Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Medieval Political Philosophy

1. A university was a guild (i.e. trade association) of masters or students in a town. The university was not itself a teaching institution: teaching was done in the masters' schools (or later in colleges). Schools of higher education had existed among the Greeks, Jews and Muslims, but a trade association of teachers or scholars was a new idea. Like the ancient schools, the medieval schools taught by means of text books: Aristotle in the Arts faculty, Averroes and Avicenna in medicine, the Bible and the Sentences of Peter Lombard in theology, Justinian in the schools of civil law, and Gratian's Decretum and other collections in canon law. These text books were prescribed by the University, which set standards for the schools that belonged to it.

2. See the Latin text of the Vulgate. The standard English translation of the Vulgate is Challoner's 18th century revision of the Douai-Rheims version. On the history of this translation see the Wikipedia article on the Douai bible listed under “Other Internet Resources”. My references will be to the Vulgate and translation will be Douai. (The language of the Douai translation is old fashioned, but it is the English translation closest to the medieval understanding of the Vulgate text.) The divisions and names of the parts of the medieval bible were not altogether the same as those of the King James version. The medieval “canon” of scripture, i.e. the list of books recognised as belonging to the bible differed somewhat from the canon recognised by Protestants, notably by its inclusion of Machabees.

3. See Luther [1915], vol. 1, p. 7 (alluding to 4 Kings 22:8).

4. The theory of “passive obedience” is the theory that if a ruler gives a command contrary to God's commands, one may obey it passively rather than actively, i.e. not actively carry out the command, but not resist the punishment the ruler then inflicts. Such a doctrine was common in the seventeenth century among Protestants and was also held by some Catholics, e.g. Bossuet. See Somerville [1991].

5. For debate on the kingship of Christ between Pope John XXII and Ockham, see William of Ockham [1995a], p. 72ff.

6. See the New Advent (Catholic Encyclopedia) article “Fathers of the Church”. For English translations online see The Fathers of the Church. On Augustine see Saint Augustine.

7. The age of innocence ended before Adam and Eve had children, whereas the Golden Age lasted through a number of generations. In medieval writers the two ideas were sometimes combined: after the Fall, human beings lived for a while in a social but unpolitical state (though it was hardly a Golden Age) but gradually developed institutions appropriate to the fallen state.

8. See Augustine [1998]. Page references will be to this version.

9. Dist. 47 c.8, Friedberg [1879], vol. 1, col. 171.

10. Translated Tierney [1959], p. 34 (modified).

11. Augustine [1955], p. v, n.2. A few commentaries were made (see Smalley [1960], pp. 58, 61f, 88-101, 121-32), but not many, since The City of God was never a set text.

12. To sample De civitate Dei, read Book XIX. See Markus [1970], especially ch. 3; and Augustine, “History and Eschatology”, in this Encyclopedia.

13. See De civitate Dei XI.22, XII.2, 3, 7; Confessions VII.xii.18-xiii.19; Enchiridion 11-12.

14. The reader should be warned that my reference to the different levels of virtue, peace, etc. puts me at odds with many interpreters of Augustine. Usually when Augustine says that something is not “true” something, he is taken to mean that it is not that at all. This seems to me to be an error that makes Augustine's thinking seem full of inconsistencies. For example, Carlyle ([1930], vol. 1, p. 166-7) says that Augustine's definition of commonwealth makes justice irrelevant to the existence of a commonwealth, and remarks (p. 169) that among the Fathers this view was unique to Augustine. Yet (as Carlyle acknowledges, p. 167) Augustine says that apart from justice a kingdom is only robbery on a large scale. On my interpretation, justice is not irrelevant: anything that can be called a commonwealth must exhibit justice in some degree.

