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Richard FitzRalph

First published Mon Jul 8, 2013

Richard FitzRalph (1299–1360) was regarded during his lifetime as one of the leading thinkers at Oxford. Although his later fame was mainly due to his polemical writings, especially regarding the poverty question, he was acknowledged as a significant interlocutor by thinkers such as Holcot, Wodeham, Wyclif and Gregory of Rimini among others. He was particularly well-regarded for the careful formulation of his arguments on matters such as infinity, future contingents and the relation of the will to the intellect. His was the first book by an Irishman to be printed (as an incunabulum) and consequently his theory of dominion was still being discussed in the sixteenth century.

1. Life

Richard FitzRalph was born in Dundalk around 1299. Although not a member of the Gaelic race, he was referred to by his Oxford contemporaries as “Hibernicus,” as was the Anglo-Norman Peter of Ireland (Petrus de Hibernia, ca. 1200–1265) a generation before. Around the age of 15, he went to Oxford (there was no university in Ireland before the reign of Elizabeth I) where he was a fellow of Balliol College, and where he gained his MA. He later went to University College (then University Hall), where he graduated with a doctorate in theology in 1331. He became chancellor of the University of Oxford in 1332, embarking thereafter on a successful ecclesiastical career both in England and in Ireland. On his first visit to Avignon, only five years after concluding his lectures on the Sentences, FitzRalph was consulted as one of the eighteen leading theologians of Europe by Pope Benedict XII to correct the views of his predecessor, John XXII, on the beatific vision. He became archbishop of Armagh in 1347. He is perhaps best known for his opposition to the mendicant orders on the question of evangelical poverty and his defense of the rights of the secular clergy against the friars. It was while pursuing his suit against the mendicants that he died at Avignon in 1360. In the company of Ockham, Bradwardine, and Wodeham, FitzRalph became one of the four most frequently cited insular theologians in the fourteenth century.

2. Writings

FitzRalph was a prolific author and most of the works from his mature period are of a theological or pastoral nature, or, indeed, polemical writings concerned with the anti-mendicant controversy. And whereas some topics are dealt with such as future contingents (in the Summa de Quaestionibus Armenorum) or the question of dominium, it is to his earlier work, the Lectura on the Sentences, dating from 1328–29, that we must look to for philosophical themes. FitzRalph was also the author of a (now lost) Commentary on the Physics which brought him into conflict with Richard Kilvington. Furthermore, some logical works once attributed to FitzRalph are now to be attributed to another Armachanus, John Foxhalls (Johannes Anglicus) (Dunne 2013b). The most extensive treatment to date of FitzRalph's thought as presented in the Lectura is that by Gordon Leff (1963). Leff's book gives a good overview of FitzRalph's thought and is generous with quotations from the text itself. What emerges from Leff's examination is that a good deal of FitzRalph's Lectura was not concerned with theology at all, or at least only tangentially so. For example, when dealing with the theological problem of the creation of the world, the discussion focuses on topics (such as the eternity of the world) that FitzRalph had already dealt with in his commentary on the Physics.

3. Position in the History of Philosophy

Although many hold that FitzRalph later turned away from scholasticism (Leff 1963: 175), this point has been refuted by W. Duba (Duba 2013: 104). FitzRalph's lectures on the Sentences have turned out to be of greater importance than might have at first been realized by some authors such as Leff. Leff saw FitzRalph's approach as being heavily influenced by the neo-Augustinian movement deriving ultimately from Henry of Ghent. Leff's summation of FitzRalph is rather negative, holding that FitzRalph shows an unwillingness to be deeply involved in the controversies of his time, and that he was content to “restate what his contemporaries re-formulated” (Leff 1963: 175). This assessment, however, leaves one wondering what there was about FitzRalph's ideas that his contemporaries such as Holcot and Wodeham, and later, Gregory of Rimini, found so challenging. In fact, contrary to Leff's assessment FitzRalph was one of the leading protagonists of the Oxford of his day and at a time when Oxford briefly eclipsed the University of Paris in importance.

