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Intuitionism in the Philosophy of Mathematics

First published Thu Sep 4, 2008; substantive revision Wed Aug 14, 2013

Intuitionism is a philosophy of mathematics that was introduced by the Dutch mathematician L.E.J. Brouwer (1881–1966). Intuitionism is based on the idea that mathematics is a creation of the mind. The truth of a mathematical statement can only be conceived via a mental construction that proves it to be true, and the communication between mathematicians only serves as a means to create the same mental process in different minds.

This view on mathematics has far reaching implications for the daily practice of mathematics, one of its consequences being that the principle of the excluded middle, (A ∨ ¬A), is no longer valid. Indeed, there are propositions, like the Riemann hypothesis, for which there exists currently neither a proof of the statement nor of its negation. Since knowing the negation of a statement in intuitionism means that one can prove that the statement is not true, this implies that both A and ¬A do not hold intuitionistically, at least not at this moment. The dependence of intuitionism on time is essential: statements can become provable in the course of time and therefore might become intuitionistically valid while not having been so before.

Besides the rejection of the principle of the excluded middle, intuitionism strongly deviates from classical mathematics in the conception of the continuum, which in the former setting has the property that all total functions on it are continuous. Thus, unlike several other theories of constructive mathematics, intuitionism is not a restriction of classical reasoning; it contradicts classical mathematics in a fundamental way.

Brouwer devoted a large part of his life to the development of mathematics on this new basis. Although intuitionism has never replaced classical mathematics as the standard view on mathematics, it has always attracted a great deal of attention and is still widely studied today.

In this entry we concentrate on the aspects of intuitionism that set it apart from other branches of constructive mathematics, and the part that it shares with other forms of constructivism, such as foundational theories and models, is discussed only briefly.

1. Brouwer

Luitzen Egbertus Jan Brouwer was born in Overschie, the Netherlands. He studied mathematics and physics at the University of Amsterdam, where he obtained his PhD in 1907. In 1909 he became a lecturer at the same university, where he was appointed full professor in 1912, a position he held until his retirement in 1951. Brouwer was a brilliant mathematician who did ground-breaking work in topology and became famous already at a young age. All his life he was an independent mind who pursued the things he believed in with ardent vigor, which brought him in conflict with many a colleague, most notably with David Hilbert. He had admirers as well, and in his house “the hut” in Blaricum he welcomed many well-known mathematicians of his time. To the end of his life he became more isolated, but his belief in the truth of his philosophy never wavered. He died in a car accident at the age of 85 in Blaricum, seven years after the death of his wife Lize Brouwer.

At the age of 24 Brouwer wrote the book Life, Art and Mysticism (Brouwer 1905), whose solipsistic content foreshadows his philosophy of mathematics. In his dissertation the foundations of intuitionism are formulated for the first time, although not yet under that name and not in their final form. In the first years after his dissertation most of Brouwer's scientific life was devoted to topology, an area in which he is still known for his theory of dimension and his fixed point theorem. This work is part of classical mathematics; according to Brouwer's later view, his fixed point theorem does not hold, although an analogue cast in terms of approximations can be proved to hold according to his principles.

From 1913 on, Brouwer increasingly dedicated himself to the development of the ideas formulated in his dissertation into a full philosophy of mathematics. He not only refined the philosophy of intuitionism but also reworked mathematics, especially the theory of the continuum and the theory of sets, according to these principles. By then, Brouwer was a famous mathematician who gave influential lectures on intuitionism at the scientific meccas of that time, Cambridge, Vienna, and Göttingen among them. His philosophy was considered awkward by many, but treated as a serious alternative to classical reasoning by some of the most famous mathematicians of his time, even when they had a different view on the matter. Kurt Gödel, who was a Platonist all his life, was one of them. Hermann Weyl at one point wrote “So gebe ich also jetzt meinen eigenen Versuch Preis und schließe mich Brouwer an” (Weyl 1921, 56). And although he rarely practised intuitionistic mathematics later in life, Weyl never stopped admiring Brouwer and his intuitionistic philosophy of mathematics.

The life of Brouwer was laden with conflicts, the most famous one being the conflict with David Hilbert, which eventually led to Brouwer's expulsion from the board of the Mathematische Annalen. This conflict was part of the Grundlagenstreit that shook the mathematical society at the beginning of the 20th century and that emerged as a result of the appearance of paradoxes and highly nonconstructive proofs in mathematics. Philosophers and mathematicians were forced to acknowledge the lack of an epistemological and ontological basis for mathematics. Brouwer's intuitionism is a philosophy of mathematics that aims to provide such a foundation.

2. Intuitionism

2.1 The two acts of intuitionism

According to Brouwer mathematics is a languageless creation of the mind. Time is the only a priori notion, in the Kantian sense. Brouwer distinguishes two acts of intuitionism:

The first act of intuitionism is:

Completely separating mathematics from mathematical language and hence from the phenomena of language described by theoretical logic, recognizing that intuitionistic mathematics is an essentially languageless activity of the mind having its origin in the perception of a move of time. This perception of a move of time may be described as the falling apart of a life moment into two distinct things, one of which gives way to the other, but is retained by memory. If the twoity thus born is divested of all quality, it passes into the empty form of the common substratum of all twoities. And it is this common substratum, this empty form, which is the basic intuition of mathematics. (Brouwer 1981, 4–5)

As will be discussed in the section on mathematics, the first act of intuitionism gives rise to the natural numbers but implies a severe restriction on the principles of reasoning permitted, most notably the rejection of the principle of the excluded middle. Owing to the rejection of this principle and the disappearance of the logical basis for the continuum, one might, in the words of Brouwer, “fear that intuitionistic mathematics must necessarily be poor and anaemic, and in particular would have no place for analysis” (Brouwer 1952, 142). The second act, however, establishes the existence of the continuum, a continuum having properties not shared by its classical counterpart. The recovery of the continuum rests on the notion of choice sequence stipulated in the second act, i.e. on the existence of infinite sequences generated by free choice, which therefore are not fixed in advance.