15. Arquillière [1934]. The conception has been severely criticised: see de Lubac [1984], pp. 255-308.

16. Translated from the Latin text of Poole [1920], p. 201.

17. See McGrade [1974], pp. 109-33.

18. Note that the texts of Augustine available on the web contain occasional scanning errors.

19. See Russell [1975], pp. 16ff. Various texts from Augustine are included in Gratian's Decretum, Causa 23 (Friedberg [1879], vol. 1, col. 889 ff.), which is the source of much medieval thinking about warfare.

20. On the views of Augustine and other Fathers on toleration and coercion see Lecler [1960], pp. 32-64. On Augustine in particular see P. Brown [1964], Markus [1970], ch. 6.

21. Tractates on John, 26.2.

22. Bayle [2005], part III, quotes Augustine's justification for coercing heretics and subjects his reasoning to devastating criticism.

23. On the political thought of this period see Carlyle [1930], vol. 1, p. 195ff, and Canning [1996], p. 47ff.

24. On the later development of ideas of consent see Tierney [1982], p. 39-42.

25. See Carlyle [1930], vol. 1, p. 242-52.

26. For the English translation of Digest, see Justinian [1998]. The other parts of the corpus have also been translated (see here).

27. Decretum Gratiani, Friedberg [1879], vol. 1. For a number of studies of the influence of canon law on political thought in the middle ages see bibliography, Tierney, and see the articles by Pennington listed under “Other Internet Resources”. Gratian's collection was based partly on earlier collections (see the New Advent [Catholic Encyclopedia] article “Collections of Ancient Canons” listed under “Other Internet Resources”), e.g. the collection by Ivo of Chartres (see the Provisional Edition of Ivo of Chartre's Panormia and the New Advent article “St. Ivo of Chartres”). What gave special importance to Gratian's collection was that it became the text book in the newly developing universities. When Pope Gregory IX wished to promulgate an additional collection of “decretals” (i.e. papal letters in which popes decided questions of church law) he did so by sending a copy to the Universities of Bologna and Paris.

Among the earlier collections was the Pseudo-Isidorian collection. (See the Wikipedia article on Pseudo-Isidore, the New Advent article on False Decretals, and Projekt Pseudoisidore, all listed under “Other Internet Resources”.) This “Isidore” is not to be confused with Isidore of Seville, whom Gratian often quotes. Gratian's borrowings from Pseudo-Isidore are marked in Friedberg's edition by references to Hinschius's edition of Pseudo-Isidore; e.g. see Friedberg [1879], vol. 1, col. 342, note 221. The Pseudo-Isidorian collection, made in the mid-ninth century, contained much authentic material but with an admixture of forgery. Its purpose, apparently, was to strengthen the position of the French bishops, in part by enhancing the power of the pope (far off in Rome!)—by reserving certain powers to the pope, Isidore sought to protect the bishops against persons closer at hand. Some of the falsifications included in the Pseudo-Isidorian collection had been produced earlier, e.g. the “Donation of Constantine” (see English translation and the New Advent article listed under “Other Internet Resources”) and the “Recognitions of Clement”.

28. The relevant part, together with the medieval gloss, has been translated in Gratian [1993].

29. See Tierney [1997].

30. “According to natural law all persons were born free.... slavery itself was unknown; but after slavery was admitted by the Law of Nations...”; Digest 1.1.4. According to Isidore, in Gratian, dist. 1, c. 7 (Friedberg [1879], vol. 1, col. 2), natural law includes “the one liberty of all”.

31. According to Institutes 2.1.11-12, property originates by natural law, with which the law of nations is synonymous: “Of some things we obtain dominium [lordship] by natural law, which, as we have said, is called the law of nations... For whatever belonged before to no one is granted by natural reason to the one who takes possession”. But according to other texts, distinction of lordship was established by the law of nations, in a sense not synonymous with natural law; Digest 1.1.5.

32. Natural law includes “the common possession of all” (Decretum, dist. 1, c. 7, Friedberg [1879], vol. 1, col. 2). “Superfluous” property must as a matter of justice be made available to the poor, especially in time of need. See Tierney [1959], pp. 28-39.