In philosophical matters FitzRalph generally follows Aristotle, but an Aristotle who is constantly read through the lens of his Commentator. Averroës is taken by FitzRalph to be the authentic interpreter of Aristotle despite the condemnations of the 1270s, but in so doing FitzRalph is not an Averroist (as some surmised) but is merely following the accepted practice of the times. For example, he is not, as one would expect, Averroistic in accepting the doctrine of a single soul and indeed doubts whether it is truly Averroës's teaching. Aquinas, when mentioned, is treated with respect and FitzRalph follows him on a number of important points. Perhaps owing to a certain national loyalty, Anselm receives significant (though not uncritical) attention. Again, as one might expect, Augustine is the guide in theological matters, but FitzRalph does not content himself to give references to Augustine's works. In fact, he tends to provide long quotations from Augustine, indicating a close personal reading. Contemporaries are not named (contrary to the practice of Wodeham or Holcot a few years later), and their contributions have to be identified (as does indeed FitzRalph's own positions) in the course of his presentation of each topic in the text which usually involves an examination of the answers given by Aquinas, Henry of Ghent and Duns Scotus. FitzRalph would have perhaps felt closest in spirit to (though not always agreeing with) the neo-Augustinianism of Henry of Ghent; in method and approach, however, he seems closest to Duns Scotus. However, the techniques he employs are something he holds in common with his contemporaries, and it was these, it seems, together with the high quality of his arguments which appealed to other writers.

There is little or no evidence of radicalism in FitzRalph's early writings such as Lectura which would anticipate the polemical Armachanus attacking the privileges of the mendicant orders at the papal court at Avignon in the 1350s. The later FitzRalph was a socially conscious prelate who reprimanded his Anglo-Irish audience in his sermons regarding their unjust treatment of the Gaelic Irish population. It was in this context that he developed his teaching on dominium, a doctrine which would have long-term implications through his influence on Wyclif (Lahey 2003) or indeed in its rejection by later authors such as De Vittoria (Dunne 2004: 243–58).

4. Natural Philosophy

FitzRalph's views on motion, time, and infinity were the topics upon which his near contemporaries, especially Wodeham and Holcot, most frequently quoted him (Dunne 2008). Wodeham changed many of his opinions in the light of FitzRalph's, especially regarding infinity. In Book III of his Oxford Lectura, Wodeham followed FitzRalph word for word on the issue, thereby rejecting the very position he had himself defended in Book I. Again, Gregory of Rimini recognized FitzRalph as the source for the common view of infinity held at Oxford by Holcot and Wodeham, and he repeated FitzRalph's arguments, albeit in order to reject this position (Courtenay 1987: 76–8.)

FitzRalph deals with these topics in the Lectura Book II, qu. 1: Whether God at the beginning of time created the world from nothing.. One of the more striking features of the text is its predominantly philosophical flavor and its comparative lack of theological material. The principal question is devoted to the general problem of the eternity of the world. FitzRalph begins by putting forward arguments against the beginning of the world in time. One goes as follows: if God's power is always the same, then it was the same before the world was created; therefore, God could always from eternity have produced the world. Thus, there is no contradiction in stating that the world has always existed. FitzRalph attributes this position to the Commentary on the Sentences of Thomas Aquinas. Indeed, he continues that, even if the world is not from eternity, we can argue that in the future God might make it so, since what he once can do, he can always do. In other words, it remains part of God's power to make a universe that has always existed, just as it remains possible for God to destroy this universe, or again, to create other universes that have always existed.

Another argument among the many put forward is that if some contradiction can be found in the notion of a world existing from eternity, then this should be shown through the use of reason. If it were possible to show that the world and time began at a certain instant, then the philosophers of the past would have proven it. FitzRalph quotes Aristotle as saying, in the first book of the Topics, that either position is possible and can be argued for, but neither position can be shown to be conclusive. Thus, FitzRalph concludes that the creation of the world ex nihilo et de tempore can be taken only as an article of faith; indeed, if this were not the case, then there would be no merit in believing in the creation of the world.

When dealing with the associated question of the infinity of the number of souls FitzRalph discusses the nature of the infinite. He comments that the eternity of the world does not necessarily imply an infinity of souls, since the first man could have been made at a certain time and so have a finite number of descendants. Again, through reincarnation a finite number of souls could be continually reborn throughout a perpetual time. FitzRalph continues by pointing out that some people say that an infinity of souls is in no way impossible, or, at least, does not involve a contradiction, since God can make an actual infinite number of souls, angels, or beings at once, or he can do so successively, so that an actual infinite will exist at some future time, even given that the world began at a certain point.