The second act of intuitionism is:

Admitting two ways of creating new mathematical entities: firstly in the shape of more or less freely proceeding infinite sequences of mathematical entities previously acquired …; secondly in the shape of mathematical species, i.e. properties supposable for mathematical entities previously acquired, satisfying the condition that if they hold for a certain mathematical entity, they also hold for all mathematical entities which have been defined to be “equal” to it …. (Brouwer 1981, 8)

The two acts of intuitionism form the basis of Brouwer's philosophy; from these two acts alone Brouwer creates the realm of intuitionistic mathematics, as will be explained below. Already from this basic principles it can be concluded that intuitionism differs from Platonism and formalism, because neither does it assume a mathematical reality outside of us, nor does it hold that mathematics is a play with symbols according to certain fixed rules. In Brouwer's view, language is used to exchange mathematical ideas, and it cannot come before mathematics as it in fact presupposes it. The distinction between intuitionism and other constructive views on mathematics according to which mathematical objects and arguments should be computable, lies in the freedom that the second act allows in the construction of infinite sequences. Indeed, as will be explained below, the mathematical implications of the second act of intuitionism contradict classical mathematics, and therefore do not hold in most constructive theories, since these are in general part of classical mathematics.

Thus Brouwer's intuitionism stands apart from other philosophies of mathematics; it is based on the awareness of time and the conviction that mathematics is a creation of the free mind, and it therefore is neither Platonism nor formalism. It is a form of constructivism, but only so in the wider sense, since many constructivists do not accept all the principles that Brouwer believed to be true.

2.2 The creating subject

The two acts of intuitionism do not in themselves exclude a psychological interpretation of mathematics. Although Brouwer only occasionally addressed this point, it is clear from his writings that he did consider intuitionism to be independent of psychology. Brouwer's introduction of the creating subject (Brouwer 1948) as an idealized mind in which mathematics takes place already abstracts away from inessential aspects of human reasoning such as limitations of space and time and the possibility of faulty arguments. Thus the intersubjectivity problem, which asks for an explanation of the fact that human beings are able to communicate, ceases to exist, as there exists only one creating subject. The notion has become known in the literature as the creative subject, but here Brouwer's terminology is used. In Niekus 2010, it is argued that Brouwer's creating subject does not involve an idealized mathematician. For a phenomenological analysis of the creating subject as a transcendental subject in the sense of Husserl see van Atten 2007.

In most philosophies of mathematics, for example in Platonism, mathematical statements are tenseless. In intuitionism truth and falsity have a temporal aspect; an established fact will remain so, but a statement that becomes proven at a certain point in time lacks a truth-value before that point. In the formalization of the notion of creating subject, which was not formulated by Brouwer but only later by others, the temporal aspect of intuitionism is incorporated in the axioms (here □nA denotes that the creating subject experiences the truth of A at time n, or, in other words, that it has a proof of A at time n):

(CS1) nA ∨ ¬□nA (it can be decided whether the creating subject knows A)
(CS2) mA → □m+nA (what the creating subject knows remains known to him)
(CS3) nnAA (what is true will be discovered to be so by the creating subject, and it cannot know what is not true)
The first axiom is a form of the principle of the excluded middle concerning the knowledge of the creating subject. The second axiom clearly uses the fact that the creating subject is an idealization since it expresses that proofs will always be remembered. The last axiom is not one a mathematician using classical reasoning would adhere to. In fact, Gödel's incompleteness theorem indicates that the principle is false when □nA would be interpreted as being provable in a reasonable proof system, which, however, is certainly not what Brouwer had in mind.

Brouwer used arguments that involve a creating subject to construct counterexamples to certain intuitionistically unacceptable statements. Where the weak counterexamples, to be discussed below, only show that certain statements cannot, at present, be accepted intuitionistically, the notion of the idealized mind proves certain classical principles to be false. One can, for example, given a statement A that does not contain any reference to time, i.e. no occurrence of □n, define an infinite sequence (what will later be called a choice sequence) according to the following rule (Brouwer 1953):

α(n) = { 0 if ¬□nA
1 if □nA

From this follows the principle known as Kripke's schema,

∃α(A ↔ ∃n α(n) = 1).

In van Dalen 1978 a model for the axioms of the creating subject is given in the context of arithmetic and choice sequences. Thus proving this notion to be consistent with intuitionistic arithmetic and certain parts of analysis.

Important as the arguments using the notion of creating subject might be for the further understanding of intuitionism as a philosophy of mathematics, its role in the development of the field has been less influential than that of the two acts of intuitionism, which directly lead to the mathematical truths Brouwer and those coming after him were willing to accept.