33. Digest 1.4.1, “Quod principi placuit, legis habet vigorem”—“What pleases the ruler has the force of law, since by the lex regia, which was made concerning the emperor's rule, the people conferred on him all of its power to rule.” This makes the ruler's will decisive, but note that his authority rests on a popular decision. (There was some debate among lawyers as to whether the people could reclaim their authority. See Gierke [1951], pp. 43-6, 150-3; Carlyle [1930], vol. 2, pp. 60-7, vol. 5, p. 49, vol. 6, pp. 13-19.) According to Digest 1.3.31, “Princeps legibus solutus est”—“The ruler is not bound by the law.” (This text is the origin of the term “absolutism”.) Another text, often referred to in the middle ages by the incipit “Digna vox”, suggested that the Emperor should obey his own laws: Codex 1.14.4: “It is a saying worthy of the majesty of a ruler for the ruler to profess that he is bound by the laws, since our authority depends on the authority of law. Indeed it is better for the empire for the rulership to submit to the laws”. See Pennington [1993a], p.78.

34. Digest 1.1.3, Decretum, dist. 1, c. 7 (Friedberg [1879], vol. 1, col. 2).

35. “Two there are, august emperor, by which this world is chiefly ruled, the sacred authority of the priesthood and the royal power. Of these the responsibility of the priests is more weighty, in so far as they will answer for the kings of men themselves at the divine judgment... [I]n the order of religion... you ought to submit yourselves [to priests] rather than rule... [T]he bishops themselves... obey your law so far as the sphere of public order is concerned”. Gratian, Decretum, dist. 96, c. 10; translated Tierney [1980], pp.13-14.

36. Dist. 96., c. 6, Friedberg [1879], vol. 1, col. 339; translated Tierney [1980], pp. 14-15.

37. C. 11, q. 1, c. 29 and c. 30 , Friedberg [1879], vol. 1, col. 634. These texts are inauthentic, being drawn from the Pseudo-Isidorean collection (see note 27 above).

38. On corporations see Tierney [1982], p. 80ff.

39. “Quod omnes tangit ab omnibus tractari et approbari debet”. See Post [1946] and Congar [1958].

40. “Sanior et maior pars”. See Moulin [1958]. For Ockham's discussion of this idea see William of Ockham [1995a], pp. 175-6. For an entertaining account of an election campaign in a monastery, with references to different modes of decision making, see Jocelin of Brakelond.

41. Lewis [1954], vol. 1, p. 36.

42. Lewis [1954], vol. 1, p. 38.

43. Alexander of Hales [1948], vol. 4, pp. 348, 351-2.

44. “As a sick man should not find fault with the medical treatment because one thing is prescribed to-day and another to-morrow and what was at first required is afterwards forbidden, since the method of cure depends on this; so the human race, sick and sore as it is from Adam to the end of the world, as long as the corrupted body weighs down the mind, should not find fault with the divine prescriptions, if sometimes the same observances are enjoined, and sometimes an old observance is exchanged for one of a different kind”; Contra Faustum, XXXII.14. See also De vera religione, XVII.34.

45. “It must be said that by natural law all things were common and there was one liberty of all, this was before sin; after sin some things were proper to some; and both of these are by natural law”; Alexander of Hales [1948], vol. 4, p. 348. Cf. p. 352.

46. According to Bonaventure some things are dictates of nature simply, valid for every state of human existence (e. g. that God is to be honoured), others are dictates of nature as it was first instituted, valid for the state of innocence (e.g. that all things should be common), and others are dictates of nature in its fallen state (e.g. that property rights should be respected); Bonaventure [1882], 2 Sent., dist. 44, a. 2, q. 2, ad 4.