Again, in every body there is an infinite number of proportional parts (partes proportionales: the terminology is Chatton's, and the source for the treatment that follows is probably the De indivisibilibus of Wodeham) that are completely distinct one from another (totaliter diverse). Thus, God can make something exist at once which is actually infinite, and the same is as true of souls or angels as it is of bodies. That there is an infinite number of proportional parts in a body is considered by FitzRalph to have been shown by Aristotle in Book III of the Physics and in Averroës's commentary, since every continuum is composed of an infinite number of proportional parts, each of which is distinct from the other. FitzRalph holds that it can be argued that in any line there is an infinite number of points, that there is an infinite number of lines in any surface, and an infinite number of surfaces in every body, and yet each is distinct from the other.

FitzRalph continues his argument by stating that if there is an actual infinity within bodies, that is to say, if they can actually be divided to infinity, then it is clear that it is possible for God to make an infinite number of other things. Thus, there is no contradiction in there being an infinite number of human souls. Nor is there any problem with God's not knowing which is first and which is last in an infinite series; this is not because of any ignorance on God's part but because, quite simply, there is no first and last. In the end he refers his audience back to his discussion of the topic in his commentary on the Physics, now lost.

Finally, FitzRalph makes an interesting distinction between philosophy and theology. In the ninth argument, where Anselm's assertion (in the Monologion, chap. 22) that time is composed of parts is addressed, FitzRalph begins by stating that he is concerned here with Anselm's standing (auctoritas) as a natural philosopher and not as a theologian. In fact, FitzRalph goes further: “here we must follow reason more than the standing (auctoritas) of any theologian.”

5. Psychology and Cognition

5.1 Mind as a trinity of intellect, memory and will

In his Lectura, FitzRalph holds that memory, understanding and willing are expressions of the essence of the soul, and whereas each expresses something of the soul they cannot be said of each other and as such are distinct (Dunne 2012: 443–50). Memory understanding and willing are to be found in the soul's complete nature but the soul is not to be found completely in any one of them. As regards the relationship between willing and understanding, Wodeham will later specifically oppose FitzRalph for treating them as distinct. FitzRalph, on the other hand, opposed Aquinas for regarding memory and understanding as the same. For FitzRalph, memory, understanding and willing are not the same (which was the position of Scotus and that adopted by Chatton against Ockham), neither are they really distinct but are distinguished inasmuch as the soul expresses itself differently through these powers. Finally, for FitzRalph actual knowledge is really distinct from the species in memory, i.e., there is a real distinction between the powers.

The topic was a traditional one but FitzRalph's treatment shows how such a tradition was capable of renewal in the light of contemporary developments such as the debate regarding the distinction between the mind and its powers and that between the powers itself, as well as the species in memoria.

5.2 Species theory

In the Lectura Book II, q. 1, a. 2, Whether motion and time are really distinct, FitzRalph makes a digression while defending the species in medio theory and refers to a respected person (valens) who had argued against the theory. He also tells us that he himself once shared a similar opinion and gives the reason why.

It seems to me that if those people are not aware that the species in their eyes are just like the sounds in their ears, then they will not believe that such things [as species] exist but will say that sight is seeing and that hearing is hearing and that illuminated air is light – and I once heard a very respected person (valens) say exactly this. Others say that every colour is light, and that every taste is a mixture of the prime qualities, and that every smell is taste – as indeed I believed once, holding that nothing existed except the five prime qualities, namely the four elemental qualities and light … .

The valens in question could well be Ockham, since FitzRalph was old enough to have heard him speak before the former left Oxford in 1324 (Maier 1959: 16). (Maier also discusses Fitzralph's text in the context of the later debate regarding primary and secondary qualities). Nor was FitzRalph alone in defending the theory of the species in medio: “Ockham's attack on the species elicited an almost immediate and prolonged negative response.” (Tachau 1982: 395). Ockham's position was criticized by John of Reading and also by Walter Chatton, Robert Holcot, William Crathorn, and Wodeham. Thus, FitzRalph found himself in the company of many who would normally be seen as close to the position of Ockham. As Tachau concludes (1982: 443), “in epistemology at any rate, there seems at Oxford to have been no school of Ockhamistae.”