3. Mathematics

Although Brouwer's development of intuitionism played an important role in the foundational debate among mathematicians at the beginning of the 20th century, the far reaching implications of his philosophy for mathematics became only apparent after many years of research. The two most characteristic properties of intuitionism are the logical principles of reasoning that it allows in proofs and the full conception of the intuitionistic continuum. Only as far as the latter is concerned, intuitionism becomes incomparable with classical mathematics. In this entry the focus is on those principles of intuitionism that set it apart from other mathematical disciplines, and therefore its other constructive aspects will be treated in less detail.

3.1 The BHK-interpretation

In intuitionism, knowing that a statement A is true means having a proof of it. In 1934 Arend Heyting, who had been a student of Brouwer, introduced a form of what became later known as the Brouwer-Heyting-Kolmogorov-interpretation, which captures the meaning of the logical symbols in intuitionism, and in constructivism in general as well. It defines in an informal way what an intuitionistic proof should consist of by indicating how the connectives and quantifiers should be interpreted.

The negation ¬A of a formula A is proven once it has been shown that there cannot exist a proof of A, which means providing a construction that derives falsum from any possible proof of A. Thus ¬A is equivalent to A → ⊥. The BHK-interpretation is not a formal definition because the notion of construction is not defined and therefore open to different interpretations. Nevertheless, already on this informal level one is forced to reject one of the logical principles ever-present in classical logic: the principle of the excluded middle (A¬A). According to the BHK-interpretation this statement holds intuitionistically if the creating subject knows a proof of A or a proof that A cannot be proved. In the case that neither for A nor for its negation a proof is known, the statement (A¬A) does not hold. The existence of open problems, such as the Goldbach conjecture or the Riemann hypothesis, illustrates this fact. But once a proof of A or a proof of its negation is found, the situation changes, and for this particular A the principle (A¬A) is true from that moment on.

3.2 Intuitionistic logic

Brouwer rejected the principle of the excluded middle on the basis of his philosophy, but Arend Heyting was the first to formulate a comprehensive logic of principles acceptable from an intuitionistic point of view. Intuitionistic logic, which is the logic of most other forms of constructivism as well, is often referred to as “classical logic without the principle of the excluded middle”. It is denoted by IQC, which stands for Intuitionistic Quantifier Logic, but other names occur in the literature as well. A possible axiomatization in Hilbert style consists of the principles

A → (BA) xA(x) → A(t) A(t) → ∃xA(x) ⊥ → A
(A → (BC)) → ((AB) → (AC))
A → (BAB) (AC) →((BC) → (ABC))
x(BA(x)) → (B → ∀xA(x)) x(A(x) → B) → (∃xA(x) → B)

with the usual side conditions for the last two axioms, and the rule Modus Ponens,

from A and (AB) infer B,

as the only rule of inference. Intuitionistic logic has been an object of investigation ever since Heyting formulated it. Already at the propositional level it has many properties that sets it apart from classical logic, such as the Disjunction Property:

(DP)      IQC⊢AB   ⇒   IQC⊢A   or   IQC⊢B.

This principle is clearly violated in classical logic, because classical logic proves (A¬A) also for formulas that are independent of the logic, i.e. for which both A and ¬A. are not a tautology. The inclusion of the principle Ex Falso Sequitur Quodlibet, (⊥→A), in intuitionistic logic is a point of discussion for those studying Brouwer's remarks on the subject; in van Atten 2008, it is argued that the principle is not valid in Intuitionism and that the logical principles valid according to Brouwer's views are those of relevance logic. See van Dalen 2004 for more on Brouwer and Ex Falso Sequitur Quodlibet.

Although till today all the logic used in intuitionistic reasoning is contained in IQC, it is in principle conceivable that at some point there will be found a principle acceptable from the intuitionistic point of view that is not covered by this logic. For most forms of constructivism the widely accepted view is that this will not ever be the case, and thus IQC is considered to be the logic of constructivism. For intuitionism the situation is less clear because it cannot be excluded that at some point our intuitionistic understanding might lead us to new logical principles that we did not grasp before.

One of the reasons for the widespread use of intuitionistic logic is that it is well-behaved both from the proof-theoretic as the model-theoretic point of view. There exist a great many proof systems for it, such as Gentzen calculi and natural deduction systems, as well as various forms of semantics, such as Kripke models, Beth models, Heyting algebras, topological semantics and categorical models. Several of these semantics are, however, only classical means to study intuitionistic logic, for it can be shown that an intuitionistic completeness proof with respect to them cannot exist (Kreisel 1962). It has, however, been shown that there are alternative but a little less natural models with respect to which completeness does hold constructively (Veldman 1976). The constructive character of intuitionistic logic becomes particularly clear in the Curry-Howard isomorphism that establishes a correspondence between derivations in the logic and terms in simply typed λ-calculus, that is, between proofs and computations. The correspondence preserves structure in that reduction of terms correspond to normalization of proofs.

3.3 The natural numbers

The existence of the natural numbers is given by the first act of intuitionism, that is by the perception of the movement of time and the falling apart of a life moment into two distinct things: what was, 1, and what is together with what was, 2, and from there to 3, 4, ... In contrast to classical mathematics, in intuitionism all infinity is considered to be potential infinity. In particular this is the case for the infinity of the natural numbers. Therefore statements that quantify over this set have to be treated with caution. On the other hand, the principle of induction is fully acceptable from an intuitionistic point of view.

Because of the finiteness of a natural number in contrast to, for example, a real number, many arithmetical statements of a finite nature that are true in classical mathematics are so in intuitionism as well. For example, in intuitionism every natural number has a prime factorization; there exist computably enumerable sets that are not computable; (A ∨ ¬A) holds for all quantifier free statements A. For more complex statements, such as van der Waerden's theorem or Kruskal's theorem, intuitionistic validity is not so straightforward. In fact, the intuitionistic proofs of both statements are complex and deviate from the classical proofs (Coquand 1995, Veldman 2004).

