Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to 17th and 18th Century Theories of Emotions

Descartes on the Emotions

1. Introduction

Descartes starts his Passions of the Soul (1649) by lamenting the sorry state of ancient writings on the passions, and declaring that “I shall be obliged to write just as if I were considering a topic that no one had dealt with before me” (AT XI 328, CSM I 328). It is true that he rejects aspects of Aquinas's views and explicitly tasks those cruel philosophers who “require their sage to be insensible” (whom he identifies as the “Cynics,” then considered to represent a particularly austere form of Stoicism). But he also adopts many features of previous accounts. For instance, he uses the Stoic and Galenist notion of animal spirits (tailored to his own mechanistic physics), cites Vives on the physiology of laughter (AT XI 422, CSM I 372), and shows numerous, if rarely acknowledged, debts to Montaigne, Lipsius, and Suarez. Perhaps most notably, he adopts “passion” as his preferred vocabulary, contrasting it with action in a way that harks back to Aristotle.

2. The Project of Theodicy and the Function of the Passions

Much of the context for Descartes's approach to the passions lies in his Meditations on First Philosophy (1641) (and the corresponding sections of the 1644 Principles of Philosophy). As part of a general defense of God's goodness in the face of seeming shortcomings in our nature, the Sixth Meditation seeks to justify the way in which we are equipped to respond to the outside world by experiencing sensations, appetites, and passions. Descartes has already argued that these confused, bodily-based perceptions are the source of much theoretical error, since they tempt us to attribute properties of our sensation to the extended world. Their theoretical confusion, however, is merely the flip side to their practical functionality: such perceptions provide guides for maneuvering our bodies through the world, and ultimately for preserving the mind-body union that constitutes the human being. But practical efficiency comes at the cost of some fallibility. Under non-standard conditions (e.g., when we suffer from illness, or body parts go missing), our signposts may lead us astray. This is because they are generated by purely mechanical laws, according to a machine design that under normal circumstances allows them to serve certain ends, as is the case with a well-built watch. Thus, bodily-based perceptions are explained functionally: they are justified by way of their purposes, but how they serve those ends requires resort to strictly mechanical causation. The functional character, as well as the confusion, of these perceptions seems founded on their mixed ontological status: they are modes that can “not be referred either to the mind alone or to the body alone” (Principles, AT VIII 23, CSM I 209, see also Hoffman 1990 and Brown, 2006). Although the Meditations concentrates on our disposition to experience sense qualia, which normally mark qualities and differences between qualities of external things in relation to us, Descartes's defense may work better for the appetites and passions. For these perceptions seem to have a built-in evaluative component that is directly related to their purposiveness (see Schmitter 2007). Later works address this feature of the passions explicitly.

3. Passions, Medicine and Freedom

The relation between the emotions and health is the topic of the correspondence between Descartes and Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia in 1643 and 1645. Starting with a letter of 6 May 1643 (AT III 660, Shapiro 2007 61-2), Elisabeth queries Descartes on how such metaphysically disparate things as mind and body can act on each other, to which Descartes responds by emphasizing that the mind and body form a genuine union. But by 1645, the topic shifts slightly to whether the mind can control the body, particularly its passions. Descartes diagnoses a “low grade fever” from which Elisabeth has been suffering as caused by sadness or melancholy, and recommends the familiarly Stoic-sounding remedy of reading Seneca, while reflecting on her mind and its ability to master bodily-based passions. Elisabeth takes exception to this suggestion, remarking that her “body imbued with a large part of the weaknesses of my sex … is afflicted very easily by the afflictions of the soul” (Elisabeth to Descartes, 24 May 1645, AT IV 208, Shapiro 2007 88). Despite the reference to her particular weakness, her point is general: there are certain bodily conditions – illness, weakness, stress, or just a “touch of the vapors” – that interfere with the mental activities of reasoning and willing, make us more prone to the passions, and thereby compromise our ability to apply the cure Descartes has recommended. Elisabeth here raises an important issue for the kind of neo-Stoic view Descartes advances in their correspondence: even if some people manage resolutely to overcome the passions and achieve happiness, is it possible to do so “without the assistance of that which does not depend absolutely on the will?” (Descartes to Elisabeth, 1 September 1645, AT IV 281-2, modified from CSMK 262.) This question haunts many other early modern treatments of the emotions, and Spinoza in particular, adopts views that seem very close to Elisabeth's concerns.