However, with FitzRalph's treatment of the topic there seems to be a shift from a concern with the species in medio to the species in memoria and this seems to have influenced the manner of the treatment of the topic by Holcot and especially that of Crathorn who devotes much of his treatment to an analysis of FitzRalph's arguments (Dunne 2012; both Holcot and Crathorn lectured on the Sentences in the years 1330–32 around the time when FitzRalph was magister regens).

5.3 The will and its relation to the intellect

Tachau (2013: 82) writes that on Leff's interpretation, FitzRalph reached for a moderate if not mediocre position, rejecting both Aquinas's “doctrine” of the intellect's superiority and Scotus's decision in favor of the will's “primacy,” instead “contrapos[ing] his own opinio media”(Leff 1963: 97). On the issue of which of the two mental faculties, will or intellect, is superior, Scotus's “view of the will as a power superior to the intellect … appealed to FitzRalph personally,” in Walsh's judgment, but he deemed Aquinas's support for the opposite ranking “more authoritative.” Walsh gained the impression that FitzRalph's position was somehow untenable, so much so that “Wodeham took him to task for trying to have things both ways” (Walsh 1981: 60).

Tachau (2013: 85) points out that what Wodeham actually says is that “the will truly is not nobler than the intellect nor vice versa, and note that Fitzralph holds the same”. FitzRalph recognized that the various distinctions (real, formal, intentional, or of reason) that previous scholastic generations had drawn among the intellective and sensitive substances of the soul, or its “faculties,” or the faculties' diverse acts and habits, were problematic; yet, he also pointed to significant philosophical and theological impediments that would arise from denying all distinctions, obstacles that neither he nor his contemporaries had entirely satisfactory means of eluding (Tachau 2013: 92). So if there were no distinction whatsoever between the intellectual soul's faculties of will and intellect, then presumably a cognition of any given object, as an act of the intellect, would be identical to the will's volition regarding the same object. To accept this conclusion, however, would introduce numerous complications into any theory of whether and how God reveals future contingents, and lead to untenable consequences (Tachau 2013: 93).

6. Philosophical Theology

6.1 Proving God's existence

The first question of Book I of the Lectura, is “Whether the wayfarer can know that God exists by means of philosophical proof,” and a number of arguments are presented, six against and six for. He tells us how he will deal with the problem: firstly, he will deal with the question as to whether the existence of God as such can be known and then, secondly, whether one can have both faith and knowledge of the same thing at the same time. Then, thirdly, he will examine the various authorities. This is the basic structure followed in the rest of the Lectura, even if FitzRalph did not always reorganize his material fully in this manner, since sometimes individual articles remain on their own or questions are left unresolved. FitzRalph quotes the views of Henry of Ghent on demonstrating the existence of God, but he accepts the position of Aquinas. Again, regarding whether God's existence is evident or not, he follows Aquinas. There then follows a long and elaborate treatment of the ontological argument.

6.2 Divine omnipotence

Leff judged that it was Ockham and his followers who pushed the consequences of the discontinuity between faith and reason to often irreverent conclusions in the debate on the potentia Dei. Thus, thinkers such as Robert Holcot and Adam of Wodeham seem to show a sheer fascination with the paradoxes open to God in his absolute power, a fascination that led them to positions which were hardly in keeping with traditional Christian teaching. FitzRalph opposes such views by appealing to the Augustinian tradition. God's potentia absoluta merely refers to God's ability to act outside the present dispensation. Furthermore, God's omnipotence entails His inability to sin and to deceive, just as it also excludes his dying. In other words, what God cannot do is to act against his own nature: God cannot be other than the summum bonum. God's power does not consist simply and solely of doing anything whatsoever; his limit is not just his freedom from contradicting himself, as others held—rather it is his own nature. Since God is most good, most merciful, and most just, his omnipotence must be in accordance with these aspects of his nature. For God to act otherwise would not be a sign of omnipotence but of impotence, since it would involve a denial or negation of his own nature. Thus, what is possible from the point of view of omnipotence taken in itself, is impossible from the point of view of God's goodness, mercy, and justice, and thus impossible not by reason of his power (ratione potentie) but by reason of his justice or goodness (ratione iustitie vel bonitatis).