Thus in the context of the natural numbers, intuitionism and classical mathematics have a lot in common. It is only when other infinite sets such as the real numbers are considered that intuitionism starts to differ more dramatically from classical mathematics, and from most other forms of constructivism as well.

3.4 The continuum

In intuitionism, the continuum is both an extension and a restriction of its classical counterpart. In its full form, both notions are incomparable since the intuitionistic real numbers possess properties that the classical real numbers do not have. A famous example, to be discussed below, is the theorem that in intuitionism every total function on the continuum is continuous. That the intuitionistic continuum does not satisfy certain classical properties can be easily seen via weak counterexamples. That it also contains properties that the classical reals do not posses stems from the existence, in intuitionism, of choice sequences.

Weak counterexamples

The weak counterexamples, introduced by Brouwer in 1908, are the first examples that Brouwer used to show that the shift from a classical to an intuitionistic conception of mathematics is not without consequence for the mathematical truths that can be established according to these philosophies. They show that certain classical statements are presently unacceptable from an intuitionistic point of view. As an example, consider the sequence of real numbers given by the following definition:

rn = { 2−n if ∀mn A(m)
2−m if ¬A(m) ∧ mn ∧∀k< m A(k).

Here A(n) is a decidable property for which ∀nA(n) is not known to be true or false. Decidability means that at present for any given n there exists (can be constructed) a proof of A(n) or of ¬A(n). At the time of this writing, we could for example let A(n) express that n, if greater than 2, is the sum of three primes; ∀nA(n) then expresses the (original) Goldbach conjecture that every number greater than 2 is the sum of three primes. The sequence <rn> defines a real number r for which the statement r = 0 is equivalent to the statement ∀nA(n). It follows that the statement (r = 0 ∨ r ≠ 0) does not hold, and therefore that the law of trichotomy ∀x(x < yx = yy < x) is not true on the intuitionistic continuum.

Note the subtle difference between “A is not intuitionistically true ” and “A is intuitionistically refutable”: in the first case we know that A cannot have an intuitionistic proof, the second statement expresses that we have a proof of ¬A, i.e. a construction that derives falsum from any possible proof of A. For the law of trichotomy we have just shown that it is not intuitionistically true. Below it will be shown that even the second stronger form saying that the law is refutable holds intuitionistically. This, however, is not true for all statements for which there exist weak counterexamples. For example, the Goldbach conjecture is a weak couterexample to the principle of the excluded middle, since ∀nA(n) as above is at present not known to be true or false, and thus we cannot assert ∀nA(n)∨¬∀nA(n) intuitionistically, at least not at this moment. But the refutation of this statement, ¬(∀nA(n)∨¬∀nA(n)), is not true in intuitionism, as one can show that for any statement B a contradiction can be derived from the assumption that ¬B and ¬¬B hold (and thus also from B and ¬B). In other words, ¬¬(B∨¬B) is intuitionistically true, and thus, although there exist weak counterexamples to the principle of the excluded middle, its negation is false in intuitionism, that is, it is intuitionistically refutable.

The existence of real numbers r for which the intuitionist cannot decide whether they are positive or not shows that certain classically total functions cease to be so in an intuitionistic setting, such as the piecewise constant function

f(r) = { 0 if r≥0
1 if r < 0

There exist weak counterexamples to many classically valid statements. The construction of these weak counterexamples often follow the same pattern as the example above. For example, the argument that shows that the intermediate value theorem is not intuitionistically valid runs as follows. Let r be a real number in [−1,1] for which (r ≤ 0 ∨ 0 < r) has not been decided, as in the example above. Define the uniformly continuous function f on [0,3] by

f(x) = min(x−1,0) + max(0,x−2) + r.

Clearly, f(0) = −1 + r and f(3) = 1 + r, whence f takes the value 0 at some point x in [0,3]. If such x could be determined, either 1 ≤ x or x ≤ 2. Since f equals r on [1,2], in the first case r ≤ 0 and in the second case 0 ≤ r, contradicting the undecidability of the statement (r ≤ 0 ∨ 0 ≤ r).

These examples seem to indicate that in the shift from classical to intuitionistic mathematics one loses several fundamental theorems of analysis. This however is not so, since in many cases intuitionism regains such theorems in the form of an analogue in which existential statements are replaced by statements about the existence of approximations within arbitrary precision, as in this classically equivalent form of the intermediate value theorem that is constructively valid:

Theorem. For every continuous real-valued function f on an interval [a,b] with a < b, for every c between f(a) and f(b), the following holds:

nx∈[a,b] | f(x) − c | < 2−n.

Weak counterexamples are a means to show that certain mathematical statements do not hold intuitionistically, but they do not yet reveal the richness of the intuitionistic continuum. Only after Brouwer's introduction of choice sequences did intuitionism obtain its particular flavor and became incomparable with classical mathematics.

Choice sequences

Choice sequences were introduced by Brouwer to capture the intuition of the continuum. Since for the intuitionist all infinity is potential, infinite objects can only be grasped via a process that generates them step-by-step. What will be allowed as a legitimate construction therefore decides which infinite objects are to be accepted. For example, in most other forms of constructivism only computable rules for generating such objects are allowed, while in Platonism infinities are considered to be completed totalities whose existence is accepted even in cases when no generating rules are known.

