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Jacques Lacan

First published Tue Apr 2, 2013

Jacques Lacan (April 13, 1901 to September 9, 1981) was a major figure in Parisian intellectual life for much of the twentieth century. Sometimes referred to as “the French Freud,” he is an important figure in the history of psychoanalysis. His teachings and writings explore the significance of Freud's discovery of the unconscious both within the theory and practice of analysis itself as well as in connection with a wide range of other disciplines. Particularly for those interested in the philosophical dimensions of Freudian thought, Lacan's oeuvre is invaluable. Over the course of the past fifty-plus years, Lacanian ideas have become central to the various receptions of things psychoanalytic in Continental philosophical circles especially.

1. Historical Overview

Medically trained as a psychiatrist, Lacan's first texts started appearing in the late 1920s (during the course of his psychiatric studies), with his publishing activity really taking off in the subsequent decade. The 1930s see several early Lacanian milestones: the publication, in 1932, of his doctoral thesis in psychiatry, De la psychose paranoïaque dans ses rapports avec la personnalité (On Paranoid Psychosis in its Relations with the Personality); collaborations with the Surrealist and Dadaist artistic movements in whose midsts he circulated as a familiar fellow traveler; entry into analytic training, including a didactic analysis with Rudolph Lowenstein; attendance at Alexandre Kojève's renowned seminars on G.W.F. Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit; the first presentation of the now-famous theory of the “mirror stage” at the International Psychoanalytic Association (IPA) conference at Marienbad in 1936 (a presentation truncated by Freud's friend and biographer, then-IPA President Ernest Jones); and, the appearance, in the Encyclopédie française in 1938, of a substantial essay on a sizable swathe of analytic topics entitled Les complexes familiaux dans la formation de l'individu: Essai d'analyse d'une fonction en psychologie (“The Family Complexes in the Formation of the Individual: Attempt at an Analysis of a Function in Psychology”). This crucial period of Lacan's development, as the immediately preceding already indicates, was marked by the collision of interests and influences related to psychoanalysis, psychiatry, philosophy, art, and literature, among other areas. More specifically, the robustly interdisciplinary combination that came together for Lacan at this time of Freudian analysis, Hegelian dialectics, Kojèvian pedagogy, and different experiences of “madness” from numerous perspectives indelibly colors and permanently inflects the entire rest of Lacan's intellectual itinerary.

Unsurprisingly, the Second World War was, for Lacan (and, of course, for history generally), a period of disruption and upheaval. His psychoanalytic activities were interrupted, including his training analysis (Lowenstein and Lacan did not concur about whether this analysis was well and truly completed, with Lacan deciding it was over and, somewhat controversially, never returning to Lowenstein's couch). The War provided Lacan with an exposure to military psychiatry in both France and England, with his five-week visit to the latter acquainting him with aspects of the British psychoanalytic world (features of this visit are recounted in “British Psychiatry and the War” [1947]). A handful of important texts were composed during and after the War, all of which eventually got reprinted in Lacan's magnum opus, 1966's Écrits: “Logical Time and the Assertion of Anticipated Certainty: A New Sophism” (1945); “Presentation on Psychical Causality” (1946); “Aggressiveness in Psychoanalysis” (1948); and “The Mirror Stage as Formative of the I Function as Revealed in Psychoanalytic Experience” (delivered in 1949 at the IPA conference in Zurich—whereas the 1936 version from Marienbad is lost, this version is the surviving one made canonical through its inclusion in Écrits).

The next decade was pivotal in Lacan's trajectory, the time when he fully came into his own as a leading analytic thinker of great originality and immense import. A veritable explosion of Lacanian material was unleashed during this period, including seven annual seminars and many of the most celebrated essays subsequently collected in the nine-hundred-page Écrits (a number of these were hyper-condensed distillations of the results of the annual seminars). At the end of the 1940s and beginning of the 1950s, Lacan became initiated into and conversant with the structuralism of Ferdinand de Saussure and his inheritors such as Claude Lévi-Strauss and Roman Jakobson. Lévi-Strauss's 1949 book The Elementary Structures of Kinship helped launch the French structuralist movement that flourished during the 1950s and 1960s, an orientation that challenged the theoretical primacy of existentialism in France. Lévi-Strauss “structuralized” anthropology, as Roland Barthes did for literary-cultural studies and Louis Althusser for Marxism. Up through the end of the 1950s—in 1959–1960, a fundamental reorienting shift arguably occurred in Lacan's thinking—Lacan fairly can be portrayed as likewise structuralizing Freudian psychoanalysis. He did so under the banner of a “return to Freud” according to which, as his most famous dictum has it, “the unconscious is structured like a language” (l'inconscient est structuré comme un langage). Lacan portrayed himself as the lone defender of a Freudian orthodoxy in danger of being eclipsed by its alleged abandonment and betrayal in the post-Freudian analytic universe, particularly Anglo-American ego psychology as consolidated by the troika of Heinz Hartmann, Ernst Kris, and Lacan's former analyst Lowenstein. Lacan adamantly maintained that a Saussurian-assisted recovery of the overriding significance of language for analysis both clinical and metapsychological is the key to faithfully carrying forward Freud's revolutionary approach to psychical subjectivity. All of this was announced in detail in the lengthy founding manifesto of Lacanianism, the 1953 écrit “The Function and Field of Speech and Language in Psychoanalysis” (often referred to as the “Rome Discourse” because of where it was delivered). This manifesto coincided with Lacan's participation in an exodus from his former analytic institute, the Société Parisienne de Psychanalyse (SPP), and the founding of a new institute, the Société Française de Psychanalyse (SFP). The SPP's move to a medicalized model of analytic training (as per the scientistic psychiatric paradigm that was dominant in the institutes of the English-speaking world) was one of the main precipitators of the departure of the breakaway faction that founded the SFP.

Also in 1953, Lacan conducted his first annual seminar addressing Freud's Papers on Technique (1953–1954). Lacan continued giving these right up until shortly before his death, with le Séminaire running continuously for twenty-seven years. As was the case with Kojève, Lacan exerted his influence primarily through his oral teachings. The first decade of le Séminaire (1953–1963) was taught at the Hôpital Sainte-Anne and had an audience consisting mostly of psychoanalysts. For reasons I will explain shortly, Lacan, in 1964, moved his seminar first to the École Normale Supérieure (1964–1969) and then to the Faculty of Law across from the Panthéon (1969–1980). From 1964 onwards, Lacan's audience startlingly increased in both sheer numbers and breadth of backgrounds, with artists and academics from various disciplines across academia joining the more clinically-minded attendees. Le Séminaire became a nodal Parisian intellectual institution, a kind of hub attracting some of the brightest stars of the post-War French cultural firmament. For instance, such philosophers as Jean Hyppolite, Michel Foucault, Gilles Deleuze, Luce Irigaray, and Julia Kristeva spent time in Lacan's audience. In his seminars, Lacan deftly maneuvered within and between a multitude of theoretical currents, putting psychoanalysis into conversation with the history of philosophy, phenomenology, existentialism, structuralism, post-structuralism, feminism, and, as already indicated, just about every discipline represented in the university. All of the major French philosophers of the generation that came of age in the 1960s and 1970s engaged with Freudian analysis in one way or another, and all of them did so in fashions varyingly informed by Lacan's teachings.

