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François Poulain de la Barre

First published Tue Mar 26, 2013

Poulain published a radical and philosophically sophisticated defence of the equality of women and men in 1673. This publication coincided with significant changes in his religious beliefs, his philosophical sympathies, and even his geographical location, in the course of which a scholastically educated Catholic priest in France became a married Calvinist Cartesian in Geneva.

1. Life and Works

Poulain (sometimes spelled Poullain) was born in Paris in 1647 and followed a traditional scholastic curriculum in college. He graduated a master of arts in 1663 and, three years later, he completed theology studies at the Sorbonne. He later complained that his studies prepared him merely to speak in Latin about matters that he did not understand (2011: 281).[1] Poulain's biography between 1666 and 1679 is known only indirectly and is supported by relatively little documentary evidence. In 1667 he was introduced to Cartesianism by a friend who invited him to a Cartesian conference on physiology, and he subsequently deployed many of the critiques of scholastic philosophy that were then current among Cartesians in Paris (such as Jacques Rohault, Louis de la Forge, and Géraud de Cordemoy). He taught literature during this period, as a result of which he published a translation manual in 1672. Poulain then published his feminist books in three successive years: De l'Égalité des Deux Sexes: Discours physique et moral où l'on voit l'importance de se défaire des préjugés [A Physical and Moral Discourse on the Equality of both Sexes, which shows that it is important to rid oneself of Prejudices] (1673); De l'éducation des dames pour la conduite de l'esprit, dans les sciences et dans les moeurs: Entretiens [Conversations about the Education of Ladies, to guide the mind in the sciences and in morals] (1674), and De l'excellence des hommes, contre l'égalité des sexes [The Excellence of Men, against the Equality of the Sexes] (1675). Although the title of the final book might suggest a change of mind on the author's part, it was in fact a reply to some of the standard arguments against gender equality.

It seems odd in retrospect that, having adopted many ideas from Cartesian philosophy—at a time when Cartesianism was censored by French universities and condemned by the Catholic Church—and having published three radically feminist treatises, Poulain was ordained a Catholic priest in 1679 and served subsequently as a curate in two small parishes in Picardie (northern France), La Flamengrie and Versigny. He remained a priest until 1688, when he abandoned his priestly ministry and returned briefly to Paris. By the end of that year, he had converted to Calvinism and moved to Geneva, where he married Marie Ravier in 1690. He earned a living initially by teaching French to the citizens of Geneva, for whose benefit he published a small guide to the correct pronunciation of French: Essai des remarques particulieres sur la langue françoise, pour la ville de Geneve [An Essay of detailed comments about the French language, for the city of Geneva] (1691). He found a more secure teaching post in a local college in 1708, and published a theological commentary on the interpretation of the Bible and the Eucharist in 1720 under the title La Doctrine des protestans sur la liberté de lire l'Ecriture Sainte, etc. [Protestant Teaching about Freedom to Read the Holy Scriptures, etc.]. He died in Geneva in 1723.

Poulain's works were re-issued in French editions during the following fifteen years (Alcover: 30), although his name did not appear on the title page of Égalité until 1690. Nonetheless, his ideas were generally ignored in France for three centuries; even Gabrielle Suchon (1700) referred to him, anonymously, as the author of Égalité while she borrowed liberally from his work. In the early twentieth century there appeared a number of brief studies of Poulain's thesis about equality, perhaps reflecting contemporary discussions of the role of women in society and the emerging debate about women's right to vote, and Simone de Beauvoir provided a minimal acknowledgement of his significance by quoting one sentence from Égalité as an epigraph in Le deuxième sexe (1949).

In contrast with its reception in France, Poulain's Equality had a significant influence in England following its translation in 1677 as The Woman as Good as the Man. Poulain's ideas and even the phrases in which they were expressed were plagiarized initially by an anonymous ‘Sophia’ in Woman Not Inferior to Man (1739), which appeared in an expanded edition as Beauty's Triumph (1751). Equality was also pirated in a loose translation by an anonymous ‘Lady’ as Female Rights Vindicated (1758); this was republished in two revised editions as Female Restoration (1780), and Female Rights Vindicated (1833). Thus Poulain's primary text about the equality of the sexes continued to influence discussion of that topic, in English, throughout the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, although its author's name had lapsed into oblivion and was not acknowledged by those who plagiarized his work.

2. Feminist Philosophy

Most of those who discussed the natural abilities of women and their appropriate status in civil society or the churches, in the early modern period, appealed to two authorities: the Bible, and writings of authoritative authors (including ancient philosophers). One guiding principle of Poulain's thesis was his rejection of all such authorities (including revelation), and his reliance on reason or experience alone to decide questions about sexual equality (2011: 145). He was not unique in the appeal to reason; Christine de Pizan had similarly invoked ‘Lady Reason’ (de Pizan, 1999: 13), but Poulain's reason was arguably more independent of ancient authorities in its deliberations. His second epistemological contribution was to identify custom or tradition, as a social reality, as one of the main sources of beliefs that were generally held about women. Thirdly, he suggested that self-interest on the part of men was a significant contributing factor to men's beliefs about women. ‘Thus, everything men said about women should be suspect, because they are both judges and litigants’ [2011: 93].