4. The Definition of the Passions of the Soul

The correspondence with Elisabeth prodded Descartes to produce his most important text on the emotions, the Passions of the Soul, in response to her demand to “define the passions, in order to know them better” (Elisabeth to Descartes, 13 September 1645, AT IV 289, Shapiro 2007 110). The Passions of the Soul may not be a completely satisfactory explanation of mind-body union, but it does provide the definition Elisabeth asked for, an intricate taxonomy of the passions, a description of their bodily causes, effects and function, and an account of the “discipline of virtue” that addresses the means and extent to which we can regulate the passions.

Descartes's definition of “passion” works by honing in on stricter and stricter senses of the term. In the first place, passions are simply those “functions” of the soul that are not actions: namely, perceptions. But since actions, such as volitions, can themselves be perceived, Descartes prefers to restrict the term to those perceptions caused by the body. Even this is a bit too broad, and so Descartes defines passions proper as “those perceptions, sensations or emotions of the soul which we refer particularly to it, and which are caused, maintained and strengthened by some movement of the spirits” (AT XI 349, CSM I 338-9). Descartes thereby locates passions squarely in perception, although he gives a nod to other views by calling them “emotions” (motions, changes, agitations, disturbances). Referring them to the soul allows him to distinguish passions from other bodily-based perceptions, such as the sense-perceptions we refer to external objects. What Descartes means by “referred to the soul” here is none too clear, except insofar as he maintains that the experience of the passions cannot be localized in some part of the body (as can feelings of pain or heat), and indeed, “we do not normally know any proximate cause to which we can refer them” (AT XI 347, CSM I 337). (Note that Descartes uses “cause” in several different senses throughout the Passions; cause here cannot be identified with the object.) The last part of the definition – that the passions are “caused, maintained and strengthened by some movement of the spirits” – is also important for differentiating the passions from non-bodily-based perceptions, such as voluntary imaginings. The “spirits” whose movement Descartes discusses here are the animal spirits of Galenist physiology, reinterpreted in light of Harvey's discovery of the circulatory system and his own mechanist principles: they are simply fine and lively parts of the blood, rarified by the heart and brain, and passing through the brain to the nerves and then to the muscles to produce bodily motions. The physiology of the passions is an important component in the accounts of the causes, effects, functions and regulation of the passions. Each of the main passions receives a detailed description of the bodily changes that accompany it, such as changes in color, body temperature, facial expression, disposition of the limbs and the like, which can in turn be attributed to the movements of the spirits and heart.

The principal effect of the passions is to “move and dispose the soul to want the things for which they prepare the body” (AT XI 359, CSM I 343). They act on the soul by way of “the agitation by which the spirits move the little gland [i.e., the pineal gland] in the middle of the brain” (AT XI 371, CSM I 349), which thereby excite various perceptions in the soul. (For further discussion of this topic, see the related entry Descartes and the Pineal Gland.) But the pineal gland can be moved by many different causes. For this reason, Descartes admits that many other kinds of perceptions and volitions stand in close causal and experiential relations to the passions proper. Particularly important are what Descartes calls “intellectual” or “internal emotions,” such as the intellectual devotion felt when contemplating the idea of the true God, or the sadness that stems from reflecting on my errors. These have the soul as their cause, and so are properly speaking, volitions, but they are also affective states, and in embodied creatures such as we are they may be difficult to disentangle from bodily-based passions.

Each genuine passion is characterized by an account of its motivational force (for which the “reference to the soul” is important), paired with a description of how it “represents” its object, which under normal conditions is also the cause of the series of bodily changes resulting in the passion. Although he does not deny that each passion has some distinctive felt character, Descartes offers no description of it other than the presentation of the object under some evaluative description and its effect on the will. In general, the “principal and most common causes” are objects, considered according to “the various ways in which they may harm or benefit us, or in general have importance for us” (AT XI 372, CSM I 349). Passions are not judgments, since judgments require an act of the will to affirm or deny. But they do have complex, “propositional” contents: through the passion of fear, I perceive that an oncoming train is dangerous to me, viz., I perceive it as dangerous. It is because these contents are evaluative that the passions will be motivating in ways that are normally functional.