The 1960s were a highly productive and equally tumultuous era in Lacan's history. In his seventh seminar on The Ethics of Psychoanalysis (1959–1960), Lacan took a sort of turn fateful for the direction of his later trajectory, initiating an interrogation of the ways in which language was privileged by his 1950s “return to Freud.” The immediately prior years tirelessly emphasized the essential role of the register of the Symbolic, namely, the pride of place of analytically modified versions of Saussurian signifiers in the structures and dynamics of the unconscious and speaking subjectivity (in the 1930s and 1940s, the phenomenal-visual register of the Imaginary was to the fore thanks to the focus on the mirror stage). At the end of the 1950s, with the rise of the Real as the register of a new focus of Lacan's thinking—I will say more about Lacan's tripartite register theory subsequently (see 2.1 below)—things and phenomena escaping, resisting, or thwarting the signifying powers of the socio-linguistic symbolic order became ever more central in Lacanian theory. These things and phenomena include Otherness, drives, jouissance, and objet petit a, among other Lacanian concepts (see 2.3, 2.4.2, and 2.4.3 below). This 1959–1960 seminar defensibly can be depicted as a prescient post-structuralist text avant la lettre.

An earthquake in Lacan's professional and personal histories hit him in 1963. For ten years (1953–1963), the SFP, following its creation after the defections from the SPP, was being scrutinized at length by the IPA as a training institute applying for IPA membership. To cut a long story short, the IPA ended up offering the SFP an ultimatum: It could be admitted only if Lacan was struck from its list of training analysts. Lacan's non-standard “variable-length sessions,” deviating from the fixed-length session rules of IPA orthodoxy, was the main reason for the IPA's withholding of its recognition from him. The SFP accepted this condition, stripping Lacan of his standing within it. In the aftermath of what he understandably experienced as a deeply wounding betrayal, he abandoned his original plans for a 1963–1964 seminar on The Names-of-the-Father (only its opening session of November 20, 1963 was given), relocated his teaching from the Hôpital Sainte-Anne to the École Normale Supérieure, and conducted his deservedly renowned eleventh seminar of 1964, The Four Fundamental Concepts of Psychoanalysis (with Lacan identifying these four concepts as the unconscious, repetition, the transference, and the drive). This seminar's opening session involved Lacan discussing his SFP-brokered “excommunication” from the IPA, with him comparing himself to Baruch Spinoza and the latter's expulsion from the Jewish community for being a heretic. However traumatic this blow, it seemed to prompt Lacan to come even more into his own, to forge a distinctly Lacanian battery of ideas and terms—and this by contrast with the more familiar Freudian language and apparatus of the first decade of le Séminaire (1953–1963). Although not without many precedents in his prior work, a Lacanianism distinct from Freudianism began to emerge clearly into view in the mid-1960s. In the shadow of his rejection by the IPA and departure from the SFP, Lacan founded his own analytic organization, the École freudienne de Paris. This new institutional framework (and freedom) provided him with a setting in which to experiment with novel approaches to analytic teaching and training.

In 1966, Lacan's hulking tome Écrits was published by Éditions du Seuil. Prior to this, Lacan had published only a single book, his thesis in psychiatry (1932). The nine-hundred-page Écrits gathered together many of Lacan's most important articles and essays into a single volume, covering a thirty-year stretch from 1936 to 1966. These “writings” provide very daunting and demanding paths of entry into Lacanian thinking (the annual seminars are comparatively more reader-friendly and transparent). Although the Écrits bear no small portion of responsibility for Lacan's reputation as a “difficult” (if not deliberately obscurantist) thinker, this book became a bestseller upon its initial release in France. Its success elevated Lacan into his fame as the French Freud in the eyes of France's reading public. During this time, Lacan's audience for le Séminaire continued to swell, with his influence growing to cover ever-wider circles of Paris-centered intellectual and cultural life.

Throughout his career, Lacan exhibited a serious interest in various branches of mathematical and formal disciplines. This goes as far back as the 1940s, with the recourse to game theory in “Logical Time and the Assertion of Anticipated Certainty.” The turn to structuralism at the end of the 1940s and beginning of the 1950s reinforced these formalistic tendencies, with Lacan, in the 1950s, already drawing upon not only game theory, Lévi-Straussian anthropology, and Jakobsonian phonology, but also the history of mathematics and topology. Throughout the 1950s and 1960s, more and more diagrams, graphs, and symbolizations appeared peppered throughout Lacan's lectures and writings, testifying to a steadily intensifying trend toward formalization. By the late 1960s and, especially, the 1970s, discussions of logic, topology, and knot theory were prominent (sometimes even dominant) features of Lacanian discourse. In relation to Lacan, the 1970s could be characterized as the decade of the “matheme,” Lacan's neologism for a unit of formalization (qua a mathematical-style symbolization) distilling and fixing the core significance of a specific Lacanian analytic concept-term. Lacan hoped thereby to avoid being misinterpreted in the ways that Freud's deceptively accessible employments of natural language allegedly allowed most non-Lacanian post-Freudians to perpetrate. Additionally, topology, as a science of surfaces, provided Lacan with resources for his regular assaults on the crude, popular images of psychoanalysis as a “depth psychology,” with these images relying upon the simplistic two- and three-dimensional Euclidean spaces of spontaneous picture thinking. Topological figures and constructions undermining the intuitions of this picture thinking assisted Lacan in recasting the unconscious as an ensemble of contortions, curvings, folding, inflections, twists, and turns immanent and internal to a single plane of minded subjectivity accessible to rigorous, rational (psycho)analysis.

In addition to the pursuit of formalization via mathemes, the seminars of the final decade of Lacan's teachings also were preoccupied with reflections on his register theory, especially the register of the Real, and sexual difference (reflections often intertwined with each other). The program of formalization ostensibly enabled Lacan to reveal with exactitude the precise limits of the sayable and the representable, thereby touching upon the Real through showing what is not pinned down fully and adequately within the coordinates of the accessible, familiar “reality” co-constituted through the other two registers of the Imaginary and the Symbolic (see 2.1 below). Various aspects and facets of things sexual came to be associated by the later Lacan with the enigmatic evasiveness of the Real, including sexual difference. In one of his most famous seminars, the twentieth (Encore, 1972–1973), he theorized sexual difference as “sexuation,” depicting the non-biological, denaturalized subject-positions of masculinity and femininity in terms of formal logic. Therein, he purported to uncover an inherent, ineliminable structural discrepancy/gap separating the sexes, an inescapable condemnation of sexed subjects to being essentially, necessarily out-of-sync with each other (and even with themselves as split subjects). Lacan summarized this with an infamous one-liner: “Il n'y a pas de rapport sexuel” (There is no sexual relationship). This declaration scandalized many at the time. Moreover, the twentieth seminar in particular as well as connected portions of Lacan's corpus from this same period served as powerful catalysts for crucial developments in French feminist thinking during the 1970s.

In 1980, near the end of his life, Lacan saw fit to disband his school, the École freudienne. This decision was controversial and triggered factional infighting amongst his followers. Lacan died in 1981. His son-in-law and editor of le Séminaire, Jacques-Alain Miller—when he was a student of Althusser's at the ENS, Miller met Lacan for the first time in 1964 as an attendee of Lacan's eleventh seminar—founded the École de la Cause freudienne as a successor to the École freudienne on the heels of the latter's “dissolution.” Miller has since retained publishing control over Lacan's texts, editing the Champ freudien book series in which official “established” versions of the annual seminars and other Lacanian writings appear.

