Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to 17th and 18th Century Theories of Emotions

Hume on the Emotions

1. Introduction

David Hume's (1711-1776) wide-ranging philosophical works discuss the emotions at length, most notably in his Treatise of Human Nature (1739-40), which devotes the second of its three books to the passions, as well as in the Dissertation on the Passions (from Four Dissertations 1757), which covers much the same material. Because of Hume's sentimentalist bent, his works on moral philosophy are also important for his understanding of the emotions: these include Book III of the Treatise, on the moral sentiments, and the Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (1751). Hume's essays, published in various editions during his lifetime, also cover diverse topics related to the emotions, such as “Of the Delicacy of Taste and Passion,” “Of Love and Marriage,” “Of Superstition and Enthusiasm” (1741), and “Of the Standard of Taste” (1757). Other texts, such as his autobiographical sketches, and the six volumes of his History of England (1754-62), offer material illustrating Hume's views on the topic. The Treatise, however, contains ample material to serve as a starting point.

2. Terminology

Hume groups the emotions in general among the perceptions of the mind, although they also serve as motivations for acting and even for reasoning. When the word ‘emotion’ itself appears in his writings, however, it seems to mean simply some kind of motion. Instead, Hume uses an array of terms to describe our affective perceptions, especially the ‘passion,’ ‘sentiment’ and ‘taste’ familiar from Shaftesbury and Hutcheson. But Hume provides several new twists. Unlike Hutcheson, he divides passions themselves into calm and violent. Like Hutcheson, however, he seems to take passions to be relatively low-order perceptions, in contrast to the reflective character of sentiments. Although the Treatise is not particularly forthcoming on the use of these terms, the essay “Of the Delicacy of Taste and Passion” presents a clear contrast between that “higher and more refined taste,” which is also identified with sentiment, and the violent passions that disturb susceptible souls (Hume 1985 6). Sentiment and taste are calm affective states, susceptible to cultivation, subject to standards and capable of reining in the excesses of overly “delicate,” i.e., violent, passions.

3. Conclusion to Book I of the Treatise

Hume does not merely discuss the emotions theoretically, he narrates the philosophical experience of them in the “Conclusion to this Book” that closes Book I of the Treatise. This section treats the narrator's emotional landscape as a response to his skeptical conclusions about reason, sense-perception, and the self. The narrator feels himself “a strange, uncouth monster,” shunned by society and marooned in a skeptical isolation in which even his views about how to limit his beliefs are unstable (T I.4.7 264). Hume treats this unhappy, skeptical view as a kind of illness, which eventually receives a cure from “nature herself.” The first sign of a return to health is “a splenetic humour” that rejects philosophy (T I.4.7 269). But the conclusion resolves with the narrator replacing his despairing skepticism with a cheerful skepticism that is “diffident of [its] philosophical doubts, as well as of [its] philosophical conviction” (T I.4.7 273). This seems a fruitful approach, for the Treatise goes on for two more Books, philosophizing in a “careless,” i.e., carefree, manner (see Baier 1991 1ff.).

The exact source of the “philosophical melancholy and delirium” in Book I, and just how nature comes to the rescue are matters of much debate. What seems clear is that the cure wrought by nature is a matter of a change of affective state – “the returns of a serious good humour'd disposition” (T I.4.7 270) – rather than the cultivation of any new beliefs or reasoning techniques. This new mood inclines him again to philosophy, and the Treatise proceeds to topics neglected in the first book, particularly the nature of our passions and sentiments and how they fit us for social life. The motivation throughout is affective: pleasure, an “ambition … of contributing to the instruction of mankind” (T I.4.7 271), and above all, curiosity. Although this curiosity is not exactly the same as Descartes's and Malebranche's “wonder,” Hume does declare in the conclusion of Book II that the “first source of all our enquiries” is “curiosity, or that love of truth” (T II.3.10 448). It drives both philosophy and hunting, of which “there cannot be two passions more nearly resembling each other” (T II.3.10 451), although the passion for gambling comes close. The passion for hunting down truth becomes yet stronger when directed at the objects that intrinsically interest us: human nature, particularly the shared passions and sentiments that motivate us and our interactions with other people – in short, the topics of Books II and III of the Treatise.

4. The Classification of the Passions in Book II of the Treatise

The perceptions of the mind divide into two kinds: impressions and ideas (roughly, feeling and thinking): “Those perceptions, which enter with most force and violence, we may name impressions; and under this name I comprehend all our sensations, passions and emotions, as they make their first appearance in the soul. By ideas I mean the faint images of these in thinking and reasoning …” (T I.1.1 1). Hume proposes a scale of vivacity, in which impressions are vivid, ideas are faint, and beliefs (e.g., in the existence of things we do not presently perceive) are somewhere in the middle. But ideas can borrow vivacity from other sources through the principles of association found in the imagination.