47. See William of Ockham [1995a], pp. 286-293, Kilcullen [2001a].

48. See Tierney [1997], Mäkinen and Korkman [2006], Mäkinen [2010], Kilcullen [2010c], Kilcullen [2010d].

49. See Flüeler [1993].

50. Thomas Aquinas's commentary is incomplete (it ends at III.6). Peter of Auvergne completed the work. See Grech [1967]. Peter also wrote a commentary in question form. For translations from both commentaries see McGrade, Kilcullen and Kempshall [2001], p. 216ff.

51. See William of Ockham [1995a], pp. 133-143. See Lambertini [2000], p. 269ff.

52. A “political animal” means an animal whose nature is to live in a polis or city, not isolated or in small groups. Civilisation is the natural state not in the sense that it is the original state, but in the sense that the natural goal of human development is life in cities: “If the earlier forms of society are natural, so is the state, for it is the end of them, and the nature of a thing is its end. For what each thing is when fully developed, we call its nature... Hence it is evident that the state is a creation of nature, and that man is by nature a political animal”; Politics I.2, 1252 b30-1253 a3. In this translation (by Jowett) “state” corresponds to the Greek polis, which in the Latin translation is civitas, in English “city”. On the vocabulary see Luscombe [1992].

53. Politics III.9, 1280 a32- b35.

54. Politics I.5 and 6 could be taken as a dialectical exploration of the question of the justice of slavery, but from other places in the Politics it is clear that Aristotle himself believed that some human beings were marked by nature to be slaves: “Slaves and brute animals... cannot [form a state], for they have no share in happiness or in a life of free choice”; III.9, 1280 a32-4. See my notes. According to Duns Scotus (d. 1308) slavery in the sense of harsh subjection to another can be justified only as punishment. “Natural” slavery, which Scotus describes as “civil and political subjection”, ought to benefit the slave; such slaves do have free will and a possibility of virtue. See Flüeler [1993], pp. 75-81.

55. Politics I.5, 1254 b13. See my notes.

56. Politics III.7. The classification came from Plato (Statesman, 302c-303b), and Aristotle goes on to undermine or qualify it in many ways (see my notes “Kinds of Constitutions” and “Democracy, Oligarchy and Polity”).

57. See Kempshall [1999]. For translations of relevant texts, see McGrade, Kilcullen and Kempshall [2001].

58. See Blythe [1992]; William of Ockham [1995a], pp. 311-23.

59. Politics III.16, Rhetoric I.1 1354 a30-b15. Plato had argued that it is best if the ruler has true knowledge and is not bound by law, but if rulers without knowledge should rule in accordance with laws made by legislators with true knowledge; Plato, Statesman 294-301.

60. Nicomachean Ethics V.10, and Politics III.16, 1287 a23-28, 1287 b15-27.

61. Politics V, and VI.5.

62. Thomas Aquinas [2002], p. 17ff.

63. Politics III.11.

64. “For those who wish to get clear of difficulties it is advantageous to discuss the difficulties well; for... it is not possible to untie a knot of which one does not know... Hence one should have surveyed all the difficulties beforehand... Further, he who has heard all the contending arguments, as if they were the parties to a case, must be in a better position to judge”; Aristotle, Metaphysics, III.1, 995 a23-b5. The study of law also reinforced the practice of disputation.

65. See Rivière [1925].

66. See Congar [1961].

67. Tierney [1980], pp. 153-4.

68. See Miethke [2000a]. For translations and explanations of texts relating to the conflict see Tierney [1980].

69. The political texts are collected in Thomas Aquinas [2002], to which I give page references.

70. Natural law is mentioned in Romans 2:14-15: “For when the Gentiles, who have not the law, do by nature those things that are of the law; these having not the law are a law to themselves: Who shew the work of the law written in their hearts, their conscience bearing witness to them, and their thoughts between themselves accusing, or also defending one another.” The contrast between nature and convention goes back to the sophists. It would have been known to medieval readers also from Aristotle, Politics, I.6, 1255 a5.