2. Fundamental Concepts

2.1 Register Theory

The theory of the three registers of the Imaginary, the Symbolic, and the Real forms the skeletal framework for the various concepts and phases of most of Lacan's intellectual itinerary. His characterizations of each of the three registers, as well as of their relations with each other, undergo multiple revisions and shifts over the many years of his labors. As will become increasingly evident in what follows, the majority of Lacanian concepts are defined in connection with all three registers. By the 1970s, with his meditations on the topological figure of the Borromean knot—this knotting of three rings, pictured on the coat of arms of the Borromeo family, is arranged such that if one ring is broken, all three are set free in disconnection—Lacan emphasizes the mutual dependence of the registers on one another. Hence, loosely speaking, the Imaginary, the Symbolic, and the Real can be thought of as the three fundamental dimensions of psychical subjectivity à la Lacan. Furthermore, scholars sometimes segment Lacan's evolution into three main periods, with each period being distinguished by the priority of one of the registers: the early Lacan of the Imaginary (1930s and 1940s), the middle Lacan of the Symbolic (1950s), and the late Lacan of the Real (1960s and 1970s). However, such a neat and clean periodization should be taken with several grains of salt, since intricate continuities and discontinuities not conforming to this early-middle-late schema are to be found across the entire lengthy span of Lacan's teachings.

2.1.1 The Imaginary

Lacan tends to associate (albeit not exclusively) the Imaginary with the restricted spheres of consciousness and self-awareness. It is the register with the closest links to what people experience as non-psychoanalytic quotidian reality. Who and what one “imagines” other persons to be, what one thereby “imagines” they mean when communicatively interacting, who and what one “imagines” oneself to be, including from the imagined perspectives of others—all of the preceding is encompassed under the heading of this register. Such a description indicates the ways in which the Imaginary points to core analytic ideas like transference, fantasy, and the ego. In particular, the Imaginary is central to Lacan's account(s) of ego-formation (as per the mirror stage—see 2.2 below).

As Lacan integrates his early work of the 1930s and 1940s with his structuralism-informed theories of the 1950s, he comes to emphasize the dependence of the Imaginary on the Symbolic. This dependency means that more sensory-perceptual phenomena (images and experiences of one's body, affects as consciously lived emotions, envisionings of the thoughts and feelings of others, etc.) are shaped, steered, and (over)determined by socio-linguistic structures and dynamics. With the growing importance of the Real in the 1960s and the Borromean knots of the 1970s, it becomes clear that Lacan conceives of the Imaginary as bound up with both of the other two registers (incidentally, the Imaginary and the Symbolic, when taken together as mutually integrated, constitute the field of “reality,” itself contrasted with the Real). In fact, it could be maintained that the Imaginary invariably involves category mistakes. More specifically, it is the register in which the other two registers are mistaken for each other: What is Real is misrecognized as Symbolic (for example, as in particular sorts of obsessional-neurotic and paranoid-psychotic symptoms, certain meaningless contingent occurrences at the level of the material world of non-human objects are viewed as though they were meaningful signs full of deep significance to be deciphered and interpreted) and what is Symbolic is misrecognized as Real (for example, as in psychosomatic-type “conversion symptoms,” unconscious mental conflicts encoded in language and ideas are suffered as bodily afflictions and ailments).

With his choice of the word “imaginary,” Lacan indeed intends to designate that which is fictional, simulated, virtual, and the like. However, the phenomena of the Imaginary are necessary illusions (to put it in Kantian locution) or real abstractions (to put it in Marxian parlance). This signals two points. First, as one of Lacan's three basic, essential registers, the Imaginary is an intrinsic, unavoidable dimension of the existences of speaking psychical subjects; just as an analysis cannot (and should not try to) rid the analysand of his/her unconscious, so too is it neither possible nor desirable to liquidate the illusions of this register. Second, the fictional abstractions of the Imaginary, far from being merely “unreal” as ineffective, inconsequential epiphenomena, are integral to and have very concrete effects upon actual, factual human realities.

2.1.2 The Symbolic

The Lacanian Symbolic initially is theorized on the basis of resources provided by structuralism. Tied to natural languages as characterized by Saussure and specific post-Saussurians, this register also refers to the customs, institutions, laws, mores, norms, practices, rituals, rules, traditions, and so on of cultures and societies (with these things being entwined in various ways with language). Lacan's phrase “symbolic order,” which encompasses all of the preceding, can be understood as roughly equivalent to what Hegel designates as “objective spirit.” This non-natural universe is an elaborate set of inter-subjective and trans-subjective contexts into which individual human beings are thrown at birth (along the lines of Heideggerian Geworfenheit), a pre-existing order preparing places for them in advance and influencing the vicissitudes of their ensuing lives.

According to Lacan, one of the (if not the) most significant and indispensable conditions of possibility for singular subjectivity is the collective symbolic order (sometimes named “the big Other,” a phrase to be unpacked further shortly—see 2.3 below). Individual subjects are what they are in and through the mediation of the socio-linguistic arrangements and constellations of the register of the Symbolic. Especially during the period of the “return to Freud,” the analytic unconscious (qua “structured like a language”) is depicted as kinetic networks of interlinked signifiers (i.e., “signifying chains”). Rendered thusly, the unconscious, being of a Symbolic (anti-)nature in and of itself, is to be interpretively engaged with via the Symbolic medium of speech, namely, the very substance of the being-in-itself of the speaking subject (parlêtre) of the unconscious. Furthermore, the Lacanian unconscious is structured like “un langage” and not “une langue.” Although both French words translate into English as “language,” the former (langage) refers to logics and structures of syntax and semantics not necessarily specific to particular natural languages, whereas the latter (langue), which also could be translated into English as “tongue,” does refer to the notion of a natural language. Hence, Lacan is not saying that the unconscious is structured like French, German, English, Spanish, or any other particular natural language.

Although the register of the Symbolic comes to the fore only with Lacan's structuralist phase of the 1950s, it arguably is not without its precursors in his earlier texts. Already in 1938, the idea of the “complex” in the encyclopedia article on “The Family Complexes” anticipates how Lacan recasts the Freudian Oedipus complex via Lévi-Straussian structural anthropology. Similarly, the prisoners' dilemma scenario narrated in 1945's “Logical Time and the Assertion of Anticipated Certainty” illustrates how a formal, game-theoretic apparatus governs the lived experiences of subjects inserted into it. Moreover, the 1949 écrit on “The Mirror Stage” hints at the enabling background presence of a socio-symbolic milieu (incarnated first and foremost by parental caregivers) as the trigger prompting the child's identification with mirrored images of him/her-self (as I will discuss subsequently here, this hint is expanded and embellished upon by Lacan in 1960s-era revisions of the mirror stage—see 2.2 below).