5. The Classification of the Passions

Descartes identifies six “primitive” passions: wonder, which he calls “the first of all the passions,” love and hatred, desire, and joy and sadness. They are each distinct: desire, for instance, is directed at the future, whereas love is a passion involving a “consent by which we consider ourselves from the present on as joined with which we love, in the sense that we imagine a whole of which we think of ourselves only as one part and the loved thing as another” (AT XI 387, modified from CSM I 356). And each of these passions, except for wonder, have a built-in direction of motion, either appetitive or aversive depending on how they evaluate their objects – a feature that serves as an important organizing principle for Descartes. On this basis, Descartes opposes love to hatred, and joy to sadness. Desire has no opposite, since it comprises both appetites and aversions.

Descartes also accepts “an unlimited number” of further, specific passions, which he calls combinations of the six primitive passions. But he seems to find his most important taxonomical principles elsewhere, e.g., in the passion's intensity (timidity is different from terror), whether its object is oneself or another (self-esteem differs from veneration), and in further modifications of the object and its relation to us (love is distinguished from the devotion we feel for an object “greater” than we are, such as God). Descartes allows that some passions involve mixtures, even contrary mixtures as in hope and fear. But since passions literally push the pineal gland in a particular direction, movements in different directions tend to cancel each other out. Passions seem to ‘combine’ most readily by producing trains of passions: desire may give rise to love, which may in turn generate joy. Trains of passions may involve passions with contrary directions, but this produces the rather uncomfortable sensations of remorse, or repentance. In fact, Descartes takes it as a basic explanatory principle that the passions do not oppose each other, and rejects the Thomist distinction between irascible and concupiscible appetites, and correlative divisions in the soul itself (AT XI 379, CSM I 352). The sort of conflicts that this distinction was supposed to explain Descartes instead attributes to different causes, to movements coming from the soul (the will) and to movements originating in the body, which can, but need not, propel the pineal gland in contrary directions.

6. Wonder and Generosity

Perhaps the most distinctive of the passions that Descartes identifies, however is the one that involves no evaluation of its object: wonder [admiration] merely presents its object as something novel or unusual. As such, wonder produces no change in the heart or the blood, which would prepare the body for movement. But it does involve the motions of the animal spirits through the brain and into the muscles, thereby fixing an “impression” of the object in the brain. And that explains the function of wonder: to “learn and retain in our memory things of which we were previously ignorant” (AT XI 384, CSM I 354). It is our response to those features of the world worthy of our consideration – something useful both for the preservation of the mind-body union and for the soul itself in its pursuit of knowledge. Descartes's understanding of wonder may well recall Aristotle's famous dictum that philosophy begins with wonder. But wherever it begins, Descartes certainly does not think it should end there. Wonder can become excessive, and make us crave novelty simply for its own sake. Wonder is only functional if it prompts us to resolve it in the satisfaction of knowledge.

Another distinctive passion Descartes describes is generosity [generosité], which produces a kind of self-directed wonder, or esteem, grounded in our recognition “that nothing really belongs to us other than the free disposition of our volitions,” along with sensing “in ourselves at the same time a firm and constant resolution to use them well” (AT XI 446, slightly altered from CSM I 384). It is this passion that seems to be the keystone for “the pursuit of virtue,” in particular because it “serves as a remedy against all the disorders of the passions” (AT XI 447, CSM I 385). And although generosity is a perception directed at the self, combining a knowledge of what is truly important in and for ourselves with the will to act on the basis of that knowledge, it seems to generate like esteem for others: generous people do good without self-interest, are courteous, gracious and obliging, and live free from contempt, jealousy, envy, hatred, fear and anger for others. The key seems to be that generous people “are entirely masters of their passions” (AT XI 448, modified from CSM I 385).

7. The Remedy for the Passions

But Descartes does not think that passions should be eradicated wholesale: they are the sources of “the sweetest pleasures in this life” and “are all good in their nature” (AT XI 485, modified from CSM I 403) – with the possible exception of terror. Indeed, since they are functional by nature, it is not entirely clear why they should require remedy. True, like sense-perceptions, they can misfunction under non-standard circumstances. But unlike sense-perceptions, which give us material for error when we take them at face value in our theoretical reasonings, our passions do not seem to tempt us into thinking they reflect the independent structure of the world. It may be that Descartes holds that there is a conflict between the good for the mind-body union (preservation) and the good for the soul alone. This is something Malebranche insists on, and Descartes does allow that the two goods may fail to coincide (e.g., joy is always good for the soul, but not necessarily for the union). But his demand for mastery and control seems to be motivated just as much by the practical concerns of our embodied state. He identifies the control of the passions quite generally with virtue, and virtue with happiness. Perhaps though, the need for a remedy arises from the mechanical causation governing the physiology of the passions: it makes the passions simply too coarse to steer us as precisely as they could with further correction of their “excesses.”