Impressions can also be divided into two kinds: impressions of sense (original) and impressions of reflection (secondary). The impressions of sense include all our sensations, as well as perceptions of pleasure and pain; the impressions of reflection include all our passions and sentiments. In Book I.1.2, Hume says that the impressions of sense arise in the soul “originally, from unknown causes” (T I.1.2 7), whereas secondary impressions “proceed from some of these original ones, either immediately or by the interposition of its idea” (T II.1.1 275). Still, Hume considers even secondary impressions to be in some sense “original existences:” they may follow on the heels of a distinct impression (sensory or reflective) or idea, but are not copies of them. On the other hand, impressions can be related associatively through resemblance, and it is the associative constructions they allow that provide structure to our often chaotic thought processes (particularly through “the double relation of impressions and ideas” discussed below).

The passions, then, are impressions of reflection. The Treatise separates this broad categorization into calm and violent passions (although other of Hume's works seem to reserve “passion” for the violent ones). But this “vulgar and specious division” doesn't play much role in the Treatise, and Hume insists that calm passions are not necessarily weak, nor violent ones strong. More important for Hume's purposes is the distinction between direct and indirect passions. Direct passions arise immediately from “good or evil, from plain or pleasure;” indirect passions require the “conjunction of other qualities,” particularly the interposition of an idea (T II.1.1 276). Curiosity, or love of truth falls among the direct passions, which also include desire and aversion, grief and joy, hope and fear, and somewhat oddly, volition. But it is the indirect passions of pride and humility, love and hate that are analyzed first in Book II.

5. The Double Relation of Impressions and Ideas in the Case of Pride

Indirect passions differ from the direct, in part, because of their complicated intentionality. They have objects; they also have causes, which can be further subdivided into the quality that excites the passion and the subject in which it inheres. In the case of pride, the object is self. The cause is the pleasing quality in a subject that is (somehow) related to self. This forms the framework on which Hume builds the “double relation of ideas and impressions” (T II.1.5 286), in which impressions of sense are related to resembling passions, and ideas of the cause are related through various principles of association to the object of the passion. It is the whole structure that seems to characterize the passion, as we may see in the case of pride. The cause of pride has a quality that gives a pleasurable perception, which is found in a subject, the idea of which is related to the idea of self. Consider, for example, the pleasurable passion of pride Mr. Darcy may take in his beautiful estate:

Cause (quality) Passion
Impressions: Pleasure —(resemblance)→ Pride
Ideas: My
—(causation)→ Self
(Mr. Darcy)
Cause (subject) Object

The same structure can be found in the other indirect passions of humility, love and hate, as Hume shows in “experiments to confirm this system” (T II.2.2 332), although either the quality of the cause, or the relations the idea of the subject bears will be different for each passion. For instance, that which produces pride when connected to self can produce love in another, as when the beautiful estate excites love in Elizabeth for Mr. Darcy:

Cause (quality) Passion
Impressions: Pleasure —(resemblance)→ Love
Ideas: Mr. Darcy's
—(causation)→ Mr. Darcy
Cause (subject) Object

Similarly, Elizabeth's dreadful relations may excite humility in Elizabeth and “hate” in Mr. Darcy.

It is worth remarking that Hume begins his discussion of the passions with pride. Its role for Hume may bear comparison to the importance “glory” held for Hobbes, although they are clearly not the same passion. Almost anything that invokes pleasurable impressions can be the cause of pride, within the limitations that the idea of the subject must allow us to build associative connections directing the mind to the idea of self. The idea of self seems, however, to be intrinsically attention-grabbing, which explains why love for another somehow connected to us readily converts into pride, but not vice-versa (so I may readily feel pride when considering my children's many accomplishments, but consideration of my own accomplishments does not tend to provoke love for my children). Against the “monkish” preference for humility, Hume emphasizes that virtue itself can be a just cause of pride, one that becomes all the more powerful as our passions reverberate socially through the mechanism Hume calls “sympathy.”