Despite the rise to prominence of the register of the Real beginning around 1959–1960, the Symbolic continues to play pivotal roles in Lacan's teachings right up until the start of the 1980s. For instance, in Seminar XVII (1969–1970) and the contemporaneous interview “Radiophonie,” Lacan forges his theory of the “four discourses” (those of the “master”, “university,” “hysteric,” and “analyst”) to reflect the interlinked permutations of multiple kinds of “social links” configuring the relations between speaking subjects. More generally, the later Lacan remains reliant on the notion of the Real sides of the Symbolic, these being signifiers in their meaningless, nonsensical materiality as visible marks and audible sounds (i.e., “letters” in Lacan's technical sense)—and this by contrast with the Imaginary sides of the Symbolic, in which signifiers are paired with signifieds to form meaningful, significant signs (à la Saussure's classic explanation of successful communication via natural language). Such senseless signifiers and their enchainings amount to a late Lacanian rendition of Freudian primary processes as the thinking distinctive of unconscious mindedness.

When Lacan mentions “structure,” a word to which he has frequent recourse, he usually is thinking of his register of the Symbolic. Between the periods of his “return to Freud” and later teachings, Lacan reconsiders and alters what is conceptualized under the heading of the “like a language” (comme un langage) part of his fundamental claim that, “the unconscious is structured like a language.” However, from the 1950s until his death, his specific rendition of Freud's discovery consistently holds to the thesis that, “the unconscious is structured.” That is to say, the unconscious, as bound up with that which is Symbolic, is an intricate, labyrinthine web of ideational representations interconnected in multiple sophisticated manners. Contrary to the crudeness of commonplace vulgar picturings of Freudian analysis as an irrationalist, neo-romantic psychology of the unruly natural depths, the unconscious is not the id, namely, an anarchic seething cauldron of unthinking animalistic instincts (i.e., something unstructured).

2.1.3 The Real

The register of the Real is tricky to encapsulate and evades being pinned down through succinct definitions. Lacan's numerous and shifting pronouncements apropos the Real are themselves partly responsible for this absence of straightforwardness. But, rather than being just a barrier to grasping the Real, this absence is itself revelatory of this register. To be more precise, as that which is foreign to Imaginary-Symbolic reality—this reality is the realm containing conscious apprehension, communicable significance, and the like—the Real is intrinsically elusive, resisting by nature capture in the comprehensibly meaningful formulations of concatenations of Imaginary-Symbolic signs. It is, as Lacan stresses again and again, an “impossibility” vis-à-vis reality.

Lacan's earliest employments of the term “Real” use it to refer to material being(s) an sich, namely, to physical existents handled as roughly equivalent to Kant's things-in-themselves. The Real hence would be whatever is beyond, behind, or beneath phenomenal appearances accessible to the direct experiences of first-person awareness. This characterization of the Real persists into the first versions of Lacan's mature register theory as initially elaborated throughout the 1950s. During this decade of the “return to Freud,” the Real also gets connected to Lacan's contemporaneously emerging conceptions of psychosis and Otherness (the latter to be addressed soon—see 2.3 below). Additionally, in the 1950s, Lacan tends to speak of the Real as an absolute fullness, a pure plenum devoid of the negativities of absences, antagonisms, gaps, lacks, splits, etc. Portrayed thusly, the Symbolic is primarily responsible for injecting such negativities into the Real. For instance, only though the powers of language can material being in itself be said to be “missing” things, since, on its own, this dimension of being always is simply whatever it is in its dumb, idiotic presence as never more and never less than sheer, indifferent plenitude.

As I noted above, the seventh seminar of 1959–1960 marks a shift away from the privileging of the Symbolic over the course of the 1950s and toward prioritizing the Real. The Real prior to Seminar VII tends to be depicted in non-dialectical and/or quasi-Kantian terms. Although Kant is one of the main explicit foci during this academic year, Lacan's sustained reformulation of the Real in this seminar introduces quasi-Hegelian dialectical features into it, thereby nuancing and complicating his ideas about this register. The new Real involves convergences of opposites as a register of volatile oscillations and unstable reversals between excesses and lacks, surpluses and deficits, flooding presences and draining absences. In the seventh seminar, Lacan puts forward the figure of the mother as the key analytic referent justifying this rendition of the Real (a figure he relates to another figure, that of “the Lady” in the courtly love tradition). In the beginning of the psychical-libidinal subject's ontogentic life history, the maternal caretaker is, at one and the same time, both overwhelmingly, stiflingly present or near and, in her strange, impenetrable alterity, also frustratingly, uncontrollably absent or inaccessible; there is either too much or too little of her, never the right balanced amount. With the passage of time and the temporal transformations of the libidinal economy, the mother, as this archaic Real Other, becomes the forever unattainable “Sovereign Good,” the fixed vanishing point, of all desiring (what Lacan calls, in dialogue with the history of philosophy as well as Freud, “das Ding” [la Chose, the Thing]).

Throughout the 1960s and up through the end of Lacan's teachings, the Real takes on an ever increasing number of aspects and connotations. It becomes both a transcendence troubling and thwarting Imaginary-Symbolic reality and its language from without as well as an immanence perturbing and subverting reality/language from within. It comes to be associated with libidinal negativities (objet petit a, jouissance, and sexual difference, all to be discussed later—see 2.3, 2.4.2, and 2.4.3 below), material meaninglessness both linguistic (see 2.1.2 above) and non-linguistic, contingent traumatic events, unbearable bodily intensities, anxiety, and death.

As regards the unconscious as the principle concern of psychoanalysis, the later Lacan combines his earlier emphasis on socio-linguistic formations (à la “the unconscious is structured like a language”) with a subsequent stress on forces and factors internal but irreducible to these formations. After the 1950s, Real dimensions are added to the unconscious, with its Symbolic dimensions being made to orbit around black holes of unsymbolizability impossible to represent via the signifier-like ideational representations (Freud's Vorstellungen) of the language-like sides of the unconscious. Nonetheless, the rise of the Real in Lacan's teachings does not amount to him converting to any sort of analytic recapitulation of mysticisms or negative theologies. Instead, for Lacan, analysis both theoretical and clinical permits delineating and tracking the Real with conceptual precision, if only as an exercise in pinpointing the exact limits of the Imaginary, the Symbolic, and their overlappings.

2.2 The Mirror Stage, the Ego, and the Subject

The account of the mirror stage is perhaps Lacan's most famous theoretical contribution (maybe even more famous than the well-known thesis apropos the unconscious as “structured like a language”). Initially developed in the 1930s, this account involves a number of interrelated ingredients. Lacan offers the narrative of this stage as an explanation specifically for the genesis and functions of the Freudian psychical agency of the ego (Ich, moi). One of the psychoanalytic and philosophical upshots of the mirror stage, a crucial one in Lacan's eyes, is that the ego is an object rather than a subject. In other words, the ego, despite conscious senses to the contrary, is not a locus of autonomous agency, the seat of a free, true “I” determining its own fate. This portrait of the ego-as-object is at the heart of Lacan's lifelong critical polemics against Anglo-American ego psychology, with the ego psychologists seeking to strengthen their patients' egos by appealing to supposed autonomous and “conflict-free” sides of these psychical agencies. Against this, Lacan views the ego as thoroughly compromised and inherently neurotic to its very core, as a passionate defense of a constitutive ignorance of the unconscious.

