Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.


First published Sun Jan 5, 2003; substantive revision Tue Mar 9, 2010

Federalism is the theory or advocacy of federal principles for dividing powers between member units and common institutions. Unlike in a unitary state, sovereignty in federal political orders is non-centralized, often constitutionally, between at least two levels so that units at each level have final authority and can be self governing in some issue area. Citizens thus have political obligations to, or have their rights secured by, two authorities. The division of power between the member unit and center may vary, typically the center has powers regarding defense and foreign policy, but member units may also have international roles. The decision-making bodies of member units may also participate in central decision-making bodies. Much recent philosophical attention is spurred by renewed political interest in federalism, coupled with empirical findings concerning the requisite and legitimate basis for stability and trust among citizens in federal political orders. Philosophical contributions have addressed the dilemmas and opportunities facing Canada, Australia, Europe, Russia, Iraq, Nepal and Nigeria, to mention just a few areas where federal arrangements are seen as interesting solutions to accommodate differences among populations divided by ethnic or cultural cleavages yet seeking a common, often democratic, political order.

1. Taxonomy

Much valuable scholarship explicates the central terms ‘federalism’, ‘federation’ and ‘federal systems’ (cf. Wheare 1964, King 1982, Elazar 1987, Elazar 1987a, Riker 1993, Watts 1998).

A federal political order is here taken to be “the genus of political organization that is marked by the combination of shared rule and self-rule” (Watts 1998, 120). Federalism is the theory or advocacy of such an order, including principles for dividing final authority between member units and the common institutions.

A federation is one species of such a federal order; other species are unions, confederations, leagues and decentralised unions—and hybrids such as the present European Union (Elazar 1987, Watts 1998). A federation in this sense involves a territorial division of power between constituent units—sometimes called ‘provinces’, ‘cantons’, or confusingly ‘states’—and a common government. This division of power is typically entrenched in a constitution which neither a member unit nor the common government can alter unilaterally. The member unit and the common government both have direct effect on the citizenry—the common government operates “on the individual citizens composing the nation” (Federalist Paper 39)—and the authorities of both are directly elected (Watts 1998, 121). In comparison, decentralized authority in unitary states can typically be revoked by the central legislature at will. Such entrenchments notwithstanding, some centralization often occurs owing to the constitutional interpretations by a federal level court in charge of settling conflicts regarding the scopes of final legislative and/or judicial authority.

In contrast, ‘confederation’ has come to mean a political order with a weaker center than a federation, often dependent on the constituent units (Watts 1998, 121). Typically, in a confederation a) member units may legally exit, b) the center only exercises authority delegated by member units, c) the center is subject to member unit veto on many issues, d) center decisions bind member units but not citizens directly, e) the center lacks an independent fiscal or electoral base, and/or f) the member units do not cede authority permanently to the center. Confederations are often based on agreements for specific tasks, and the common government may be completely exercised by delegates of the member unit governments. Thus many would count as confederations the North American states during 1776–1787, Switzerland 1291–1847, and the present European Union—though it has several elements typical of federations.

In symmetric (con)federations the member units have the same bundles of powers, while in asymmetric (con)federations such as Russia, Canada, the European Union, Spain, or India the bundles may be different among member units; some member units may for instance have special rights regarding language or culture. Some asymmetric arrangements involve one smaller state and a larger, where the smaller partakes in governing the larger while retaining sovereignty on some issues (Elazar 1987, Watts 1998).

If the decisions made centrally do not involve member units at all, we may speak of separate (split or compact) federalism. The USA is often given as example, since the two Senators from each state are not representing or selected by member unit (i.e. State) authorities but by electors voted directly by citizens—though this is by member unit decision (U.S. Constitution Art. II Section 1; cf. Dahl 2001). Federations can involve member units in central decision-making in at least two different ways in various forms of interlocking (or cooperative) federalism. Member unit representatives can participate within central bodies—in cabinets or legislatures—(collective agency compositional arrangement); in addition they often constitute one central body that interacts with other such bodies, for instance where member unit government representatives form an Upper House with power to veto or postpone decisions by majority or qualified majority vote (divided agency/relational arrangements).

