Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Computer and Information Ethics

1. The term “information ethics” has been used by Luciano Floridi (see section 1.7) as a name for the rigorously developed ethical theory that he created to provide a foundation for computer ethics. In this essay, I use FIE to refer to Floridi's specific information ethics theory to distinguish it from the much broader, and less rigorously developed, information ethics theory of Wiener. Although there are some similarities, Floridi's theory and Wiener's have very different goals and very different metaphysical foundations. Thus Wiener's theory is a kind of materialism grounded in the laws of physics; while Floridi's theory presupposes a Spinozian, perhaps even a Platonic, metaphysics (Floridi 2006). In Floridi's theory, but not in Wiener's, non-human entities, such as rivers, databases and stones have “rights” that ought to be respected. Floridi's “entropy” is not the entropy of physics, as it is in Wiener; Floridi's “information” is not the “Shannon information” of physics, as it is in Wiener; and Floridi's world includes non-material Platonic entities that have no place in Wiener's universe.