To stay at this more general metapsychological level for a little while longer, Lacan eventually forges, partly on the basis of the mirror stage, a distinction between the ego (moi) and the subject (sujet, a word freighted with philosophical baggage—Lacan knowingly adds this word and its philosophical vocabulary to analytic discourse, although Freud did not speak of “the subject” and was wary of philosophy). Appearances notwithstanding, the ego is, when all is said and done, an inert, fixed bundle of objectified coordinates, a libidinally invested and reified entity. By contrast with the ego and the illusory sense of fictional selfhood it supports, the psychoanalytic subject of Lacanianism is an unconscious kinetic negativity defying capture by and within ego-level identificatory constructs. The Lacanian enunciating subject of the unconscious speaks through the ego while remaining irreducibly distinct from it.

Returning to a tighter focus on the mirror stage proper, Lacan, relying on empirical data from the late-nineteenth and early-twentieth centuries, posits that very young children, between the ages of six and eighteen months, quickly acquire the ability to identify their own images in reflective surfaces. At this time, infants are lacking in most physical and mental abilities possessed by older human beings. Prior to Lacan, Freud already highlights how a biologically dictated prematurational helplessness (Hilflosigkeit) naturally predestines the human being to the predominance of social nurture over material nature due to the protracted period of total reliance on other persons for one's life-or-death vital requirements. Following Freud here, Lacan fleshes out this helplessness into which birth throws neonates, describing in detail the anatomical, physiological, cognitive, emotional, and motivational facets of this natural condition of post-birth prematurity.

This initial state of helpless “motor impotence and nursling dependence” entails the infant experiencing a swirl of negative affects: anxiety, distress, frustration, and so on. To the young child, motivated by these negative affects, a crucial component of the enthralling lure exerted by the fascinating image of his/her body is this image's promise that he/she can overcome his/her Hilflosigkeit and be a unified, pulled-together whole, an integrated, coordinated totality like the bigger, more mature others he/she sees around him/her-self (however, according to Lacan, individuals spend their entire lives, beginning thusly, chasing in vain after an unattainable state of harmony and mastery first falsely promised by the mirror). This imago-Gestalt of virtual wholeness, identified with by the infant in a jubilant moment of “Aha!,” lays down the imagistic nucleus of the thereafter ontogenetically accreting ego as a series of self-objectifications in images and, soon after with the event of language acquisition, words too.

For Lacan, identification with the imago-Gestalt of the moi entails alienation—and this for additional reasons over and above those given in the preceding paragraphs. Already in the 1949 écrit on the mirror stage, mention is made of “some prop, human or artificial” supporting the infant as he/she gazes into the mirror and looks at him/her-self. In 1949, Lacan seems to think of this prop more as artificial than human, referring to the “trotte-bébé” (walker) leaned on by the child. But, in subsequent revisitations of the mirror stage during the 1960s, Lacan dramatically highlights the supporting role of fellow human beings instead. In so doing, he argues that the infant is encouraged to identify with the mirror image as “me” by verbal and gestural prompts issuing from the bigger other(s) holding him/her up in front of the reflective surface (for example, the utterance “That's you there!” accompanied by pointing and grinning). This later shift of emphasis has two crucial consequences. First, the Imaginary register of the mirror does not precede the Symbolic register of language and sociality in a linear chronology of developmental stages (as the earlier text of “The Mirror Stage” might be at risk of suggesting); if anything, socio-linguistic variables (for instance, the words and body language of parents) are the causal triggers of the child's investment in select sensory-perceptual experiences (such as the body image in the mirror). Second, this means that the imagistic nucleus of the ego is suffused from the get-go with the destinal “discourse of the Other”—in this case, fateful significations (in Lacanese, “unary traits”) coming from caregivers' narratives articulated simultaneously along with their encouragements to the child to recognize him/her-self in the mirror (“What a handsome boy!,” “What a beautiful girl!,” “You're going to grow up to be big and strong, just like your daddy,” etc.).

As a result of all of the above, Lacan considers the recognition that happens in the mirror stage to amount to “misrecognition” (méconnaissance). This likewise holds throughout life for all ensuing experiences of “recognizing” oneself as being a particular kind of “I,” namely, taking qua imagining oneself to be a certain sort of ego-level self (apropos Freudian-Lacanian psychoanalysis, it always pays to remember William Wordsworth's line, “The child is the father of the man”). The ego is not only a congealed, heteronomous object rather than fluid, autonomous subject, but also, in its very origins, a repository for the projected desires and fantasies of larger others; the child's image is a receptacle for his/her parents' dreams and wishes, with his/her body image being always-already overwritten by signifiers flowing from the libidinal economies of other speaking beings. Hence, recognizing the ego as “me,” as embodying and representing an authentic, private, unique selfhood that is most genuinely my own, is tantamount to misrecognizing that, at root, the ego ultimately is an alienating foreign introject through which I am seduced and subjected by others' conscious and unconscious wants and machinations. To borrow one of Lacan's many neologisms, the ego ultimately is something “extimate” (i.e., intimately exterior, an internal externality) insofar as it crystallizes “the desire of the Other” (qua others' conscious and unconscious wants and machinations). Or, as the Lacan of the eleventh seminar would put it, there is something in the me more than the me itself to the extent that this moi essentially is a coagulation of inter-subjective and trans-subjective alien influences.

Finally, Lacan's utilization the idea of the mirror is not exclusively literal. Although he often talks of mirrors as shiny reflective surfaces, he does not limit mirroring to being a visible physical phenomenon alone. Most importantly, other persons' speech, gestures, postures, moods, facial expressions, and so on frequently can be said to “mirror” back to one an “image” of oneself, namely, a conveyed sense of how one “appears” from other perspectives.

2.3 Otherness, the Oedipus Complex, and Sexuation

Throughout his teachings, Lacan regularly utilizes the terms “other” (with a lower-case o) and “Other” (with a capital O). Given an understanding of Lacan's register theory and the mirror stage (see 2.1 and 2.2 above), these terms can be clarified with relative ease and brevity. The lower-case-o other designates the Imaginary ego and its accompanying alter-egos. By speaking of the ego itself as an “other,” Lacan further underscores its alien and alienating status as spelled out in the immediately preceding sub-section here (see 2.2 above). Additionally, when relating to others as alter-egos, one does so on the basis of what one “imagines” about them (often imagining them to be “like me,” to share a set of lowest-common-denominator thoughts, feelings, and inclinations making them comprehensible to me). These transference-style imaginings are fictions taming and domesticating the mysterious, unsettling foreignness of one's conspecifics, thereby rendering social life tolerable and navigable.

The capital-O Other refers to two additional types of otherness corresponding to the registers of the Symbolic and the Real. The first type of Other is Lacan's “big Other” qua symbolic order, namely, the overarching “objective spirit” of trans-individual socio-linguistic structures configuring the fields of inter-subjective interactions. Relatedly, the Symbolic big Other also can refer to (often fantasmatic/fictional) ideas of anonymous authoritative power and/or knowledge (whether that of God, Nature, History, Society, State, Party, Science, or the analyst as the “subject supposed to know” [sujet supposé savoir] as per Lacan's distinctive account of analytic transference). But, as already becomes evident in Lacan's first few annual seminars of the early 1950s, there also is a Real dimension to Otherness. This particular incarnation of the Real, about which Lacan goes into greatest detail when addressing both love and psychosis, is the provocative, perturbing enigma of the Other as an unknowable “x,” an unfathomable abyss of withdrawn-yet-proximate alterity (in his 1895 Project for a Scientific Psychology, to which Lacan refers repeatedly, Freud depicts this alterity in the guise of the Nebenmensch als Ding [Neighbor-as-Thing]).