Two quite distinct processes that lead to a federal political order may be identified (Friedrich 1968, Buchanan 1995, Stepan 1999 and others). Independent states may aggregate by ceding or pooling sovereign powers in certain domains for the sake of goods otherwise unattainable, such as security or economic prosperity. Such coming together federal political orders are typically arranged to constrain the center and prevent majorities from overriding a member unit. Examples include the present USA, Canada, Switzerland, and Australia. Holding together federal political orders develop from unitary states, as governments devolve authority to alleviate threats of unrest or secession by territorially clustered minorities. Such federal political orders often grant some member units particular domains of sovereignty e.g. over language and cultural rights in an asymmetric federation, while maintaining broad scope of action for the central government and majorities. Examples include India, Belgium and Spain.

In addition to territorially organized federal political orders, other interesting alternatives to unitary states occur when non-territorial member units are constituted by groups sharing ethnic, religious or other characteristics. These systems are sometimes referred to as ‘non-territorial’ federations. Karl Renner and Otto Bauer explored such arrangements for geographically dispersed cultural minorities, allowing them some cultural and “personal” autonomy without territorial self rule (Bauer 1903; Renner 1907; Bottomore and Goode 1978; cf. Tamir 1993). Consociations consist of somewhat insulated groups in member units who in addition are represented in central institutions often governing by unanimity rather than by majority (Lijphart 1977).

2. History of Federalism in Western Thought

A wide-spread interest among political philosophers in topics concerning the centralised nation state have fuelled attention to historical contributions on unitary sovereignty. However, we can also identify a steady stream of contributions to the philosophy of federalism, also by those more well known for their arguments concerning centralised power (cf. Karmis and Norman 2005 for such readings).

Several of the early contributors to federalist thought explored the rationale and weaknesses of centralised states as they emerged and developed in the 17th and 18th century. Johannes Althusius (1557–1630) is often regarded as the father of modern federalist thought. He argued in Politica Methodice Digesta (Althusius 1603) for autonomy of his city Emden, both against its Lutheran provincial Lord and against the Catholic Emperor. Althusius was strongly influenced by French Huguenots and Calvinism. As a permanent minority in several states, Calvinists developed a doctrine of resistance as the right and duty of “natural leaders” to resist tyranny. Orthodox Calvinists insisted on sovereignty in the social circles subordinate only to God's laws. The French Protestant Huguenots developed a theory of legitimacy further, presented 1579 by an author with the telling pseudonym “Junius Brutus” in Vindiciae Contra Tyrannos. The people, regarded as a corporate body in territorial hierarchical communities, has a God-granted right to resist rulers without rightful claim. Rejecting theocracy, Althusius developed a non-sectarian, non-religious contractualist political theory of federations that prohibited state intervention even for purposes of promoting the right faith. Accommodation of dissent and diversity prevailed over any interest in subordinating political powers to religion or vice versa.

Since humans are fundamentally dependent on others for the reliable provision of requirements of a comfortable and holy life, we require communities and associations that are both instrumentally and intrinsically important for supporting [subsidia] our needs. Families, guilds, cities, provinces, states and other associations owe their legitimacy and claims to political power to their various roles in enabling a holy life, rather than to individuals' interest in autonomy. Each association claims autonomy within its own sphere against intervention by other associations. Borrowing a term originally used for the alliance between God and men, Althusius holds that associations enter into secular agreements—pactum foederis—to live together in mutual benevolence.

Several early contributors explored what we may now regard as various species of federal political orders, partly with an eye to resolving inter-state conflicts.

Ludolph Hugo (ca. 1630–1704) was the first to distinguish confederations based on alliances, decentralized unitary states such as the Roman Empire, and federations, characterized by ‘double governments’ with territorial division of powers, in De Statu Regionum Germanie (1661) (cf. Elazar 1998; Riley 1976).