Brouwer's second act of intuitionism gives rise to choice sequences, that provide certain infinite sets with properties that are unacceptable from a classical point of view. A choice sequence is an infinite sequence of numbers (or finite objects) created by the free will. The sequence could be determined by a law or algorithm, such as the sequence consisting of only zeros, or of the prime numbers in increasing order, in which case we speak of a lawlike sequence, or it could not be subject to any law, in which case it is called lawless. Lawless sequences could for example be created by the repeated throw of a coin, or by asking the creating subject to choose the successive numbers of the sequence one by one, allowing it to choose any number to its liking. Thus a lawless sequence is ever unfinished, and the only available information about it at any stage in time is the initial segment of the sequence created thus far. Clearly, by the very nature of lawlessness we can never decide whether its values will coincide with a sequence that is lawlike. Also, the free will is able to create sequences that start out as lawlike, but for which at a certain point the law might be lifted and the process of free choice takes over to generate the succeeding numbers, or vice versa.

According to Brouwer every real number is presented by a choice sequence, and the choice sequences enabled him to capture the intuitionistic continuum via the controversial continuity axioms. Brouwer first spoke of choice sequences in his inaugural address (Brouwer 1912), but at that time he did not yet treat them as a fundamental part of his mathematics. Gradually they became more important and from 1918 on Brouwer started to use them in a way explained in the next section.

3.5 Continuity axioms

The acceptance of the notion of choice sequence has far-reaching implications. It justifies, for the intuitionist, the use of the continuity axioms, from which classically invalid statements can be derived. The weakest of these axioms is the weak continuity axiom:

(WC-N)      ∀α∃n A(α,n) → ∀α∃mn∀β∈α(m) A(β,n),

where n and m range over natural numbers, α and β over choice sequences, and β∈α(m) means that the first m numbers of α and β are equal, and N refers to the natural numbers. Although until now there has never been given a completely satisfactory justification of most continuity axioms for arbitrary choice sequences, not even by Brouwer, when restricted to the class of lawless sequences arguments supporting the validity of the weak continuity axiom run as follows. When could a statement of the form ∀α∃nA(α,n) be established by the intuitionist? By the very nature of the notion of lawless sequence, the choice of the number n for which A(α,n) holds has to be made after only a finite initial segment of α is known. For we do not know how α will proceed in time, and we therefore have to base the choice of n on the initial segment of α that is known at that point in time where we wish to fix n. This implies that for every lawless sequence β with the same initial segment as α, A(β,n) holds as well.

The weak continuity axiom has been shown to be consistent, and is often applied in a form that can be justified, namely in the case in which the predicate A only refers to the values of α, and not to the higher order properties that it possibly possesses. The details of the argument will be omitted here, but it contains the same ingredients as the justification of the principle for lawless sequences, and can be found in van Atten and van Dalen 2002.

Weak continuity does not exhaust the intuitionists' intuition about the continuum, for given the weak continuity axiom, it seems reasonable to assume that the choice of the number m such that ∀β∈α(m) A(β,n), could be made explicit. Thus ∀α∃nA(α,n) implies the existence of a continuous functional Φ that for every α produces the m that fixes the length of α on the basis of which n is chosen. More formally, let CF be the class of continuous functionals Φ that assign natural numbers to infinite sequences, i.e. that satisfy

∀α∃m∀β∈α(m) Φ(α) = Φ(β).

The full axiom of continuity, which is an extension of the weak continuity axiom, can then be expressed as:

(C-N)      ∀α∃n A(α,n) → ∃Φ∈CF∀α A(α,Φ(α)).

There exist stronger forms of continuity that occur in intuitionistic analysis and the theory of lawless sequences.

Through the continuity axiom certain weak counterexamples can be transformed into genuine refutations of classically accepted principles. For example, it implies that the quantified version of the principle of the excluded middle is false:

¬∀α (∀nα(n) = 0 ∨ ¬∀nα(n) = 0).

Here α(n) denotes the n-th element of α. To see that this negations holds, suppose, arguing by contradiction, that ∀α (∀nα(n) = 0 ∨ ¬∀nα(n) = 0) holds. This implies that

∀α∃k ( (∀nα(n) = 0 ∧ k = 0) ∨ (¬∀nα(n) = 0 ∧ k = 1) ).

By the weak continuity axiom, for α consisting of only zeros there exists a number m that fixes the choice of k, which means that for all β∈α(m), k = 0. But the existence of sequences whose first m elements are 0 and that contain a 1 show that this cannot be.

This example showing that the principle of the excluded middle not only does not hold but is in fact false in intuitionism, leads to the refutation of many basic properties of the continuum. Consider for example the real number rα that is the limit of the sequence rα given in the section on weak counterexamples, where the A(m) in the definition is taken to be the statement α(m) = 0. Then the refutation above implies that ¬∀α(rα = 0 ∨ rα ≠ 0), and it thereby refutes the law of trichotomy,

x(x < yx = yy < x).

The following theorem is another example of the way in which the continuity axiom refutes certain classical principles.

Theorem (C-N)
Every total real function is continuous.

Indeed, a classical counterexample to this theorem, the nowhere continuous function

f(x) = { 0 if x is a rational number
1 if x is an irrational number

is not a legitimate function from the intuitionistic point of view since the property of being rational is not decidable on the real numbers. The theorem above implies that the continuum is not decomposable, and in van Dalen 1997, it is shown that this even holds for the set of irrational numbers.