For Lacan, the Freudian Oedipus complex stages the drama of the child's laborious struggles to situate him/her-self vis-à-vis all three register-theoretic dimensions of Otherness. Thanks particularly to what he takes from his engagements with structuralism, Lacan, throughout his career, is careful to avoid a pseudo-Freudian reification of the bourgeois nuclear family, with a mother and father biologically sexed female and male respectively. The maternal and paternal Oedipal personas are psychical-subjective positions, namely, socio-cultural (i.e., non-natural, non-biological) roles that potentially can be played by any number of possible persons of various sexes/genders.

That noted, in the Lacanian version of the Oedipus complex, the maternal figure initially features for the infant as a Real Other (i.e., the Nebenmensch als Ding)—more specifically, as an obscure omnipotent presence who is the source of all-important love (more will be said about Lacan's concept of love—see 2.4.1 below). But, because of the combination of her obscurity and importance, the mother qua Real Other also is a source of deeply unsettling anxiety for the very young child. She seemingly threatens her offspring with being alternately too smothering or too withdrawn, too much or not enough. In his/her anxiousness about controlling the ultimately uncontrollable presence (and absence) of this mysterious and indispensable maternal Other, the child confronts the question, “What does the (m)Other want?” The infant's gradual formation of an ego as per the temporally elongated processes delineated in Lacan's account of the mirror stage (see 2.2 above) is, in part, a response to this riddle (albeit in a broader sense, with the child constructing an ego-level identity informed by the perceived wants of Others in addition to the mother, such as the father).

In relation to the immediately preceding, Lacan's Oedipal father is an Other with both Symbolic and Real faces. On the Symbolic side, the paternal figure represents the answer to the question, “What does the maternal Other want?” In Lacan's terminology, the child's alighting upon the paternal third party in the family romance of the Oedipal social triangle as the solution to the puzzle of the maternal figure's enigmatic intentionality amounts to “the desire of the mother,” as an unknown, being replaced by “the paternal metaphor.” Directly connected to this, Lacan (re)defines the phallus (which is not the penis) as the structural function of whatever “x” the child hypothesizes the paternal figure possesses making him the focus of the maternal figure's desire, that is, the possession enabling the father to domesticate and control the mother's otherwise unpredictable desire. Also at the level of the Symbolic, the paternal function involves bringing to bear within the child's familial sphere the disciplinary and prohibitory features of the family's enveloping symbolic order as their socio-linguistic milieu (this entails such impositions as weaning, toilet training, exogamy, and “castration” in the Freudian-Lacanian sense—see 2.4.1 below). As for Real Otherness here, this would be the version of the paternal figure mythically portrayed by Freud in Totem and Taboo (1913), namely, the tyrannical, enjoying-without-restraints “primal father” (Urvater) of the savage fraternal horde, the exception to the otherwise universal law of (symbolic) castration. This Real Urvater arguably is a fantasy-construct generated in and by the Oedipus complex, with the child imagining an obscene, dark, jouissance-saturated underbelly behind the Symbolic façade of paternal authority and its rules.

The child's identifications with maternal and paternal Others are distributed across Real and Symbolic dimensions. However, different subjects-in-formation distribute their identifications differently. Freud, in his reconsiderations of earlier renditions of the Oedipus complex, came to highlight an asymmetry between Oedipal dynamics for young boys and girls, repudiating the idea of girls undergoing an “Electra complex” as the symmetrical counterpart to the Oedipus complex. Skipping over a lot of details and cutting a long story short, the later Lacan, when taking up the topic of sexual difference, preserves this Freudian emphasis on asymmetry. In this vein, Lacan introduces the idea of sexuation as the Real of sexual difference, namely, as an impenetrable, opaque facticity of this difference continually prompting and yet perpetually resisting being adequately translated into the terms of Imaginary and Symbolic realities. As neither biologically given sex nor socially constructed gender, the Real of sexuation is what is responsible for the absence of an exhaustively representable, symbolizable natural and/or cultural relationship between sexuated positions (as per Lacan's statement, “Il n'y a pas de rapport sexuel”). The structural-psychical positions of masculinity and femininity embody constitutively out-of-synch and inherently incommensurable subjective stances, incompatible (yet interacting) arrangements of distinct sorts of libidinal economies.

2.4 The Libidinal Economy

Freud's metapsychology of the libidinal economy, of the underlying motivational mechanisms of psychical life, is grounded on his theory of drive (Trieb, and not Instinkt, despite many English mistranslations of Trieb as “instinct”). Lacan elaborates upon and extends this Freudian theoretical framework. In the process, he reworks some of Freud's concepts and adds other concepts of his own.

2.4.1 Need-Demand-Desire and Castration

Need, demand, and desire form a conceptual-terminological triad in Lacanian theory. Needs are biologically innate vital requirements for the human being as a living organism. Humans are born saddled with such imperatives from the very start, although, as per Freudian Hilflosigkeit, they are powerless on their own to satisfy these bodily dictates for a protracted initial period lasting well into childhood (see 2.2 above).

The combination of being prematurationally helpless but having unavoidable needs means that, over the course of physical and mental development, the infant must come to articulate its needs to bigger others. These others (as three-dimensional O/others along the lines of Lacan's register theory—see 2.3 above) are addressed as those capable of assisting in the meeting and quelling of needs. Of course, crying, screaming, gesticulating, and the like are early expressions of needs, being the fashions in which infants prior to acquiring language per se alert the older individuals around them of their requirements. Even at this early stage, the infant is forced to rely on his/her thus-addressed significant others to interpret the “meaning” of his/her cries, screams, and gesticulations (“Ah, you're hungry,” “Uh oh, that means you're tired,” “So, it's time to change your diaper,” etc.). Through these spontaneous interpretations, others, whether knowingly or not, participate with the pre-verbal child in shaping links between needs and the socially mediated significance of the expressions of needs. These others thereby lend the child's noises and movements the significance of being “demands,” with this amounting to a kind of assistance provided over and above the assistance of meeting bare needs themselves. Now, this is not to say that there are no natural correlations whatsoever between needs and their pre-verbal expressions hardwired into babies' behavioral repertoires. But, arguably, infants are not immediately and automatically self-consciously aware of these correlations as such, with caretakers' responses being key aids in helping the child become explicitly cognizant of need-expression couplings.

As the infant continues maturing, soon acquiring language, the influences of others and Others (especially inter-subjective others as conveyors of the signs and signifiers of the big Other qua trans-subjective symbolic order—see 2.1.2 and 2.3 above) increasingly exert themselves on the forming of associative connections between needs and demands. For example, as part of socialization and education, parents typically begin to introduce the discipline of insisting that the child articulate his/her requirements and urges in specific manners (“Say ‘please’ and ‘thank you,’” “Ask nicely,” “In this household, we do not yell when we're hungry,” and so on). The child learns that he/she must accept, internalize, and speak “the discourse of the Other” (in this instance, the parents) in order to get his/her needs recognized, acknowledged, and addressed in a satisfactory fashion. In short, he/she must make demands couched in terms and conventions imposed by O/others' socio-symbolic regimes. Lacan maintains that natural bodily needs hence, via the inter- and trans-subjective dynamics of demand, are “overwritten” by the signifiers of an ultimately Symbolic Otherness, an overwriting through which the bases of the libidinal economy are denaturalized and subjected to socio-cultural forces and factors. Much of this beds down in the young, nascent subject's psyche, thereafter exerting (often in unconscious ways) decisive effects on this person's libidinal economy throughout his/her life.