In The Spirit of Laws (1748) Charles de Secondat, Baron de Montesquieu (1689–1755) argued for confederal arrangements as combining the best of small and large political units, without the disadvantages of either. On the one hand they could provide the advantages of small states such as republican participation and liberty understood as non-domination—that is, security against abuse of power. At the same time confederal orders secure the benefits of larger states such as military security, without the risks of small and large states. A ‘confederate republic’ with separation of powers allows sufficient homogeneity and identification within sufficiently small member units. The member units in turn pool powers sufficient to secure external security, reserving the right to secede (Book 9, 1). Member units serve as checks on each other, since other member units may intervene to quell insurrection and power abuse in one member unit. These themes reoccur in later contributions, up to and including discussions concerning the European Union (cf. Levy 2004, 2005, 2007).

David Hume (1711–1776) disagreed with Montesquieu that smaller size is better. Instead, “in a large democracy … there is compass and room enough to refine the democracy.” In “Idea of a Perfect Commonwealth” (Hume 1752) Hume recommended a federal arrangement for deliberation of laws involving both member unit and central legislatures. Member units enjoy several powers and partake in central decisions, but their laws and court judgments can always be overruled by the central bodies, hence it seems that Hume’s model is not federal as the term is used here. He held that such a numerous and geographically large system would do better than small cities in preventing decisions based on “intrigue, prejudice or passion” against the public interest.

Several 18th century peace plans for Europe recommended confederal arrangements. The 1713 Peace Plan of Abbé Charles de Saint-Pierre (1658–1743) would allow intervention in member units to quell rebellion and wars on non-members to force them to join an established confederation, and required unanimity for changes to the agreement.

Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1712–1778) presented and critiqued Saint-Pierre’s proposal, listing several conditions including that all major powers must be members, that the joint legislation must be binding, that the joint forces must be stronger than any single state, and that secession must be illegal. Again, unanimity was required for changes to the agreement.

Immanuel Kant (1724–1804) defended a confederation for peace in On Perpetual Peace (1796). His Second Definite Article of a Perpetual Peace holds that the right of nations shall be based on a pacific federation among free states rather than a peace treaty or an international state: “This federation does not aim to acquire any power like that of a state, but merely to preserve and secure the freedom of each state in itself, along with that of the other confederated states, although this does not mean that they need to submit to public laws and to a coercive power which enforces them, as do men in a state of nature.”

The discussions surrounding the U.S. Constitutional Convention of 1787 marks a clear development in federal thought. A central feature is that federations were seen as uniting not only member units as in confederations, but also the citizenry directly.

The Articles of Confederation of 1781 among the 13 American states fighting British rule had established a center too weak for law enforcement, defense and for securing interstate commerce. What has become known as the U.S. Constitutional Convention met May 25–September 17, 1787. It was explicitly restricted to revise the Articles, but ended up recommending more fundamental changes. The proposed constitution prompted widespread debate and arguments addressing the benefits and risks of federalism versus confederal arrangements, leading eventually to the Constitution that took effect in 1789.

The “Anti-federalists” were fearful of undue centralization. They worried that the powers of central authorities were not sufficiently constrained e.g., by a bill of rights (John DeWitt 1787, Richard Henry Lee) that was eventually ratified in 1791. They also feared that the center might gradually usurp the member units’ powers. Citing Montesquieu, another pseudonymous ‘Brutus’ doubted whether a republic of such geographical size with so many inhabitants with conflicting interests could avoid tyranny and would allow common deliberation and decision based on local knowledge (Brutus (Robert Yates?) 1787).

In what has become known as The Federalist Papers, James Madison (1751–1836), Alexander Hamilton (1755–1804) and John Jay (1745–1829) argued vigorously for the suggested model of interlocking federal arrangements (Federalist 10, 45, 51, 62). Madison and Hamilton agreed with Hume that the risk of tyranny by passionate majorities was reduced in larger republics where member units of shared interest could and would check each other: “A rage for paper money, for an abolition of debts, for an equal division of property, or for any improper or wicked project, will be less likely to pervade the whole body of the Union than a particular member of it.” (Federalist 10). Splitting sovereignty between member unit and center would also protect individuals’ rights against abuse by authorities at either level, or so believed Hamilton, quoting Montesquieu at length to this effect (Federalist 9).