71. This theory is a species of what Sidgwick called “intuitionism” (Sidgwick [1907], Book 1, chapter 8, esp. p. 101).

72. See Blythe [1992], pp. 57-8. Thomas knew nothing of Polybius.

73. See Rivière [1926], Dupuy [1655]. In addition to the writers discussed below see also Dyson [1999a], [1999b], James of Viterbo [1995], Augustine of Ancona [2001].

74. According to Ubl, [2003], pp. 54-6, John of Paris had in his sights not Giles of Rome but university disputations of James of Viterbo and Henry of Ghent.

75. Giles of Rome [1986], pp. 116-23. On theories of hierarchy, see Luscombe [1988b],1998, [2003]. See also Pascoe [1973], p. 17ff.

76.Giles of Rome [1986], pp. 68-9.

77. See Wyclif [2001]. For a discussion of the question whether unbelievers can have dominium, see William of Ockham [1992], pp. 84-7.

78. On the genesis and intention of “Unam sanctam” see Ubl [2004].

79. For translation see McGrade, Kilcullen and Kempshall [2001], p. 200ff.

80. Page references in the text are to John of Paris [1971]. According to the canon lawyers, the Pope and other clergy were administrators of Church property, not the owners. See Tierney [1959], pp. 39-43.

81. See also Ubl and Vinx [2000], p. 321, who quote from John of Paris's unpublished Commentary on the Sentences to the same effect: “appropriatio est de iure humano”. Coleman [1983] suggested that John anticipated Locke.

82. For translations see Marsilius of Padua [1980], [2005]. Page references of the form “44-9, 61-3/65-72, 88-90” are to those translations respectively.

83. Hooker's defence of Elizabeth's governorship of the Church (Hooker, 1989) seems to have been influenced, at least indirectly, by Marsilius (see Piaia [1977], pp. 213-8). Hooker maintains that when the people are Christians there is no “personal separation” between Church and State, and that the secular ruler is then (in some sense) the head of the Church, with sole authority to call church assemblies, with a veto over their legislation, with authority to appoint bishops and other officials, with exemption from excommunication.

84. 65.35ff, pp. 436, 438. (Chapter and line numbers are to the Latin text in William of Ockham [1974], vols. 1 and 2; page numbers are to the English translation, William of Ockham [2001].) The Work of Ninety Days, the Dialogus and others of Ockham's political writings are “recitative”, i.e. report opinions without explicitly indicating what the author holds; other works, including the Breviloquium, are “assertive” writings, in which Ockham states plainly what he holds. Guided by the assertive writings and by other clues it is usually possible to decide which opinions in the recitative writings are the author's. See Knysh [1997].

85. 27.80-3, p. 313.

86. According to 92.16-45, p. 573-4, the right to establish property seems to be from natural law of the third kind, supposing the circumstances of the fallen state. In Breviloquium iii.7.35ff (William of Ockham [1992], p. 89-90) it is said to have been given by God by a positive grant.

87. Property implies exclusion of use by others, 26.38-41, p. 308.

88. For all this argument see especially chapters 64 and 65, pp. 87-90. The natural right of using should not be confused with the “use of right” and “right of using” that are legal rights. See 2.127ff, 2.155ff, and 6.268-70, pp. 60-3, 145. I do not agree with the opinion of Annabel Brett and others that Ockham's argument is a failure. See Kilcullen [2001c] pp. 45-6, “Evaluations”. For Ockham's theory of property see also Breviloquium iii.7, William of Ockham [1992] p. 57-90.

89. See Kilcullen [2001b].

90. See William of Ockham [1992], [1995a], [1995b] (3.1 Dialogus 1), and [1998].

91. For Ockham's disagreements with Marsilius, see William of Ockham [1995b] (3.1 Dialogus 3, 4). See also “Endnote 4: Ockham and Marsilius”.

92. On the “regularly/occasionally” contrast, see Bayley [1949]. For Ockham's attempts to specify papal power and its limits see Breviloqium ii.16-18, William of Ockham [1992] pp. 51-8; 3.1 Dialogus 1.16-17; De imperatorum et pontificum potestate viii-xiii, William of Ockham [1998].