The two examples above are characteristic for the way in which the continuity axioms are applied in intuitionistic mathematics. They are the only axioms in intuitionism that contradict classical reasoning, and thereby represent the most colorful as well as the most controversial part of Brouwer's philosophy.

Neighborhood Functions

There is a convenient representation of continuous functionals that has been used extensively in the literature, though not by Brouwer himself. Continuous functionals that assign numbers to infinite sequences can be represented by neighborhood functions, where a neighborhood function f is a function on the natural numbers satisfying the following two properties (* denotes concatenation and f(α(n)) denotes the value of f on the code of the finite sequence α(n)):

∀α∃n f (α(n)) > 0         ∀nm(f(n) > 0 → f(n*m) = f(n)).

Intuitively, if f represents Φ then f(α(n)) = 0 means that α(n) is not long enough to compute Φ(α), and f(α(n)) = m+1 means that α(n) is long enough to compute Φ(α) and that the value of Φ(α) is m. If K denotes the class of neighborhood functions, then the continuity axiom (C-N) can be rephrased as

∀α∃nA(α, n) → ∃fKm(f(m) > 0 → ∀β∈mA(β, f(m−1))),

where β∈m means that the code of the initial segment of β is m.

3.6 The bar theorem

Brouwer introduced choice sequences and the continuity axioms to capture the intuitionistic continuum, but these principles alone do not suffice to recover that part of traditional analysis that Brouwer considered intuitionistically sound, such as the theorem that every continuous real function on a closed interval is uniformly continuous. For this reason Brouwer proved the so-called bar theorem. It is a classically valid statement, but the proof Brouwer gave is by many considered to be no proof at all since it uses an assumption on the form of proofs for which no rigorous argument is provided. This is the reason that the bar theorem is also referred to as the bar principle.

The most famous consequence of the bar theorem is the fan theorem, which suffices to prove the aforementioned theorem on uniform continuity, and which will be treated first. Both the fan and the bar theorem allow the intuitionist to use induction along certain well-founded sets of objects called spreads. A spread is the intuitionistic analogue of a set, and captures the idea of infinite objects as ever growing and never finished. A spread is essentially a countably branching tree labelled with natural numbers or other finite objects and containing only infinite paths.

A fan is a finitely branching spread, and the fan principle expresses a form of compactness that is classically equivalent to König's lemma, the classical proof of which is unacceptable from the intuitionistic point of view. The principle states that for every fan T in which every branch at some point satisfies a property A, there is a uniform bound on the depth at which this property is met. Such a property is called a bar for T.

(FAN)      ∀α∈T ∃n An) → ∃m∀α∈T ∃nm An).

Here α∈T means that α is a branch of T. FAN suffices to prove the theorem mentioned above:

Theorem (FAN)
Every continuous real function on a closed interval is uniformly continuous.

Brouwer's justification for the fan theorem is his bar principle for the universal spread:

(BID)     [∀α∀n (An) ∨ ¬An)) ∧
∀α∃n An) ∧
∀α∀n (An) → Bn)) ∧
∀α∀n (∀mBn * m) → Bn))] →

Here ε stands for the empty sequence, * for concatenation, BI for Bar Induction, and the subscript ‘D’ refers to the decidability of the predicate A. The bar principle provides intuitionism with an induction principle for trees; it expresses a well-foundedness principle for spreads with respect to decidable properties. Extensions of this principle in which the decidability requirement is weakened can be extracted from Brouwer's work but will be omitted here. Continuity and the bar principle are sometimes captured in one axiom called the bar continuity axiom.

There is a close connection between the bar principle and the neighborhood functions mentioned in the section on continuity axioms. Let IK be the inductively defined class of neighborhood functions, consisting of all constant non-zero sequences λm.n+1, and such that if f(0) = 0 and λm.f(x*m) ∈ IK for all x, then fIK. The statement K = IK, that is, that the neighborhood functions can be generated inductively, is equivalent to BI.

Brouwer's proof of the bar theorem is remarkable in that it uses well-ordering properties of hypothetical proofs. It is based on the assumption that any proof that a property A on sequences is a bar can be decomposed into a canonical proof that is well-ordered. Although it is classically valid, Brouwer's proof of the principle shows that the reason for accepting it as a valid principle in intuitionism differs fundamentally from the argument supporting its acceptability in classical mathematics.

3.7 Choice axioms

The axiom of choice in its full form is unacceptable from a constructive point of view, at least in the presence of certain other central axioms of set theory, such as extensionality (Diaconescu 1975). For let A be a statement that is not known to be true or false. Then membership of the following two sets is undecidable.

X = {x∈{0,1} | x = 0 ∨ (x = 1 ∧ A)}
Y = {x∈{0,1} | x = 1 ∨ (x = 0 ∧ A)}

The existence of a choice function f: {X,Y} → {0,1} choosing an element from X and Y would imply (A ∨ ¬A). For if f(X) ≠ f(Y), it follows that XY, and hence ¬A, whereas f(X) = f(Y) implies A. Therefore a choice function for {X,Y} cannot exist.

There are, however, certain restrictions of the axiom that are acceptable for the intuitionist, for example the axiom of countable choice, also accepted as a legitimate principle by the semi-intuitionists to be discussed below:

(AC-N)      ∀R⊆ N × N (∀mn mRn → ∃α∀m mRα(m) ).