Noting the problems of allocating powers correctly, Madison supported placing some authority with member units since they would be best fit to address “local circumstances and lesser interests” otherwise neglected by the center (Federalist 37).

Madison and Hamilton urged centralized powers of defense and interstate commerce (Federalist 11, 23), and argued for the need to solve coordination and assurance problems of partial compliance, through two new means: Centralized enforcement and direct applicability of central decisions to individuals (Federalist 16, also noted by Tocqueville 1835–40). They were wary of granting member units veto power typical of confederal arrangements, since that would render the center weak and cause “tedious delays; continual negotiation and intrigue; contemptible compromises of the public good.” (Madison and Hamilton, Federalist 22; and cf. 20).

They were particularly concerned to address worries of undue centralization, arguing that such worries should be addressed not by constraining the extent of power in the relevant fields, such as defense, but instead by the composition of the central authority (Federalist 31). They also claimed that the people would maintain stronger “affection, esteem, and reverence” towards the member unit government owing to its public visibility in the day-to-day administration of criminal and civil justice (Federalist 17).

John Stuart Mill (1806–1873), in chapter 17 of Considerations on Representative Government (1861), recommended federations among “portions of mankind” not disposed to live under a common government, to prevent wars among themselves and protect against aggression. He would also allow the center sufficient powers so as to ensure all benefits of union—including powers to prevent frontier duties to facilitate commerce. He listed three necessary conditions for a federation: sufficient mutual sympathy “of race, language, religion, and, above all, of political institutions, as conducing most to a feeling of identity of political interest”; no member unit so powerful as to not require union for defense nor tempt unduly to secession; and rough equality of strength among member units to prevent internal domination by one or two. Mill also claimed among the benefits of federations that they reduce the number of weak states hence reduce temptation to aggression, ending wars and restrictions on commence among member units; and that federations are less aggressive, only using their power defensively.

Pierre-Joseph Proudhon (1809–1865), in Du Principe fédératif (1863) defended federalism as the best way to retain individual liberty within ‘natural’ communities such as families and guilds who enter pacts among themselves for necessary and specific purposes. The state is only one of several non-sovereign agents in charge of coordinating, without final authority.

Philosophical reflections on federalism were invigorated during and after the Second World War, for several reasons. Since the devastating war was largely caused by rampant nationalism, alternatives to sovereign centralised states were sought out. And the exit of colonial powers left multi-ethnic states that required creative solutions to combine self rule and shared rule (Karmis and Norman 2005). In addition, globalisation has prompted not only integration and harmonisation, but also—partly in response—explorations of ways to still maintain some local self rule (Watts 1998).

While Proudhon was wary of centralisation, authors such as Harold Laski warned of ‘The Obsolesence of Federalism’ (1939). The important problems, such as those wrought by ‘giant capitalism,’ require more centralised responses than federal arrangements can muster.

Altiero Spinelli and Ernesto Rossi offered a quite different perspective in the Ventotene Manifesto, published 1944. They condemned totalitarian, centralised states and the never ending conflicts among them, and instead called for a European federal state with enough shared control over military and economic power, yet where “each State will retain the autonomy it needs for a plastic articulation and development of political life according to the particular characteristics of the various peoples.” Many explain and justify the European Union along precisely these lines, while others are more critical.

Recent philosophical discussions concerning federalism have addressed several issues, including centrally the reasons for federalism, and attention to the sources of stability and instability; the legitimate division of power between member unit and center; distributive justice, challenges to received democratic theory, and concerns about the politics of recognition.

