Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Epistemic Utility Arguments for Probabilism

Proof of Theorem 12

We wish to prove the following theorem (Greaves and Wallace 2006):

Theorem 12. Strong Propriety for P entails that, for all b, b′ in P and E in F, if b(E) > 0 and b′ ≠ b(• | E) then

GExpU, E(b(• | E) | b) < GExpU, E(b′ | b)

That is, if our epistemic disutility function satisfies Strong Propriety for P, conditionalizing on a piece of evidence E minimizes expected disutility by the lights of the agent's original credence function b and in the presence of E.

We use the notation ΣA to denote the sum over v in V that make proposition A true. And we use the notation Σ to denote the sum over all v in V.

By Strong Propriety for P, we have

GExpU, ⊤(b(• | E) | b(• | E)) < GExpU, ⊤(b′ | b(• | E))

for b′ ≠ b(• | E). That is, prior to any evidence, the conditionalized credence function b(• | E) expects itself to be better than it expects any other credence function to be. Thus, we have

Σ b(v | E)U(b(• | E), v) < Σ b(v | E)U(b′, v)

by the definition of GExpU, ⊤. Thus, since b(v | E) = b(v & E)/b(E), we have: b(v | E) = 0, if v does not make E true; and b(v | E) = b(v)/b(E) if v does make E true. Substituting this into the previous inequality, we get

(1/b(E))ΣEb(v)U(b(• | E), v) < (1/b(E))ΣE b(v)U(b′, v)

Multiplying both sides by b(E), we get

ΣE b(v)U(b(• | E), v) < ΣE b(v)U(b′, v)

And this gives

GExpU, E(b(• | E) | b) < GExpU, E(b′ | b)

as required.