Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Epistemic Utility Arguments for Probabilism

Proof of Theorem 6

We wish to prove the following theorem (Selten 1984):

Theorem 6. Perspective Indifference, World Indifference, and Weakly Non-Trivial entail

G(p, v) = λΣ|v(vi) − p(vi)|²

for all p in P and v in V, where v1, …, vn are the atoms of F.

First, by World Indifference, every world v is exactly the same distance from every other world v′. Thus, let G(v, v′) = c, for all vv′. Now suppose pP and viV. Then, by Perspective Indifference,

GExpG(p | p) − GExpG(vi | p) = GExpG(vi | vi) − GExpG(p | vi)

That is, p is the same distance from vi as vi is from p, where the distance of one probability function from another is given by the expected inaccuracy of the first by the lights of the second corrected so that every probability function is at distance 0 from itself.

Spelling out the definition of GExpG we derive

GExpG(p | p) − Σp(v)G(vi, v) = Σvi(v)G(vi, v) − Σvi(v)G(p, v)

Thus, by World Indifference, we have

GExpG(p | p) − c(1 − p(vi)) = -G(p, vi)

which gives

G(p | vi) = ccp(vi) − GExpG(p | p)

From this point on, we are simply manipulating formulae: there is no deep explanation for what is going on. Substituting this into the definition of GExpG, we have

GExpG(p | p)
  =  Σp(v)[ccp(v) − GExpG(p | p)]
  =  c − GExpG(p | p) − cΣp(v


GExpG = ½c − ½cΣp(v

Substituting this into the expression for G given above, we have

G(p, vi)
  =  ccp(vi) − ½c + ½cΣp(v
  =  ½c − ½c[2p(vi) − Σp(v)²]
  =  ½c||pvi||².

as required.