In his 1958 écrit “The Signification of the Phallus,” Lacan provides a succinct formula for defining “desire” in relation to both need and demand. He stipulates that desire is what remains after need is subtracted from demand. What, exactly, does this equation mean? Through being translated into demands, needs come to be saddled with surpluses of more-than-biological significances; vital requirements take on the excess baggage of meanings over and above the level of brute, simple organic survival. Largely by virtue of what O/others add to the child's experiences of needs through superimposing interpretations of these needs as socio-symbolic demands, the meeting of the child's needs in response to his/her demands makes these needs into, first and foremost, litmus tests of where he/she stands in relation to these thus-addressed significant O/others. Being given specific items of food by a parent in response to a demand expressing hunger can indicate to the child not only that the parent understands that a need to eat has to be met, but also, and more importantly, that he/she is loved by the parent, that he/she enjoys a privileged position in relation to the parent's attention and priorities. Lacan therefore asserts that each and every demand is, at bottom, a demand for love. Returning to the equation “demand – need = desire,” what is desired when a demand is addressed to another is not so much the meeting of the thus-expressed need, but, in addition to this, the very love of another.

Parents of children are all too familiar with seemingly endless series of demands from the little ones (“I want a sandwich,” “OK, here's a sandwich”… “I want a lollipop,” “OK, here's a lollipop”… “I want a new toy,” “OK, here's a new toy”… and on and on until an exhausted parental “No” is pronounced and wearily defended against vigorous protests). Adults, whether parents or not, also are aware of a similar desiring restlessness in themselves, an inability to acquire an object or attain a success that would be “IT” (with-a-capital-I-and-T), the final be-all-and-end-all telos of wanting and wishing satisfying them for good forever after. Similarly, an adult in a romantic relationship never is content with being told that he/she is loved by the beloved only once; he/she insists upon repetitions ad infinitum of the affirmation by the significant other that, “I love you” (as if no affirmation is ever quite enough). With both children and adults, margins of dissatisfaction, perpetually resurfacing itches that never can be scratched just right, are to be explained, according to Lacan, through a clarification of the essence of the “love” demanded in all demands in excessive addition to the gratification of corresponding needs. What is being requested is an impossibility impossible on the basis of the register-theoretic version of O/otherness à la Lacanianism (see 2.1 and 2.3 above): the non-objectifiable negativity of the kinetic, slippery heart of Real Otherness (i.e., the always-on-the-move affection, focus, etc. of the Real Other's desiring core both conscious and unconscious) being objectified as the positivity of a static, stable thing (i.e., a special object able to be gift-wrapped and handed over as part of the response to demand). Employing once again the example of hunger, while the O/other can respond to demands for food with the provision of nourishing substances answering to the need for nourishment, he/she is constitutively incapable of turning the nucleus of his/her desiring being (i.e., the non-object of his/her “love”) into one tangible object among others to be bestowed along with food and the like. As will be discussed here shortly (see 2.4.3 below), conscious and unconscious fantasies are aroused on the sides of desiring demanders—and, everyone is a desiring demander—by the necessary, inevitable dissatisfactions accompanying desires. These fantasies cover over the impossibility of bringing desires to satisfying ends. They do so by constructing scenarios in which there is a yet-to-be-(re)obtained object that really is “IT.” Moreover, in these fantasmatic scenarios, answers to questions of Real Others' inscrutable desires (“What does the Other want, and want specifically of me?”) are staged.

As should be evident by now, the intervention of the signifiers of the symbolic order (i.e., the discourses of big Others) is integral to the genesis of the need-demand-desire triad. Through the intrusion of these signifiers cutting into both the body and mind of the young child, a proto-subjective being of need, passing through the demands of discipline (in both sense of the genitive), is transformed into a subject of desire. Such a subject is “barred”—Lacan's matheme for the barred subject of desire is $—alienated from its natural needs and derailed onto the tracks of non-natural desires doomed never to reach enjoyable destinations. In connection with his revisions of the Oedipus complex (see 2.3 above), Lacan turns Freudian castration into “symbolic castration.” The latter, rather than being a real or imagined scene in which a specific threat to bodily integrity is issued, designates the dual somatic and psychical discombobulating effects upon the premature human animal caused by insertion into and subjection to surrounding socio-symbolic contexts, of being made to depend on the foreignness of signifiers and everything they bring with them.

2.4.2 Drive and Jouissance

In Freud's drive theory, sublimation amounts to a drive finding a means to secure satisfaction (Befriedigung) in the face of “aim-inhibition” (i.e., a blockage of its prior path to an earlier aimed-at drive-object). But, as Lacan observes, Freud also oddly defines the aim (Ziel) of any and every drive as satisfaction. Therefore, how can a drive achieve satisfaction if its aim (defined as the achievement of satisfaction) is inhibited? Lacan's response to this apparent Freudian contradiction is to put forward a distinction between the aim and “goal” of the drive as a metapsychological entity: While the aim of a drive can be and inevitably is inhibited, its (true) goal always is reached—and this because its goal is nothing other than enjoying the ceaseless movement of repetitively rotating around whatever blockages land on its path.

According to a certain widely accepted reading appealing to the immediately above (promoted by Slavoj Žižek and the Slovenian School of Lacanian theory), Lacan distinguishes between desire and drive. As seen (see 2.4.1 above), an essential characteristic of desire is its restlessness, its ongoing agitated searching and futile striving. No object it gets its hands on is ever quite “IT.” Whereas desire is stuck with its dissatisfied drifting from object to object and ever onward (in a structured movement akin to the “spurious/bad infinite” as per Hegel), drive derives a perverse enjoyment from this desire-fuelled libidinal circling around the vanishing point of the impossible-qua-unattainable. There where desire is frustrated, drive is gratified. Drive gains its satisfaction through vampirically feeding off of the dissatisfaction of desire.

Like the register of the Real with which it is most closely associated, jouissance, a notion that comes to the fore at the end of the 1950s, is difficult to encapsulate in succinct defining formulas. By the end of Lacan's itinerary at the start of the 1980s, this term had taken on a plethora of significations, dividing and sub-dividing into a wide array of distinct-but-related concepts. In English-language Lacanian scholarship, jouissance almost always is left untranslated, since its English equivalent, “enjoyment,” fails to capture the specifically sexual connotations of the original French word.

The best way to begin getting a sense of what Lacan means by jouissance is through reference to the Lacanian distinction between drive and desire (see 2.4.2 above) in conjunction with select stipulations by Freud regarding the infamous death drive (Todestrieb) of Freud's later dual drive theory (first laid out in 1920's Beyond the Pleasure Principle). Like Freud's Todestrieb, Lacan's jouissance is “beyond the pleasure principle” (this being another reason why the English “enjoyment,” as synonymous with pleasure, is an inappropriate translation). The post-1920 Freud muses that all drives might be said to be death drives, meaning that each and every drive perhaps works, at least in certain respects at certain times, contrary to the pursuit of the pleasurable as balance, gratification, homeostasis, satisfaction, and so on. Along these same lines, the Lacanian drive extracts “enjoyment” from the thwartings and failures of desire; whereas the latter is oriented by the tantalizingly elusive telos of pleasure qua satisfaction, the former generates its jouissance-beyond-pleasure precisely through the inhibiting of desire itself. The many possible sadistic and masochistic implications of this side of the libidinal economy are not difficult to imagine.