In any case, Descartes clearly allows that our passions, based as they are on internal bodily dispositions to be moved by external objects, can conflict with our rationally considered evaluations of those objects – or what would be our evaluations, had we the time for proper deliberation. The discipline of virtue averts such conflict by allowing the soul to improve on untutored nature in its dealings with its passions. The most important thing, Descartes tells us, is for the soul to equip itself with “firm and determinate judgments bearing upon the knowledge of good and evil, which the soul has resolved to follow in guiding its conduct” (AT XI 367, CSM I 347). But this is just the first step, for we should also alter our dispositions to feel the passions, by way of a kind of internal bodily training generating new and improved “habits” (AT XI 369, CSM I 348). What constitutes a “habit” is a matter of some controversy: it might be like the process of coming to perceive certain sounds as words, whereby we produce novel, learned conjunctions of perceptions and movements in the pineal gland. (This seems to be the view of Spinoza.) Or it might be a matter of the sort of physiological changes that take place during the training of hunting dogs, changes solely in body structure and movements, e.g., alterations in the internal structure of the brain and the subsequent coursing of the animal spirits. (This seems to be the view of Malebranche.) (On this issue, see Hoffman 1991, Shapiro 2003, and Schmitter 2005.)

8. The Influence of the Imagination

The key to developing those habits that “stop the bodily movements which accompany” certain passions seems to lie in the body, particularly in the corporeal imagination (a part of the brain) and its practices. Descartes notes that an effective way of countering an undesirable passion is to imagine a new and different state of affairs, or response to the state of affairs. The act of imagining causes brain events, and so can serve as a voluntary, if indirect means to change the course of the animal spirits and eliminate the causes of some undesirable passion. More generally, entertaining any thought at all, especially a clear and distinct thought that we cannot help but affirm, carries an affective dimension that will in turn prompt movements in the imagination and the passions. The long-term consequences of such voluntary, imaginative practice is to reshape our internal bodily “dispositions” so that they produce specific passions under the appropriate, rationally endorsed circumstances.

For these and other reasons, remedying the passions is closely related to the maintenance of health. The discipline of virtue, in particular, is presented as a kind of therapeutic and gymnastic regimen for the soul, one that corrects its weaknesses and increases its strength. It is a regimen whereby the soul harnesses the imagination and the body in general to work on itself. Mutatis mutandi, controlling the passions can have important consequences for bodily health. Exercising control over the passions means that we are simultaneously exercising control over the internal motions of the body – the beatings of the heart, circulation of the blood and heat, the disposition of the animal spirits, and so forth. It seems a fortunate fact that the way reason directs us to shape our passions coincides with the passionate production of healthful bodily movements (at least if our bodies are in even minimally working order). This accord between the education of the passions and the cultivation of health may indeed be Descartes's trump card for his claim that the passions are good by nature.

9. Influences on Later Authors

Of course, it is this picture of harmony between the soul and the mind-body union and the prospect of complete mastery through resolute practice that Elisabeth found implausibly rosy. Spinoza and Malebranche will agree with her assessment, and each will – in different ways – emphasize our dependence on what is out of our control. But Descartes's project remained extremely important, shaping the classificatory and explanatory apparatus of theories of the emotions for the next century and a half. This is true even of those who owed their main allegiances elsewhere, as was the case with the neo-Epicurean Walter Charleton. Henry More simply inserted chunks of the Passions of the Soul in his Enchiridion ethicum, despite also appropriating bits and pieces from elsewhere (including an odd version of the distinction between concupiscible and irascible passions). Even ground-breaking philosophers felt his influence: Descartes's taxonomy, for instance, clearly played a role in Hobbes's account in the Leviathan, despite the very different theoretical styles of the two philosophers. And Descartes's general approach to the passions as functional remained a bone of contention for generations to come, one fought over in rather different ways by Hobbes, Malebranche and Spinoza.