Here N stands for the set of natural numbers. This scheme may be justified as follows. A proof of the premise should provide a method that given m provides a number n such that mRn. Thus the function α on the natural numbers can be constructed step-by-step: first an element m0 is chosen such that 0Rm0, which will be the value of α(0), then an element m1 is chosen such that 1Rm1, which will be the value of α(1), and so on.

Several other choice axioms can be justified in a similar way. Only one more will be mentioned here, the axiom of dependent choice:

(DC-N)      ∀R⊆ N × N (∀mn mRn →∀k∃α ∈ NN (α(0) = k
i ≥ 0 α(i)Rα(i+1))).

Also in classical mathematics the choice axioms are treated with care, and it is often explicitly mentioned how much choice is needed in a proof. Since the axiom of dependent choice is consistent with an important axiom in classical set theory (the axiom of determinacy) while the full axiom of choice is not, special attention is payed to this axiom and in general one tries to reduce the amount of choice in a proof, if choice is present at all, to dependent choice.

3.8 Descriptive set theory, topology, and topos theory

Brouwer was not alone in his doubts concerning certain classical forms of reasoning. This is particularly visible in descriptive set theory, which emerged as a reaction to the highly nonconstructive notions occurring in Cantorian set theory. The founding fathers of the field, including Émile Borel and Henri Lebesgue as two of the main figures, were called semi-intuitionists, and their constructive treatment of the continuum led to the definition of the Borel hierarchy. From their point of view a notion like the set of all sets of real numbers is meaningless, and therefore has to be replaced by a hierarchy of subsets that do have a clear description.

In Veldman 1999, an intuitionistic equivalent of the notion of Borel set is formulated, and it is shown that classically equivalent definitions of the Borel sets give rise to a variety of intuitionistically distinct classes, a situation that often occurs in intuitionism. For the intuitionistic Borel sets an analogue of the Borel Hierarchy Theorem is intuitionistically valid. The proof of this fact makes essential use of the continuity axioms discussed above and thereby shows how classical mathematics can guide the search for intuitionistic analogues that, however, have to be proved in a completely different way, sometimes using principles unacceptable from a classical point of view.

Another approach to the study of subsets of the continuum, or of a topological space in general, has appeared through the development of formal or abstract topology (Fourman 1982, Martin-Löf 1970, Sambin 1987). In this constructive topology the role of open sets and points is reversed; in classical topology an open set is defined as a certain set of points, in the constructive case open sets are the fundamental notion and points are defined in terms of them. Therefore this approach is sometimes referred to as point-free topology.

Intuitionistic functional analysis has been developed far and wide by many after Brouwer, but since most approaches are not strictly intuitionistic but also constructive in the wider sense, this research will not be addressed any further here.

4. Constructivism

Intuitionism shares a core part with most other forms of constructivism. Constructivism in general is concerned with constructive mathematical objects and reasoning. From constructive proofs one can, at least in principle, extract algorithms that compute the elements and simulate the constructions whose existence is established in the proof. Most forms of constructivism are compatible with classical mathematics, as they are in general based on a stricter interpretation of the quantifiers and the connectives and the constructions that are allowed, while no additional assumptions are made. The logic accepted by almost all constructive communities is the same, namely intuitionistic logic.

Many existential theorems in classical mathematics have a constructive analogue in which the existential statement is replaced by a statement about approximations. We saw an example of this, the intermediate value theorem, in the section on weak counterexamples above. Large parts of mathematics can be recovered constructively in a similar way. The reason not to treat them any further here is that the focus in this entry is on those aspects of intuitionism that set it apart from other constructive branches of mathematics. For a thorough treatment of constructivism the reader is referred to the corresponding entry in this encyclopedia.

5. Meta-mathematics

Although Brouwer developed his mathematics in a precise and fundamental way, formalization in the sense as we know it today was only carried out later by others. Indeed, according to Brouwer's view that mathematics unfolds itself internally, formalization, although not unacceptable, is unnecessary. Others after him thought otherwise, and the formalization of intuitionistic mathematics and the study of its meta-mathematical properties, in particular of arithmetic and analysis, have attracted many researchers. The formalization of intuitionistic logic on which all formalizations are based has already been treated above.

5.1 Arithmetic

Heyting Arithmetic HA as formulated by Arend Heyting is a formalization of the intuitionistic theory of the natural numbers (Heyting 1956). It has the same non-logical axioms as Peano Arithmetic PA but it is based on intuitionistic logic. Thus it is a restriction of classical arithmetic, and it is the accepted theory of the natural numbers in almost all areas of constructive mathematics. Heyting Arithmetic has many properties that reflect its constructive character, for example the Disjunction Property that holds for intuitionistic logic too. Another property of HA that PA does not share is the numerical existence property:

(NEP)      HA⊢∃xA(x) ⇒ ∃n∈N   HAA(n).

That this property does not hold in PA follows from the fact that PA proves ∃x (A(x) ∨ ∀x¬A(x)). Consider, for example, the case that A(x) is the formula T(e,e,x), where T is the decidable Kleene predicate expressing that x codes a terminating computation of the program with code e on input e. If for every x there would exist a number n such that PAT(e,e,n) ∨ ∀x¬T(e,e,x), then by checking whether T(e,e,n) holds it would be decided whether a program e terminates on input e. This, however, is in general undecidable.