Perhaps the most curious feature of pride is its indispensable relation to the idea of self. The penultimate chapter of Book I of the Treatise (I.4.6) advances a highly skeptical account of the idea of self, maintaining that we have no such simple idea, but at best the idea of an organized bundle: a “kind of theatre, where several perceptions successively make their appearance; pass, re-pass, glide away, and mingle in an infinite variety of postures and situations,” but without even “the most distant notion of the place, where these scenes are represented” (T I.4.6 253). Hume seems to find this a distressing thought, but allows that we “must distinguish betwixt personal identity, as it regards our thought or imagination, and as it regards our passions or the concern we take in ourselves” (T I.4.6 253). The introduction of the passion of pride, with its essential focus on self, shortly thereafter may bear this distinction out. Indeed, pride seems both to require reference to an idea of the self, and to buttress whatever meager idea we may already have by directing the mind to an idea of the self outfitted with various pleasurable associations. Hume needs some trick to fortify the idea of the self, because he will rely on our possession of a lively idea of the self, one that will serve as a source of vivacity, for his account of the sympathetic communication of passions.

6. Sympathy and Comparison

Sympathy is not itself a passion; it is not the passion of “pity,” nor of “compassion.” Rather, it is a causal mechanism, whereby we come to feel the passions we suppose others feel. In its simplest form, it starts with an observation of the outward signs of a passion in another (e.g., facial expressions, behavior, talk), from which we form an idea of, indeed a belief in, the existence of some passion. Sympathy vivifies that idea into an impression, that is, a passion, by borrowing from the ever-present, and lively sense of self. We do need some sort of associations between the idea of the other and the idea of self for this transfer of vivacity to work. But they are easy to come by: any sort of relation between another person – contiguity, causation, or even simple resemblance – can grease the associative wheels whereby an idea of another's passion becomes a genuine passion in us.

Hume's account owes a great deal to Malebranche's account of the mechanical communication of passions. But Hume does not assume that sympathy produces exactly the same passion in us as we imagine in another, particularly because the transfer may alter the object of the passion. For instance, sympathy can convert the love and admiration others feel for us into pride; indeed, Hume introduces the mechanism of sympathy to explain our “love of fame,” even in cases when we expect no particular advantage from their actions and take no other interest in their opinions. To be sure, the love of fame still represents a communication of “like to like,” since love and pride are both pleasurable passions. But Hume elaborates on sympathy to show how our affective communications can produce very different kinds of passions (cf., James 2005, Schmitter 2010).

Comparison, a mechanism built on sympathy, produces passions with affective tendencies directly opposed to those we sympathize with in others. It works by invoking another principle, superadded to the operations of sympathy: “that objects appear greater or less by a comparison with others” (T II.2.8 375). If, for instance, we come, through sympathy, to feel the unhappy passion of another, we may feel our own (comparatively) happy non-sympathetic passions all the more strongly. The operations of comparison, thus, work to increase the pleasurable (or painful) passions we feel by letting us feel the contrasting painful (or pleasurable) passions of others (but cf. Postema 2005, Schmitter 2010). Hume uses comparison to explain the possibility of envy, and even more, of malice, a sort of “pity reverst,” involving an “unprovok'd desire of producing evil to another” (T II.2.8 377). This differs from hate and other simpler passions, because the desire is unprovoked by any injury or even a desire to obtain some good for ourselves (other than reaping pleasure from the comparison). In this respect, Hume parts company with everyone from Hobbes to Hutcheson, in recognizing the existence of a seemingly disinterested, anti-social emotion. In general, Hume treats comparison as producing socially destructive passions, while sympathy produces sociable ones, but these do not seem to be the inevitable consequences of each mechanism. And Hume does not seem to assume that the production of like from like is the only, or even the primary, way in which the communication of passions promotes social cohesion.

7. “Reason Is and Ought Only to Be the Slave of the Passions”

One of the most notorious of Hume's views about the passions concerns their relation to our practical reason. Hume locates all our motivations in the passions. Perhaps for this reason, he treats the will in his discussion of the direct passions, identifying it as “the internal impression we feel and are conscious of, when we knowingly give rise to any new motion of our body, or new perception of our mind” (T II.3.1 399). If the will did not determine a person's actions, we would have no way to trace those actions to their springs in character, which is the prerequisite for forming moral judgments.

Hume is particularly concerned with analyzing our practical reasoning, our reasoning about how to act. Passions are the engine for all our deeds: without passions we would lack all motivation, all impulse or drive to act, or even to reason (practically or theoretically). This gives at least one sense in which “reason is, and ought only to be the slave of the passions” (T II.3.3 415). Hume also holds that the passions are not themselves directly subject to rational evaluation. In fact, it seems something of a category mistake to think that they could be either rational or irrational. Passions are impressions – strong and lively perceptions with a certain “feel” and a direction, or impulse. Reasoning, however, is a matter of connecting various ideas in order to come to a belief; it may apply to, or even form, the circumstances under which passions arise. But reason can generate no impulse by itself.