3. Reasons for Federalism

Many arguments for federalism have traditionally been put in terms of promoting various forms of liberty in the form of non-domination, immunity or enhanced opportunity sets (Elazar 1987a). When considering reasons offered in the literature for federal political orders, many appear to be in favor of decentralization without requiring constitutional entrenchment of split authority. Two sets of arguments can be distinguished: Arguments favoring federal orders compared with secession and completely independent sovereign states; and arguments supporting federal arrangements rather than a (further) centralized unitary state. They occur in different forms and from different starting points, in defense of ‘coming together’ federalism, and in favor of ‘holding together’ federalism.

3.1 Reasons for a federal order rather than separate states or secession

Here is a list of reasons for a federal order rather than separate states or secession.

3.2 Reasons for preferring federal orders over a unitary state

Here is a list of reasons for preferring federal orders over a unitary state:

4. Further Philosophical Issues

Much recent attention has focused on philosophical issues arising from empirical findings concerning federalism, and has been spurred by quite different dilemmas facing—inter alia—Canada, Australia, Nepal, several European states and the European Union.

4.1 Issues of Constitutional and Institutional Design

Federal political orders require attention to several constitutional and other institutional issues, some of which raise peculiar and intriguing issues of normative political theory (Watts 1998; Norman 2006).

These tasks must be resolved taking due account of several important considerations noted below.

4.2 Sources of Stability

As political orders go, federal political arrangements pose peculiar problems concerning stability and trust. Federations tend to drift toward disintegration in the form of secession, or toward centralization in the direction of a unitary state.

Such instability should come as no surprise given the tensions typically giving rise to federal political orders in the first place, such as tensions between majority and minority national communities in multinational federations. Federal political orders are therefore often marked by a high level of ‘constitutional politics’. The details of their constitutions and other institutions may affect these conflicts and their outcomes in drastic ways. Political parties often disagree on constitutional issues regarding the appropriate areas of member unit autonomy, the forms of cooperation and how to prevent fragmentation. Such sampling bias among states that federalize to hold together makes it difficult to assess claims that federal responses perpetuate cleavages and fuel rather than quell secessionist movements. Some nevertheless argue that democratic, interlocking federations alleviate such tendencies (Simeon 1998, Simeon and Conway 2001, Linz 1997; cf. McKay 2001, Filippov, Ordeshook and Shvetsova 2004).

Many authors note that the challenges of stability must be addressed not only by institutional design, but also by ensuring that citizens have an ‘overarching loyalty’ to the federation as whole in addition to loyalty toward their own member unit (Franck 1968, Linz 1997). The legitimate bases, content and division of such a public dual allegiance are central topics of political philosophies of federalism (Norman 1995a, Choudhry 2001). Some accept (limited) appeals to considerations such as shared history, practices, culture, or ethnicity for delineating member units and placing certain powers with them, even if such ‘communitarian’ features are regarded as more problematic bases for (unitary) political orders (Kymlicka 1995, Habermas 1996, 500). The appropriate consideration that voters and their member unit politicians should give to the interests of others in the federation in interlocking arrangements must be clarified if the notion of citizen of two commonwealths is to be coherent and durable.

4.3 Division of Power

Another and related central philosophical topic is the critical assessment of alleged grounds for federal arrangements in general, and the division of power between member units and central bodies in particular, indicated in the preceding sections. Recent contributions include Knop et al. 1995, Kymlicka 2001, Kymlicka and Norman 2000, Nicolaidis and Howse 2001, Norman 2006. Among the important issues, especially due to the risks of instability, are:

The “Principle of Subsidiarity” has often been used to guide the decisions about allocation of power. This principle has recently received attention owing to its inclusion in European Union treaties. It holds that authority should rest with the member units unless allocating them to a central unit would ensure higher comparative efficiency or effectiveness in achieving certain goals. This principle can be specified in several ways, for instance concerning which units are included, which goals are to be achieved, and who has the authority to apply it. The principle has multiple pedigrees, and came to recent political prominence largely through its role in quelling fears of centralization in Europe—a contested role which the principle has not quite filled (Fleiner and Schmitt 1996, Burgess and Gagnon 1993, Føllesdal 1998).