Markov's rule

(MR)      HA⊢∀x(A(x) ∨ ¬A(x)) ∧ ¬¬∃xA(x) ⇒ HA⊢∃xA(x)

is a principle that holds both classically and intuitionistically, but only for HA the proof of this fact is nontrivial. Since HA proves the law of the excluded middle for every primitive recursive predicate, it follows that for such A the derivability of ¬¬∃xA(x) in HA implies the derivability of ∃xA(x) as well. From this it follows that PA is Π02-conservative over HA, that is, for primitive recursive A,

PA⊢∀xy(A(x,y) ⇒ HA⊢∀xy(A(x,y).
Thus the class of provably recursive functions of HA coincides with the class of provably recursive functions of PA, a property that, on the basis of the ideas underlying constructivism and intuitionism, may not come as a surprise.

5.2 Analysis

The formalization of intuitionistic mathematics covers more than arithmetic. Large parts of analysis have been axiomatized from a constructive point of view (Kleene 1965, Troelstra 1973). The constructivity of these systems can be established using functional, type theoretic, or realizability interpretations, most of them based on or extensions of Gödel's Dialectica interpretation (Gödel 1958, Kreisel 1959), Kleene realizability (Kleene 1965), or type theories (Martin-Löf 1984). In these interpretations the functionals underlying constructive statements, such as for example the function assigning a y to every x in ∀xy(A(x,y), are made explicit in various ways.

In Scott 1968 and 1970, a topological model for the second-order intuitionistic theory of analysis is presented where the reals are interpreted as continuous functions from Baire space into the classical reals. In this model Kripke's schema as well as certain continuity axioms hold. In Moschovakis 1973, this method is adapted to construct a model of theories of intuitionistic analysis in terms of choice sequences. Also in this model Kripke's schema and certain continuity axioms hold. In Van Dalen 1978 Beth models are used to provide a model of arithmetic and choice sequences that satisfy choice schemata, instances of weak continuity and Kripke's schema. In this model the domains at every node are the natural numbers, so that one does not have to use nonstandard models, as in the case of Kripke models. Moreover, the axioms CS1–3 of the creating subject can be interpreted in it, thus showing this theory to be consistent.

5.3 Lawless sequences

There exist axiomatizations of the lawless sequences, and they all contain extensions of the continuity axioms (Kreisel 1968, Troelstra 1977), in particular in the form of the Axiom of Open Data: for A(α) not containing other nonlawlike parameters besides α,

A(α) → ∃n∀β ∈α(n) A(β).

In Troelstra 1977, a theory of lawless sequences is developed (and justified) in the context of intuitionistic analysis. Besides axioms for elementary analysis it contains, for lawless sequences, strengthened forms of the axioms of open data, continuity, decidability and density (density says that every finite sequence is the initial segment of a lawless sequence). What is especially interesting is that in these theories quantifiers over lawless sequences can be eliminated, a result that can also be viewed as providing a model of lawlike sequences for such theories. Other classical models of the theory of lawless sequences have been constructed in category theory in the form of sheaf models (van der Hoeven and Moerdijk 1984). In Moschovakis 1986, a theory for choice sequences relative to a certain set of lawlike elements is introduced, along with a classical model in which the lawless sequences turn out to be exactly the generic ones.

5.4 Foundations

Formalizations that are meant to serve as a foundation for constructive mathematics are either of a set-theoretic (Aczel 1978, Myhill 1975) or type-theoretic (Martin-Löf 1984) nature. The former theories are adaptations of Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory to a constructive setting, while in type theory the constructions implicit in constructive statements are made explicit in the system. Set theory could be viewed as an extensional foundation of mathematics whereas type theory is in general an intensional one.

In recent years many models of parts of such foundational theories for intuitionistic mathematics have appeared, some of them have been mentioned above. Especially in topos theory (van Oosten 2008) there are many models that capture certain characteristics of intuitionism. There are, for example, topoi in which all total real functions are continuous. Functional interpretations such as realizability as well as interpretations in type theory could also be viewed as models of intuitionistic mathematics and most other constructive theories.

5.5 Reverse mathematics

In reverse mathematics one tries to establish for mathematical theorems which axioms are needed to prove them. In intuitionsistic reverse mathematics one has a similar aim, but then with respect to intuitionistic theorems: working over a weak intuitionistic theory, axioms and theorems are compared to each other. The typical axioms with which one wishes theorems to compare are the fan principle and the bar principle, Kripke's schema and the continuity axioms.

In Veldman 2011, equivalents of the fan principle over a basic theory called Basic Intuitionistic Mathematics are studied. It is shown that the fan principle is equivalent to the statement that the unit interval [0,1] has the Heine-Borel property, and from this many other equivalents are derived. In Veldman 2009, the fan principle is shown to also be equivalent to Brouwer's Approximate Fixed-Point Theorem. In Lubarsky et al. 2012, reverse mathematics is applied to a form of Kripke's schema, which is shown to be equivalent to certain topological statements.

There are many more of such examples from intuitionsistic reverse mathematics. Especially in the larger field of constructive reverse mathematics there are many results of this nature that are also relevant from the intuitionistic point of view.


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Brouwer, Luitzen Egbertus Jan | category theory | choice, axiom of | Gödel, Kurt | Hilbert, David | Hilbert, David: program in the foundations of mathematics | logic, history of: intuitionistic logic | logic: classical | logic: intuitionistic | mathematics, philosophy of: formalism | mathematics: constructive | phenomenology | Platonism: in metaphysics | set theory | type theory


I thank Sebastiaan Terwijn, Mark van Atten, and an anonymous referee for their useful comments on an earlier draft of this entry.