For these reasons, many have attributed to Hume a belief-desire model of practical reasoning, in which our ends are given by passions (desires). On this view, reason is in the business of producing beliefs, but our beliefs are relevant only to the means by which we seek to obtain those ends: they do not determine the ends themselves. So, reason has only an instrumental use. But whatever its other virtues, this model does little to explain why reason “ought to be” the slave of the passions. It also seems inappropriate to reduce passions to desires: passions have a great deal more structure than their attractive or aversive directions, important though those may be. What seems central to Hume's view is the inertness of reason, its inability to generate impulses for the mind (see Millgram 1995). And it is this that drives Hume to adopt a sentimentalist basis for the origins of our “moral distinctions” (T III.1.2).

8. The Sentiments and Artificial Virtues

When Hume turns to our moral “sense” in Book III of the Treatise, he largely abandons talk of passions in favor of “sentiment.” He still takes it that our sense of the morality of an action or character is motivating; for one, it moves us to pursue or avoid the action or person. Like Shaftesbury and Hutcheson, Hume also considers our moral judgments to be directed at the voluntary actions of others, which are rooted in motivating emotions, especially insofar as they represent enduring dispositions, or character. Moral sentiments seem to involve an important element of judgment, but they also bear a close relation to motives for action, and so may be considered a species of passion, broadly understood.

However, Hume's moral psychology also adds important elements to the analysis of the passions we have already seen. Hume divides virtues into the natural and the artificial. Both kinds present puzzles about how they become the objects of sentiments, so that we feel that they impose an “obligation.” But artificial virtues are particularly tricky cases, since we have no natural motivation to approve them. Artificial virtues, such as justice, or the somewhat simpler example of promise-keeping, are neither uncommon, nor arbitrary, but they do rest on an artifice, or social convention. Moreover, however useful (or pleasant), the practices informed by those conventions may be in general, particular instances of the behavior they describe may not be. Keeping a promise, say, to respect a deadline, may not promote anyone's good. The difficulty for Hume is to explain why we nonetheless typically experience pleasurable sentiments directed at instances of promise-keeping, despite the artificial foundation of the practice.

Hume's solution to the puzzle is to invoke sympathy, but “an extensive sympathy,” redirected through general rules and the social convention toward society as a whole. This sympathy in turn requires various kinds of correction, provided by adopting “some steady and general points of view” (T III.3.1 581-2), which Hume illustrates through his version of the transition from the state of nature to full-blown society. In the spirit of Shaftesbury and Hutcheson, he begins by appeal to basic other-directed emotions: it is natural and universal for humans to form families and to feel greater affection for members of their families. But such familial generosity is limited in its scope, and can be as much a source of social conflict as any selfish passion. Realizing the problem, we readily find conventions to correct it – conventions established slowly and without any express ‘covenanting.’ What motivates our behavior in establishing such conventions are precisely the natural passions that generated conflict, including limited generosity, but mediated by a greater insight into how to obtain our ends.

Still, we will not generate the sentiments required by the artificial virtues, until we manage to direct our generous passions beyond their natural bounds, allowing us to approve of the justice or honesty of all sorts of people in all sorts of situations, no matter their connection to us. And this means we must somehow acquire genuine sympathy with the public interest as a whole. To do so, Hume demands that sympathy operate to communicate passions between persons who are not immediately present to each other and that it operate counter-factually, according to general rules. In this way, we learn to sympathize from a general point of view. It is that general point of view that allows us to feel the distinctive sentiments of approbation grounding our moral judgments about virtue, whether artificial or natural. Moral virtues will then turn out to be qualities of behavior and character that are either pleasurable (e.g., kindliness or wit) or useful (e.g., parental care, justice, or promise-keeping) considered from the general point of view.

9. The General Point of View and Standards of Appropriateness for the Sentiments

There is a great deal more to be said about how we construct the general point of view. But what is particularly interesting for our purposes is to consider how it figures as a standard for the experience of sentiments. The general point of view both extends the scope of the sentiments we feel, and corrects them by providing some sense of what we ought to feel. To be sure, we may also feel many uncorrected passions, whether prejudices or innocuous preferences for what is naturally connected to us. But Hume emphasizes that the corrections provided by the general point of view are far-ranging, extending beyond the moral sentiments to the formation of aesthetic taste, and influencing even seemingly straightforward perceptual judgments. The general point of view is not, of course, a standard of rationality; rather, it is a standard of appropriateness. It is that standard that allows us to shape, cultivate and constrain our sentiments in ways that provide the sort of stability and reliability that will form the basis for shared judgment.

