Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Dispositions

Appendix: Quiddistically Different Worlds, Irremediable Ignorance, and Regress of Powers

In this Appendix we will present some of the most remarkable arguments and criticisms the dispositionalists and categoricalists have traded. One important criticism of categoricalism concerns two possible worlds that are merely ’quiddistically’ different over properties (Black 2000; Kistler 2002; Mumford 2004; Bird 2005b, 2007a; Schaffer 2005; Lewis 2009). Consider a possible world that is the same as our actual world except that mass plays exactly the same theoretical roles as electric charge actually does and conversely. The categoricalist, who typically invokes quidditism which asserts that the essence of a property is given independently of its theoretical roles, seems to be under pressure to hold that this world should be distinguished from the actual world. Black (2000, p. 94) urges, however, that our intuition dictates that the distinction between the possible world and our actual world is a distinction without difference. In view of the fact that the true and complete physical theory of the possible world is exactly the same as ours, there seems to be no point in counting it as being distinct from our actual world. This is echoed by Bird (2005a, p. 450) who says that this world is just the actual world plus a decision to swap the names ‘electric charge’ and ‘mass’. This intuition can be served by saying that the essence of a property is constituted by its theoretical roles. When in a possible world a property plays exactly the same theoretical roles as mass actually does, then it is as a matter of fact mass, and mutatis mutandis for other properties.

This thought experiment apparently has some intuitive appeal. It would be hazardous, though, to derive immediately from it that, for every property, its essence wholly consists of its theoretical roles as one may well object that one such thought experiment is not yet enough to establish the universal generalization that, for any pair of properties, even if we swap their theoretical roles, we won't get a truly different possible world. Moreover, it is questionable how much argumentative force it has against the categoricalist. Notice that the properties involved in it, namely, the properties of electric charge and mass, are generally taken to be dispositional. If so, the categoricalist, who firmly holds that all real properties are categorical, might insist that they are not real properties and question the legitimacy of talk of their essences. Of course, the dispositionalist probably has much to say in defiance of this response. She might respond that, given that the properties of electric charge and mass play key theoretical roles in fundamental sciences, it is abominable to deny their reality. She might alternatively attempt to build an analogical example to the thought experiment under discussion in terms of properties generally taken to be categorical properties, say triangularity and rectangularity.

The second criticism of categoricalism, due to Shoemaker (1980, 1998), goes that, whilst quidditism is typically invoked by the categoricalist, it has epistemologically disastrous consequences (see also Robinson 1993, Jackson 1998, Black 2000, Lewis 2009). As noted earlier, quidditism is the view that the essences of properties consist of something logically different from their theoretical roles—in Shoemaker's terms, their causal potentialities. It is claimed, however, that this opens the possibilities of a property that has no potential whatsoever for contributing to causal powers, of two properties that have exactly the same potential for contributing to causal powers, of an object that undergoes a radical change in properties without undergoing any change in its causal powers, and of an object that undergoes a radical change in its causal powers without undergoing any change in its properties. But we have epistemic access to properties only via their causal powers. What follows from this observation is that, if these possibilities are real possibilities, then we are pressed to say that ‘nothing could be good evidence that the overall resemblance between two things is greater than two other things’ (Shoemaker 1980, p. 215)—because there is no possible evidence about how many causally impotent properties two things share—that ‘it is impossible for us even to know that two things resemble one another by sharing a single property’ (ibid), and that ‘it is impossible for us to know that something has retained a property over time, or that something has undergone a change with respect to the properties that underlie its causal powers’ (ibid). Shoemaker insists, though, it is highly implausible that we have such an irremediable ignorance about properties.

It is hard to dispute the validity of Shoemaker's charge of scepticism. It is up for debate how much weight it carries, though. Shoemaker stresses that this sceptical consequence is costly enough to evaporate the credibility of quidditism, and therefore that of categoricalism. By the same token, Bird (2005b, p. 453) says, ‘we do not want our metaphysics of properties to condemn us to the necessary ignorance of them’. Lewis (2009, p. 211), conversely, endorses the sceptical consequence and quips ‘Who ever promised me that I was capable in principle of knowing everything?’. No consensus has yet been reached as to the force of the charge of scepticism against quidditism. See Whittle 2006 for the claim that quidditism doesn't entail scepticism unless it is combined with an unreasonably strong account of identification. See also Langton 2004, