Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to The Analysis of Knowledge

1. See Stanley 2011 and his opponents discussed therein.

2. This objection is due to Nicholas Maxwell.

3. But the interpretation of the relevant empirical data is a vexed matter; David Rose and Jonathan Schaffer have new empirical work in progress defending a (dispositional) belief condition on knowledge from Myers-Schutz & Schwitzgebel's argument.

4. This is not necessarily to say that the subject must have engaged in an activity of justifying, or attempted to show that p is true. Rather, what the justification condition requires is merely that a belief that qualifies as knowledge have the property of being justified. It can have that property even if S did not engage in the activity of justifying her belief that p. Consider an ordinary person's belief that five and five is ten. Most people have never attempted to justify this belief, and probably would be at a loss as to how to go about justifying it. But for most people, that belief would qualify as an instance of knowledge. The importance of the distinction between the activity of justifying and a belief's property of being justified is emphasized by William Alston in the following passage:

To turn to justification, the first point is that we will be working with the concept of a subject S's being justified in believing that p, rather than with the concept of S's justifying a belief. That is, we will be concerned with the state or condition of being justified, rather than with the activity of justifying a belief. These concepts are sometimes conflated in the literature. The crucial difference between them is that while to justify a belief is to marshal considerations in its support, in order for one to be justified in believing that p it is not necessary that one have done anything by way of an argument for p or for one's epistemic situation vis-à-vis p. Unless one is justified in many beliefs without arguing for them, there is precious little one can justifiably believe. (Alston 1991, p. 71)

For an alternative view, see Almeder 1999, pp. 90 and 123. Almeder defends the view that,

as a matter of ordinary discourse, ‘being justified’ is not something we can always separate from the activity of giving, or being able to give, reasons when the question ‘How do you know?’ is appropriately asked. (Ibid, p. 92)

5. See Conee and Feldman 1985 & 2004 for a general presentation of their ‘evidentialist’ view; see Connee & Feldman 2001 for a distinctive focus on their internalism. For criticisms of evidentialism, see DeRose 2000, and Plantinga 1996a, pp. 358–361, and the essays of Dougherty 2011; for criticisms of internalism more generally, see Goldman 1999 & 2009b.

6. This is a simplified statement of reliabilism; a more precise one distinguishes conditionally reliable mechanisms (like inference) from unconditionally reliable ones (like perception). See Goldman 1979.

7. Finer distinctions are sometimes drawn; for example, one might consider ex ante justification (in a position to have a justified belief) as distinct from both doxastic (having a justified belief) and propositional (having reason to believe) justification. The distinction given in the main text is illuminating enough for present purposes.

8. This talk of ‘sufficient reason’ is intended to be consistent with the idea that in some cases, no reasons are needed to suffice for propositional justification—that some justification comes ‘for free’, not dependent on the possession of any reasons at all. See e.g., Lyons 2009, Wright 2004. In such cases, the null set of reasons constitutes ‘sufficient’ reason.

9. Externalists about doxastic justification, of course, will think that whether a belief is in the relevant sense ‘appropriate’ is settled in part by external factors.

10. See for example Hawthorne (2002) and Goldman & Olsson (2009); the latter contains additional relevant references.

11. Gettier states explicitly the assumption that a justified belief can be false.

12. See Chisholm 1977, chapter 6. Chisholm's strategy of building a degettiering clause into the justification condition is difficult to understand, given Chisholm's deep commitment to internalism. Since degettiering is an external matter, this strategy makes justification an external property.

13. See, for example, Armstrong 1973, p. 152, and Clark 1963. For further references, see Shope 1983, p. 24. This monograph provides a comprehensive discussion of the Gettier literature up to 1980. For a shorter helpful discussion of the Gettier problem, see the Appendix in Pollock 1986.

14. This case is similar to Chisholm's (1989) ‘sheep on a hill’ case.

15. More sophisticated articulations of a sensitivity condition will relativize it to bases or methods. See Nozick 1981, p. 179. The argument against sensitivity given in the main text should apply equally well to these subtler formulations.

16. The term is from DeRose (1995, 27–28).

17. Note that a sensitivity condition, being only a necessary condition on knowledge, does not itself imply the nonskeptical claim. A skeptic could commit to a sensitivity condition without admitting abominable conjunctions.