It is a matter of controversy, however, whether the general point of view alone provides a genuinely normative standard (see, e.g., Korsgaard 1999). It is clear that it allows sentiments to be coordinated across a society, so that much of what its members feel will be more or less uniform and generally accessible, without the vicissitudes to which the uncorrected and idiosyncratic passions of individuals in peculiar circumstances are subject. But this may simply mean that the general point of view levels out sentiments to what is socially average and widely accepted. Hume does seem to think that we have something more robust than social acceptance as a standard for our sentiments. But it is his musings on our aesthetic judgments that may provide the best example of a genuine standard of taste.

10. The Judgment of Taste

The essay “Of the Standard of Taste” begins by admitting the “de gustibus” principle: there is no disputing taste. In many respects, this simply follows from Hume's sentimentalist approach to aesthetic judgments: like moral judgments, they are based on sense and sentiment, not reason. Nevertheless, we have a real standard for taste, in the taste of a good judge who is in the correct position for judgment. In part, the good judge's ability seems a matter of adopting a general point of view so that the judge is not so prejudiced by peculiarities of her own position as to be incapacitated for judging as ‘one’ generally does. This requirement may disqualify some candidates on completely circumstantial grounds, even those who might make perfectly good judges under other circumstances. Parents, for instance, rarely make good judges of their own children's artworks, even when they are professional art critics.

But the good judge must possess specific qualifications, particularly those of practice and experience in judging. Such experience can help judges to filter out peculiarities of their own position, that is, to adopt the general point of view. But it also seems to afford the judge resources that bear on the judging itself. Particularly important to the good judge is “delicacy” in her discernment. Hume provides an example in the story told by Sancho Panza in Don Quixote of the feats of two of his ancestors in wine-tasting. On being presented with what was universally declared a particularly fine “hogshead” of wine, both approved of it, except that one noted a faint touch of leather and the other a tinge of iron. Their judgments were ridiculed until the hogshead was drained and a key on a leathern thong was found at the bottom, “which justified the verdict of Sancho's kinsmen, and confounded those pretended judges who had condemned them” (Hume 1985 235). The good judge should possess the sort of developed perception that allows her to detect fine differences that may nonetheless be relevant to judgment. This is not sufficient for good judgment, but is required for credibility, and can provide a publicly accessible check.

Hume maintains that “the great resemblance between mental and bodily taste will easily teach us to apply this story” (Hume 1985 235). Presumably, he thinks that sensory qualities such as taste are like moral and aesthetic qualities in that they are secondary, not inherent properties of things, “but belong entirely to the sentiment, internal or external” (Hume 1985 235). But they do supervene on properties of things, those “qualities in objects,” which are fitted by nature to produce the particular feelings. The good judge, then, like the wine-tasters of the story, may possess a developed ability to detect those formal qualities in art works, or to descry whatever properties of people's actions might be relevant to the formation of our moral sentiments. The good judge would then be able to justify her judgment by pointing out salient features of what is being judged that others might miss. A good judge will thus be a good critic and teacher of appropriate taste. And so, the good judge may provide standards that are neither completely independent of the sentiments we are fitted to experience, nor merely hostage to the common run of passions.

11. Influences on Later Authors

Hume's influence on later authors may be most evident in those features of his approach that differ from previous treatments of the emotions and moral sense. Certainly, his account of how our sentiments can be developed historically and socially was important to Jean-Jacques Rousseau, and his explanation of the standard in our judgments of taste served as both a model and foil for many later theorists. Adam Smith seems to have taken some of the issues Hume raised about the normative standards for moral judgments particularly seriously in his Theory of the Moral Sentiments (1759). Like Hume, he considers sympathy to provide the engine for such a standard. But on Smith's view, sympathy operates less to communicate the passions we suppose others actually feel than to allow us to imagine what it would be like to be in their place. Sympathy arises from our view of the situation that excites it, and puts us in the position of a spectator on that situation. There are, in fact, a number of such points of view, but they all seem inherently normative, for what the spectator considers is what one ought to feel in the situation, and one form of moral judgment concerns the appropriateness of an agent's response to the situation. Because we can also adopt the stance of a spectator on our own sentiments and actions, we have the resources for evaluating our own emotional reactions; Smith criticizes the moral sense theory of Hutcheson for disallowing the importance, and indeed even the possibility of doing so. Smith's spectator is not exactly the same as Hume's good judge, especially since the sympathetic spectator occupies a normative position independently of constructing a general point of view. But the highly idealized spectator and the sorts of normative checks that can be provided by adopting somewhat different spectator positions can be seen as a response to and development of Hume's analyses of the interactions of our sentiments in creating the general point of view and standards for judgment.