93. A pope who falls into heresy loses office ipso facto, but still has to be removed from factual exercise of papal power; a pope who is not a heretic but is accused of serious sin (e.g. unjust interference with the rights of lay people) needs to be tried and then, if guilty, deposed. See Octo questiones iii.12.120ff, William of Ockham [1974] vol. 1 p. 116ff (translation William of Ockham [1995a], pp. 327-9).The canonist dictum that no human being can judge a pope seemed to make deposition of a pope impracticable. For Ockham's view on how it can be done, see McGrade [1974], chapter 2, and Ockham's Contra Benedictum vii, William of Ockham [1974], vol. 3, p. 303ff.

94. See William of Ockham [1995a], p. 309ff.

95. 3.2 Dialogus ii.26-8.

96. See William of Ockham [1995a], pp. 291-3; Kilcullen, “The right to live under government”.

97. See Breviloqium vi.2, William of Ockham [1992] pp. 158-63; Octo questiones iii.3.34-9, 54-8, William of Ockham [1974] vol. 1, p. 102 (translation: William of Ockham [1995a] pp. 310-11).

98. 3.2 Dialogus 3.6; 3.1 Dialogus 2.20-28. (For translation see William of Ockham [1995a] pp. 290-3, 171-203.)

99. Breviloqium iv.2-8, William of Ockham [1992] pp. 110-21.

100. See McGrade [1974], pp. 47-77; McGrade, Kilcullen, and Kempshall [2001] pp. 484-95; Kilcullen [2010a].

101. Tierney [1969].

102. See Oakley [1962], pp. 3-11.

103. See Tierney [1955].

104. Ockham's opinion was that no part of the Church, neither Pope nor Council, was infallible (Kilcullen [1991]). For what may be an attempt to answer Ockham, see Marsilius Defensor minor 12.5, [1993], pp. 42-3.

105. See Burns and Izbicki [1997] for an English translation of the debate over conciliarism between Cajetan, Almain and Maior. Like Ockham, Cajetan held that the constitution of the Church is monarchical, by divine law, but, unlike Ockham, did not envisage the possibility that on occasion exceptions might be made to divine law.

106. For the political philosophy of the Spanish late scholastics see Hamilton [1963].

107. For Vitoria's life and works see Biographisch-Bibliographisches Kirchenlexikon. For his lectures on the Indians and on war, see Vitoria [1991]; page references will be to this translation. Other sixteenth century theologians, including notably Bartholomew de Las Casas, defended the rights of the Indians: see Muldoon [1980], [1998]. Earlier theologians had defended the rights of unbelievers to own property and exercise political power; see Ockham [1992], iii.1-6, pp. 71-87. On the laws of war see also Suárez [1944], pp. 800ff, 739ff.

108. For the life and works of Suárez see Biographisch-Bibliographisches Kirchenlexikon.

109. Gregory of Rimini [1980], pp. 235-8; Suárez [1971], vi.3-5, vol. 3, p. 79ff. For Vasquez, see St Leger [1962] p. 132ff. See also Kilcullen “Natural Law”, here and here. On Grotius see St Leger. On the obligatoriness of the law of nature compare Hobbes, Leviathan, cap. 15, last para.

110. Suárez [1971], De legibus, III.i.3-7, 12, pp.8-14, 17-18 (translation: Suárez [1944], pp. 364-8, 371).

111. Suárez [1971], De legibus, III.ii.3-6, pp. 21-27 (translation: Suárez [1944], pp. 373-7).

112. Suárez [1971], De legibus, III.ii.4.22-34, iii.2-3, 5-6. pp. 25, 29-33, (translation: Suárez [1944], 375, 378-80). See Schwartz [2008].

113. Suárez [1971], De legibus, III.iii.7-8, iv.1-6, 8, pp. 33-46 (translation: Suárez [1944], pp. 380-9).