One of several clinical phenomena pushing Freud into dethroning the pleasure principle in 1920 as the formerly hegemonic ruler of the psyche in its entirety is “repetition compulsion” (Wiederholungszwang)—specifically, the psyche's perplexing, spontaneous compulsive repeating of that which is painful and/or traumatic (examples of this include post-traumatic disorders, so-called “negative therapeutic reaction,” and the recurrent types of self-defeats unconsciously arranged by neurotics for themselves). One of the theoretical functions of the death drive is to account for whatever disregards or disrupts the reign of the pleasure principle as a fundamental “law” of mental life. In Lacan's conceptual apparatus, jouissance sometimes likewise refers to an overriding force/tendency compelling repetitions of experiences or events upsetting the calm, delicate equilibrium of psychical subjectivity's Imaginary-Symbolic reality (hence the association of jouissance with the Real).

In the process of the neonate as a biological being acquiring both an ego and a speaking subjectivity—this involves the living organism being submitted to the mediating matrices of Imaginary-Symbolic realities—the human creature supposedly loses, through symbolic castration (see 2.4.1 above), access to an immediate, undiluted jouissance in its raw, unmitigated intensities (whether this is an actual, factual occurrence in linear, chronological ontogeny or an après-coup, retrospective fantasy is a complicated issue in Lacanian theory). The jouissance presumably lost to the speaking subject returns only in the guises of what might be labeled “limit experiences,” namely, encounters with that which is annihilating, inassimilable, overwhelming, traumatic, or unbearable. Similarly, jouissance, in this vein, is related to transgressive violations, the breaching of boundaries and breaking of barriers. It is difficult, if not impossible, for the parlêtre to accommodate, tolerate, and digest. The speaking being is forced to cohabitate uneasily with its always problematic jouissance.

2.4.3 Fantasy and Object a

In line with Freud's discussions of fantasizing in psychical life, Lacan treats fantasies, particularly those functioning at the level of fundamental formations of the unconscious, as schematizations (in a quasi-Kantian respect) of desiring subjectivity. Put differently, the wants and wishes of a particular subject are shaped and governed by a peculiar skeletal template, an idiosyncratic and paradigmatic Ur-scene, in which this desiring subject is positioned in a specific manner vis-à-vis a specific object of its desire. This fundamental template/scene is an unconscious formation operating as a transcendental condition of possibility for the subject's libidinal economy in all its crucial, symptomatic manifestations. Lacan's matheme for the fantasy is $ ◊ a. The $ stands for the subject of desire brought into being by the barring/splitting consequences of Others' mediating influences (see 2.3 and 2.4.1 above).

The a stands for objet petit a, that is, object a as the “object-cause of desire.” Lacan employs this latter phrase for object a because this “object” is a spectral, virtual construct of what would qualify as “IT” for the desiring subject (see 2.4.1 above), with this libidinal-transcendental schema of desire's object (i.e., a) “causing” select given empirical objects in a person's libidinal-amorous history and experience to be desired as stand-ins for “IT.” However, these substitutes are always and necessarily inadequate and unsatisfactory due to an insurmountable, ineliminable gap between the more-than-empirical fantasmatic objet a originating in the subject's unconscious past and the empirical objects present and future incarnating it. These latter objects are situated in Imaginary-Symbolic reality, condemned partially and imperfectly to embody an interminably receding and elusive surplus (i.e., the impossible-qua-Real dimension of object a).

To refer back one last time to the matheme of fantasy ($ ◊ a), the diamond-shaped “lozenge” (poinçon) ◊ can be read as a condensation of four symbols: one, ∧ (the logical symbol for conjunction [“and”]); two, ∨ (the logical symbol for disjunction [“or”]); three, > (the mathematical symbol for “greater than”); and, four, < (the mathematical symbol for “less than”). As per Lacan's matheme, the subject's desires are scripted and orchestrated by an unconscious fundamental fantasy in which the desiring subject ($) is positioned in relation to its corresponding object-cause of desire (a). Hence, ∧, ∨, >, and < represent, in a deliberately loose and open fashion, possible variants of this positioning of $ vis-à-vis a. Singular subjects flesh out conjunction, disjunction, being “greater than,” and being “less than” in their own styles, namely, as their unique fantasies of merger or symbiosis (conjunction), scorn or refusal (disjunction), mastery or domination (“greater than”), slavery or submission (“less than”), and any number of other possible particularizations of these four basic categories of rapport.

In some of Lacan's earlier presentations of the mirror stage, the a serves as an abbreviation for autre (other). More precisely, in this context, a refers primarily to the little-o-other as the Imaginary ego (see 2.2 and 2.3 above). The ego is an “other,” a not-me misrecognized as “me,” insofar as it is brought into existence through a combination of an object external to the (proto-)subject (i.e., the imago-Gestalt of the body image) and the interests of Symbolic and Real Others investing this object through words and behaviors. Within the framework of the mirror stage, a (usually as a') also designates alter-egos as the Imaginary partners with which the ego itself is inextricably intertwined, invariably defining itself through reference to these partners.

Furthermore, there indeed is a thread of continuity between the a of the mirror stage and object a: Both ego (as a) and fantasy (with its a) unconsciously are the subject's fateful answers to the questions, “What does the Other want?” and “How must I position myself with respect to the desire of the Other?” (see 2.3 above). Lacan's a, like the rest of his mathemes, is deliberately handled as akin to an algebraic variable. It is a placeholder for any number of particular types of determinants: what an Other desires, what I must be so as to be the object of an Other's desire, what would at last lay to rest my restless strivings and yearnings, what would do so for a significant Other to whom I remain attached, etc. But, in all cases, a reflects Lacan's Hegelian-Kojèvian slogan having it that, “man's desire is the desire of the Other.”


Several remarks are warranted about the bibliographies of primary and secondary Lacanian literature below. As regards primary sources, only fifteen of Lacan's twenty-six annual seminars have been published by Jacques-Alain Miller through the Champ freudien series. As of the end of 2012, the following seminars are available in official editions: I, II, III, IV, V, VII, VIII, X, XI, XVI, XVII, XVIII, XIX, XX, and XXIII. Of these, only seven have been published as authorized English translations by W.W. Norton and Company: I, II, III, VII, XI, XVII, and XX. The primary sources listed below are the available book-length texts by Lacan. These lists do not include various separate essay-length pieces scattered across numerous places.

As regards secondary sources, I have been highly selective in compiling the list that follows. There are mountains of literature on Lacan in multiple languages. Moreover, these bodies of scholarship cover Lacan's ideas from a vast array of disciplinary angles. Considering the context of this overview, the secondary sources listed below are, for the most part, books in English with more of a philosophical/theoretical focus.

A. Primary Sources

Work by Lacan in French

Work by Lacan in English Translation

Primary Literature by Others

B. Secondary Literature on Lacan in English

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