4.4 Distributive Justice

Regarding distributive justice, federal political orders must manage tensions between ensuring member unit autonomy and securing the requisite redistribution within and among the member units. Indeed, the Federalists regarded federal arrangements as an important safeguard against “the equal division of property” (Federalist 10). The political scientists Linz and Stepan may be seen as finding support for the Federalists’ hypothesis: Compared to unitary states in the OECD, the ‘coming together’ federations tend to have higher child poverty rate in solo mother households and a higher percentage of population over-sixty living in poverty. Linz and Stepan explain this inequality as stemming from the ‘demos constraining’ arrangements of these federations, seeking to protect individuals and member units from central authorities, combined with a weak party system. By comparison, the Constitution of Germany (not a ‘coming together’ federation) explicitly requires equalization of living conditions among the member units (Art. 72.2) Normative arguments may also support some distributive significance of federal arrangements, for instance owing to legitimate trade-offs between member unit autonomy and redistributive claims among member units (Føllesdal 2001). A central normative issue is to what extent a shared culture and bonds among citizens within a historically sovereign state reduce the claims on redistribution among the member units.

4.5 Democratic Theory

Federalism raises several challenges to democratic theory, especially as developed for unitary states. Federal arrangements are often more complex, thereby challenging standards of transparency and accountability. The restricted political agendas of each center of authority also require defense (Dahl 1983; Braybrooke 1983). One of several particular issues concern the standing of member units (for further issues, cf., Norman 2006, 144–150).

The power that member units wield in federations often restricts or violates majority rule, in ways that merit careful scrutiny. Democratic theory has long been concerned with how to prevent domination of minorities, and many federal political orders do so by granting member units some influence over common decisions. Federal political orders typically influence individuals' political influence by skewing their voting weight in favor of citizens of small member units, or by granting member unit representatives veto rights on central decisions. Minorities thus exercise control in apparent violation of principles of political equality and one-person-one-vote—more so when member units are of different size. These features raises fundamental normative questions concerning why member units should matter for the allocation of political power among individuals who live in different member units.

4.6 Politics of Recognition

Many federal political orders accommodate minority groups in two ways discussed above: both through a division of power, and by granting them influence over common decisions. These measures of identity Politics can be valuable ways to give public acknowledgment and recognition to groups and their members, sometimes on the very basis of previous domination. But identity politics also create challenges (Gutman 1994), especially in federal arrangements that face greater risks of instability and must maintain citizens' dual political loyalties. Self-government arrangements may threaten the federal political order: “demands for self-government reflect a desire to weaken the bonds with the larger community and, indeed, question its very nature, authority and permanence” (Kymlicka and Norman 1994, 375). The emphasis on “recognition and institutionalization of difference could undermine the conditions that make a sense of common identification and thus mutuality possible” (Carens 2000, 193).

Federations are often thought to be sui generis, one-of-a-kind deviations from the ideal-type unitary sovereign state familiar from the Westphalian world order. Indeed, every federation may well be federal in its very own way, and not easy to summarize and assess as an ideal-type political order. Yet the phenomenon of non-unitary sovereignty is not new, and federal accommodation of differences may well be better than the alternatives. When and why this is so has long been the subject of philosophical, theoretical and normative analysis and reflection. Such public arguments may themselves contribute to develop the overarching loyalty required among citizens of stable, legitimate federations, who must understand themselves as members of two commonwealths.




Several of the historical writings—those marked ‘*’ below and others—are reprinted in part or full in Theories of Federalism: A Reader, Dimitrios Karmis and Wayne Norman (eds.), New York: Palgrave, 2005.

Secondary sources


Publius: The Journal of Federalism, regularly publishes philosophical articles.


Books and Articles

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

authority | citizenship | Hume, David | identity politics | Kant, Immanuel | liberty: positive and negative | Mill, John Stuart | Montesquieu, Charles-Louis de Secondat, Baron de | Proudhon, Pierre | Rousseau, Jean Jacques | sovereignty