6.3 Divine Foreknowledge and future contingents

One of the topics which exercised the minds of FitzRalph and his contemporaries was the topic of the revelation of future contingents. Indeed, FitzRalph discussed it on three separate occasions. His first treatment occurs in the Sentences commentary, where he considers the matter so important that he promises his audience he will return to it He kept this promise a few months later when he gave his Quaestio biblica and before he left for Paris in October, 1329 (Genest 1991) . Again, he returned to the problem in his Summa de quaestionibus Armenorum, where the matter is treated in a dialogue form.

The specific way in which FitzRalph addresses the problem is in terms of the revelation of future contingents. Given that future contingents have a determinate truth—namely, that they will happen and cannot not happen—how can their truth, as known by God, be revealed by him to a created intellect without their losing their contingency? As Leff points out, the problem as set out by his contemporaries was whether God's knowledge of the future was different from that of the present and the past (Leff 1963: 40). According to Wodeham, Buckingham, and Holcot, God's knowledge about the future must be related to the contingency of the future, and, therefore, this knowledge is of a different kind from God's knowledge of the past and present. FitzRalph accepts the distinction, seeking to defend his position as being consonant with Augustine in the 83 Questions and De Trinitate. It was, in fact, a position rejected by Bradwardine and Gregory of Rimini.

From the sources which we have FitzRalph is the first to devote an entire question to the problem of the revelation of future contingents and that it is no less remarkable that it is six times the length of his question on divine foreknowledge (Genest 1991: 240). Again, FitzRalph's treatment of the topic marks a turning point in the history of the problem, as is clear from comparing it what Ockham had written on the topic just before 1324 (in his Quodlibet IV, qu. 4). Whereas Ockham dealt with the problem in 800 words, FitzRalph—in a sign of the growing complexity of the problem—writes 20,000 words on the matter. While Ockham sought to remove all necessity from the proposition, “This was revealed”, by seeking to disassociate it from any temporal implication on God's part, FitzRalph, without contesting this thesis (then nearly universally accepted), has to resolve a series of difficulties that this thesis leaves open. Against the possibility of a revelation of the future, FitzRalph lists fourteen arguments, which Genest examines in some detail. One of the central themes that emerge is a disjunction between the certitude of revelation and the conditions of acting for a creature, conditions which presuppose that in order to be free, there must be a certain ignorance of the future on the part of the creature. To take but one example: if God reveals to a just man that he will be damned, should he pray for his salvation? FitzRalph makes a distinction between a prophesy through which people are deceived, on the one hand, and lying on the other; thus a person may be deceived by the prophesy and yet God did not lie to them.

For FitzRalph God is good and does not act arbitrarily or irrationally. The revelation of free actions is contingent so that, if God should reveal to someone that he will be ultimately damned, this cannot relate to the person's present state of grace but to actions freely undertaken in the future. This is because, for FitzRalph, if someone were to act necessarily his or her actions would be neither just nor unjust. Someone might freely sin even if the future consequences were revealed to him, but that does not mean that he is compelled to sin.

With the exception of the final argument, all of the quod nons are based upon “cases” or particular circumstances (in isto casu, in casu posito) (Genest 1991: 242–3). Some are examples taken from Scripture, others we might call scholastic “thought experiments,” but most of them are accompanied by cases of conscience. According to Genest, many of them had already been put forward by his predecessors and many are to be found in the Lectura of the Franciscan John of Rodington, who read the Sentences at roughly the same time as FitzRalph; Rodington's treatment is briefer, however (Genest 1991: 243). The stock of hypotheses must have been more or less complete when FitzRalph composed his question, but it is the breadth of the treatment which marks FitzRalph's text as an important witness to the debate at Oxford at the end of the 1320s. A sign of this importance is the attention given to FitzRalph's text by Wodeham in his Lectura oxoniensis (1333–1334), where he devotes five long questions to the topic (Sent. III, qu. 5–9). Again, when Holcot came to deal with the matter, he practically repeated what FitzRalph had said.