Poulain borrowed from Cartesians of the 1670s the idea that many common beliefs are ‘prejudices’, i.e., ‘judgements made about things without having examined them’ (2011: 53). He also shared Descartes' objections to scholastic styles of explanation, in which a distinct ‘form’ was postulated to ‘explain’ every natural phenomenon, such as the ‘dormitive power’ of sleeping pills. Poulain applied both reservations to scholastic explanations of women's alleged inferiority and asked: (1) was it factually true, or a mere prejudice, that women's natural abilities were inferior to those of men? (2) whatever answer is given to (1), could the reality of women's status in society be explained by reference to women's nature?

Opponents of equality assumed a factual thesis about the alleged lack of natural ability on the part of women. In response to this, Poulain argued that there was no evidence to show that, apart from bodily functions associated with procreation, women's bodies are different to those of men in any way that was relevant to the offices and functions in society from which they were excluded. Secondly, the tradition on which most philosophers and Christian theologians in the early modern period relied concluded that ‘the mind has no sex’ [2011: 99], and that there was therefore no difference between the minds of men and women. That suggested that, in principle, women were mentally and bodily as capable as men of exercising all the leadership positions from which they had been traditionally excluded, including those of professors, judges, and even ecclesiastical offices reserved for men.

In relation to (2), Poulain also rejected the assumption that one could explain the alleged inferiority of women by reference to their nature. He borrowed from Descartes the claim that we do not know natures directly; we know them only indirectly, by means of the properties that are predicated of them. Therefore one makes no explanatory progress by talking about the nature of something, about which nothing is known apart from the very properties for which one seeks an explanation. He commented about lawyers that ‘they would be hard pressed to explain intelligibly what they mean by “nature” in this context, and to explain how nature distinguishes the two sexes’ (2011: 94–5).

At the same time, it was an acknowledged fact that most women (and most men) in the seventeenth century were unable to read or write, and were inadequately trained for the exercise of public offices. It was a fallacy, however, to conclude that they were not capable of acquiring the relevant skills. Since ‘nature’ was a pseudo-explanation of women's lack of achievement, Poulain required some other explanation. He offered instead an historical hypothesis to explain how, over many generations, women were reduced to the inferior roles to which they had become accustomed. This history of subjection was compounded by women's exclusion from education, so that opponents of equality could then argue that women lacked the training or education required to exercise the same roles in society as men. And since women were generally unfit for those offices, the argument was made that they did not need access to an education if they were excluded from the offices for which education was a necessary condition.

The circularity of this was made explicit in the summary statement by ‘Sophia’, who had borrowed many of Poulain's arguments: ‘Why is learning useless to us? Because we have no share in public offices. And why have we no share in public offices? Because we have no learning’ [1739: 27]. In contrast, Poulain drew the conclusion that women should be allowed access to exactly the same educational opportunities as men and should then be allowed compete equally for all civil and ecclesiastical offices. The equality or otherwise of men and women could be tested only by implementing such a long-term social experiment.

Opponents of equality assumed, not only the alleged fact of women's inferiority and its related ‘natural’ explanation; they also assumed that the status of women in society was not unjust. The argument was taken for granted that, if some situation was long established by custom, it must be justified. Poulain claimed, in reply, that this was based on a false concept of custom: ‘if some practice is well established, then we think that it must be right’ (2011: 62). The invalidity of the inference, from the fact that some custom is established to the conclusion that it is justified, inspired the anonymous ‘Sophia’ to formulate a version of the ‘Is-Ought’ problem one year before Hume published A Treatise of Human Nature (Book III).

It is enough for the Men to find a thing establish'd to make them believe it well grounded. In all countries we are seen in subjection and absolute dependence on the Men, without being admitted to the advantages of sciences, or the opportunity of exerting our capacity in a public station. Hence the Men, according to their usual talent of arguing from seemings, conclude that we ought to be so. But supposing it to be true, that Women had ever been excluded from public offices, is it therefore necessarily true that they ought to be so? God has always been more or less resisted by ungrateful man, a fine conclusion it wou'd be then to infer, that therefore he ought to be so. (Woman Not Inferior to Man, 35)

The 1651 revised edition of the same text describes this invalid inference as a ‘paralogism’ (p. 36).

Poulain changed the focus of the debate about women in the seventeenth century from appealing to authorities to examining the question from the perspective of reason and empirical evidence. He challenged the factual claims on which opponents of sexual equality relied, rejected the value of appealing to women's nature as if it were something that could be known independently of the properties that were predicated of it, and rejected as invalid any inference from established customs (as mere facts) to a moral or political justification of women's status. Given his intellectual debts, Poulain may be described as the first Cartesian feminist.


Poulain's Works

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