18. See Williamson 2000, ch. 7 for a more detailed discussion.

19. This is one of several formulations of safety Sosa offers.

20. Ichikawa 2011a offers a semantics for counterfactuals in which, pace Sosa, sensitivity and safety are equivalent.

21. Suppose S truly believes that p. Then the uniquely nearest possible world in which S believes p is the actual world; by stipulation, p is true in that world. Therefore, if S were to believe that p, p would not be false.

22. Some contemporary contextualists, including Lewis 1996, Schaffer 2004, Blome-Tillmann 2009b, and Ichikawa 2011b, are naturally thought of as endorsing versions of the relevant alternatives theory (where which alternatives are ‘relevant’ for a given use of ‘knows’ depends on the context of utterance). See §12.

23. E.g., Goldman 1967, 1976; Armstrong 1973; Dretske 1981. Kornblith (2008, 7) suggests that the decline in attention for such views is attributable to Goldman's 1979 shift from his previous position to one in which knowledge requires justification, where the latter is understood as reliability, but questions the motivation for Goldman's move.

24. For examples of reliabilist approaches to knowledge, see: Armstrong 1973, Dretske 1981, and Nozick 1981.

25. Note that process reliabilism is an example of a view that requires a “causal condition” in a weaker sense: features of the process that caused the belief are important for justification. As the term is used here, “causal theories” require a causal connection between the belief and the truth of the proposition believed.

26. See Shope 1983, ch. 5 for further details.

27. Dretske's own information-theoretic account of knowledge, given in ch. 4 of his 1981, is more complicated than Simple K-Reliabilism. Dretske claims (1981, 97) that his view avoids Gettier problems, but this is controversial. For some discussion of what Dretske would say about the barn facades case, see Dretske 2005, p. 24, note 4.

28. For an example of a reliability condition amended with an eye toward the Gettier problem, see Goldman 1976 (also Goldman 1986, 46–7).

29. Zagzebski outlines this option in her (1994, 72).

30. Whether it also entails the third will depend on one's particular theory of justification. Alternatively, another analysis in this spirit, following the lead of the views discussed in §6, could simply omit the justification condition.

31. This example was first brought to the attention of one of the authors (Jonathan Ichikawa) by Joshua Schechter, who suggested it may be due to Gilbert Harman.

32. Duncan Pritchard (2005) distinguishes between senses of epistemic luck, including this one, arguing that some, but not others, are inconsistent with knowledge.

33. Sosa characterizes the relevant skill in reliabilistic terms; a belief is adroit if and only if it is produced by a mechanism that tends to produce true, rather than false, beliefs. But the AAA model, and the corresponding account of knowledge, does not obviously depend on this reliabilism. One could characterize skill differently, and still define knowledge in terms of skill as Sosa does.

34. This is how Sosa characterizes a particular kind of knowledge, which he calls ‘animal knowledge,’ distinguishing another, more ambitious state of ‘reflective knowledge’. See (Sosa 2007, 24).

35. Alan Millar seems to be defending one or both of these strategies in Pritchard, Millar & Haddock (2010, 129–30). Greco (2009) seems to be defending the first.

36. See Sosa 2007, pp. 31–32.

37. Sutton 2007 and Bird 2007 each offer an approach to justification given in terms of knowledge.

38. The term ‘pragmatic encroachment’ was first used by Jonathan Kvanvig on the Certain Doubts weblog: (“Pragmatic aspects of knowledge?” June 12, 2004)

39. Talk of ‘sameness of epistemic position’ must be understood carefully. There is a sense of course in which knowing that p is part of one's epistemic position; when we say that Sandra and Daniel are in the same epistemic position, this cannot be the sense that we intend. One might—and some epistemologists do—say that Sandra and Daniel have the same (or equivalent) evidence. This will suffice only if pragmatic encroachment does not extend to evidence as well; it will not if, for example, Williamson (2000) is right that a subject's evidence consists in one's knowledge, or if Stanley (2005, 124) is right that encroachment extends to all interesting epistemic notions.

40. This connection between knowledge and action is similar to ones endorsed by Fantl & McGrath (2009), but it is stronger than anything they argue for.

41. Kaplan (1977) gives the standard view of indexicals.