information about this issue.

6. Contemporary type identity theorists characteristically respond to the apparent variable realization of prima facie non-physical properties by saying that non-physical concepts like pain or heart are like variable names that refer to different physical properties on different occasions of use (Levin 2004 Section 3.4, Kim 1998). 

7. Leibniz's ‘pre-established harmony’ similarly evades the causal closure argument for physicalism by denying that mental states have physical effects. But where standard ‘epiphenomenalism’ at least allows that conscious states are caused by brain states, Leibniz held that the physical and conscious realms are causally quite independent.

8. In 2005 David Chalmers' weblog listed the following as contemporary anti-materialists about consciousness:  Joseph Almog, Torin Alter, George Bealer, Laurence BonJour, Paul Boghossian, Tyler Burge, Tim Crane, John Foster, Brie Gertler, George Graham, W.D. Hart, Ted Honderich, Steven Horst, Saul Kripke, Harold Langsam, E.J. Lowe, Kirk Ludwig, Trenton Merricks, Martine Nida-Rumelin, Adam Pautz, David Pitt, Alvin Plantinga, Howard Robinson, William Robinson, Gregg Rosenberg, A.D. Smith, and Richard Swinburne.

9. On similar grounds, general principles of theory choice would also seem to count against both pre-established harmony and the sometimes-defended ‘overdeterminationist’ view that the physical effects of mental states are always strongly overdetermined by both a sui generis mental cause and a physical cause. (For a version of the latter, see Mellor 1995.)

10. True, some seventeenth-century critics argued that Descartes' radical separation of mind and matter precluded any possibility of causal interaction. But this objection hinged on specific assumption about the nature of causation, and as a result seems not to have been of lasting historical significance. 

11. Note how an analogous difficulty can be pressed against the epiphenomenalist view of conscious states:  how can a supposedly non-natural realm of conscious facts make any difference to what we say and do in the physical world? (Cf. Chalmers, 1995 Chapter 5.)

12. The analogy to moral irrealism for consciousness would be the eliminativist view that, since non-natural conscious facts can make no difference to the physical world, there are no conscious facts. Few philosophers have found this move attractive. (But cf. Rey 1983, Churchland, 1986. See also Ramsey 2003.)

13. On most account of causation, causal claims will have modal implications. But that does not mean that modal facts themselves enter into causal relationships. It is one thing for causal relationships to obtain in virtue of modal facts. It is another for modal facts themselves to enter into causal relationships,

14. It might seem confusing that this Putnamian view gets classified as ‘non-naturalist’. What could be more naturalist than the view that mathematics is warranted on empirical grounds?  But recall the distinction between methodological and ontological naturalism. Putnam's view is certainly methodologically naturalist, but ontologically he is committed to non-natural facts that transcend the spatiotemporal realm. 

15. Moreover, Jackson assumes that any identification of a folk kind with a fundamental kind must involve a demonstration that the fundamental kind fills the relevant folk conceptual role (this assumption is crucial to the currently popular ‘two-dimensional’ argument for mind-body dualism, as in Jackson 1993, Chalmers 1996.) However, this assumption is quite unconvincing. Jackson says that we could only have found out that temperature = mean kinetic energy, say, via a demonstration that mean kinetic energy plays the same causal role as temperature (cf. Jackson, 2003, 254-5). This is plausible enough. But there is no obvious reason why our knowledge of this causal role should come from analysis of the folk concept of temperature. The derivation would work just as well if this were inductive knowledge derived from a posteriori observation of temperatures.

16. Jackson (1993) explicitly presents his programme as a challenge to ‘moderate’ naturalists, who say that conceptual analysis is possible but philosophically uninteresting, as well as to ‘extreme’ naturalists, who deny that conceptual analysis is so much as possible.

17. ‘∃!Φ(T(Φ))’ abbreviates ‘∃Φ(T(Φ) & ∀Ψ(T(Ψ) → (Ψ = Φ)))’.

18. Advocates of the two-dimensional argument against materialism (Jackson 1993, Chalmers 1996) hold that conceptual difference implies metaphysical difference in the special case of concepts whose ‘primary intension’ does not differ from their ‘secondary intension’. We cannot pursue this issue here. But cf. footnote 15 above.