Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Empathy

1. In his Cartesian Meditations, Husserl still seems to address the problem of other minds from within the framework of a Cartesian conception of the mind; at least in the sense that he gives epistemic priority to the first person perspective. Nevertheless, pace Descartes, he stresses in the fifth of his Meditations that at the most basic level of conscious experience, we experience ourselves as a psychophysical unity, as a lived body (Leib) and not merely as a physical body (Körper).

2. In their 2006 article, psychologists Jolliffe and Farrington, try to argue for the validity of what they call the Basic Empathy Scale. Their use of the term “basic empathy” has to be strictly distinguished from the term as used by Stueber 2006. Indeed what Joliffe and Farrington mean is that they try to develop a scale measuring empathy, where empathy is properly distinguished from sympathy. For this distinction see also section 4 of this entry.

3. In my view, philosophers maintaining such a division are therefore not necessarily belonging only to what one commonly refers to as the hermeneutic tradition in continental philosophy. Peter Winch, for example, who argues from a Wittgensteinian perspective for a methodological distinction between the natural and social sciences and, should also be counted among those who maintain a hermeneutic conception of the social sciences.

4. From this perspective, empathy cannot be regarded as the foundation for relating to other minds. Rather being minded and being related to other minds is seen as being different aspects of the same dimension; we understand each other as minded insofar as we are sharing the same basic cultural presuppositions and are interacting in a common cultural context (Heidegger 1984, 124-125; 1996, 145). Empathy at most has to be seen as the exception to the rule in case there is a break down of the primary dimension of interpersonal intersubjectivity. However, Heidegger's contentions can be seriously questioned by asking how we should think of children, for example, to be initiated in a common cultural sphere in the first place. Learning a common language seems to be an essential prerequisite in this regard. Yet as has been pointed out (Bloom 2000), children need to be able to grasp a speaker's intention in order to learn what object a specific word refers to. In light of what has been said before, one could argue that mechanisms of basic empathy play a special role in this context.

5. It should also be noted that psychologists differed in how central they conceived of the underlying mechanisms, which produce a particular cognitive or emotional result, for their definition of empathy (Davis 1994). Psychologists generally referred to role- or perspective-taking as a mechanism that was of central importance for an empathic relation to another person—as Smith and then particularly Mead (1934) underscored. Yet psychologists until very recently did not study the causal processes supporting such perspective taking and they did not espouse any specific hypothesis about the nature of those perspective taking mechanisms. Rather, within the tradition of social psychology, perspective taking was understood in an operationalized manner. It refers to any mechanism that underlies the instruction to either imagine-oneself in the situation of the other and to imagine how one would then feel or to imagine-the-other in his situation and to imagine how he would feel (Stotland 1969, 292); or what Hoffman calls self-focused and other-focused role-taking (Hoffman 2000). In Stotland, both forms of role-taking are intended to activate our ability to think about the other in a mentalizing and emotive manner and are contrasted with a mere watch-him instruction emphasizing the observation of the external and physical behavior of the observed subject. In contrast to philosophers mentioned above and in contrast to contemporary simulation theorists, psychologists did not see empathy necessarily as a phenomenon or method that has to be structurally distinguished from the theoretical inferences and explanatory strategies of the natural sciences. At times psychologists are quite content to use the term “perspective taking” to refer to the mere “ability or tendency to draw accurate conclusions about others' internal states,” regardless of the internal knowledge structures that support the drawing of such conclusions. Empathy in this sense refers to what psychologists in other contexts call our theory-of- mind abilities or, less confusingly, our everyday mindreading abilities (Eisenberg et al. 1997, 77).