6.4 Predestination and Free Will

John Wyclifff paid tribute to both Thomas Bradwardine and FitzRalph as the two Oxford teachers upon whom he relied most. However, on the question of predestination and free will, Wyclifff followed Bradwardine and not FitzRalph. Wycliff's position on predestination contrasted sharply with FitzRalph's efforts to reconcile free will with a moderate acceptance of divine predestination. This might serve to explain why Wycliff quoted from the De Pauperie Salvatoris on dominion and from the Summa de Quaestionibus Armenorum on a wider range of theological issues, but he never refers to the Lectures on the Sentences. FitzRalph's strong emphasis on the primacy of the will in the Lectures was of little use to Wycliff when he was working out his position, nor was FitzRalph it seems free from all traces of the doctrine that Bradwardine was to describe as ‘Pelagian’.

In the Summa de Quaestionibus Armenorum XV-XVII, FitzRalph turned to topics of free will and predestination being concerned with what he regarded as a new heresy being spread in the schools. In language more violent than anything found before the mendicant controversy, he expressed his horror at the new teaching, which he calls a ‘diabolical knowledge’. Although Bradwardine was not the object of FitzRalph's attack, it seems to be written in response to disciples of Bradwardine who had espoused an extreme form of predestinarianism from a reading of the De Causa Dei. Predestinarianism reduces eternal salvation or damnation to the sovereign will of God alone, and excludes free will as a secondary factor in determining man's future state. Against an absolute determinism FitzRalph held that the punishment of the damned was just inasmuch as ‘their sin or its futurity was the reason from eternity why God willed to damn the wicked, and not the contrary, (Summa, XVI, 12) and defended the free human choice. Although the background to the debate is clearly Augustinian (see City of God, V:10), it is interesting to note that FitzRalph in the Summa seeks also to justify his position on the basis of Scripture.

7. Ethics and Political Theory: Dominium

After FitzRalph's death his fame and influence grew among those who wished to reform the Church. His anti-mendicant polemic meant that he was often referred to in Middle-English Lollard literature. He was quoted extensively by Wycliff. His Defensio Curatorum was printed several times in the late fifteenth century and is the only work by an Irishman to be published as an incunabulum. John of Trevisa translated it into Middle English. Printings of this work continued in the following two centuries. Through the work of Ussher, Wadding and others, the memory of FitzRalph was kept alive in the first half of the seventeenth century.

One topic in which FitzRalph was to have an influence was that of his teaching on dominium, or lordship. In his dialogue De pauperie Salvatoris (1356), FitzRalph argued that grace alone entitled a person to lordship over temporal things. Some centuries later Lutherans thinkers, held that rights, and hence the authority of secular rulers, were dependent on God's grace. Thus, if a ruler was a heretic or a sinner his laws could not be binding in conscience – only a righteous ruler could be a just legislator. An unrighteous ruler could be deposed; and such ‘unrighteous’ included unbelievers.

In his On the Civil Power, Francisco de Vitoria (ca. 1485–1546) asked whether non-Christians have legitimate sovereigns in view of the Spanish discovery of the ‘New World’. He states: ‘Richard FitzRalph, archbishop of Armagh, a man of otherwise blameless character and intelligence, certainly argues in his De pauperitate Saluatoris that not merely unbelief but any mortal sin impedes any kind of power or dominion (dominium) or jurisdiction, either public or private; in the mistaken belief that the true title and foundation of all power is grace.’ Vitoria fought against the notion of dominium through grace since, as a consequence, Christians would be entitled to take the lands, wealth and property from the native Americans, because Christians could and should exercise dominium over all unbelievers and over the whole world. This, of course, would render natural rights, or those which belong to human beings precisely because they are human, null and void. It was natural law theory which enabled de Vitoria to mount an impressive argument against this position. We must imagine that FitzRalph would have reacted with horror to how his teaching on dominion had been developed by Wyclif and his followers. A principle which he intended to bring some measure of justice into law ended up with defending laws without a principle of justice.


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Crathorn, William | Gregory of Rimini | Kilvington, Richard | Wodeham, Adam de | Wyclif, John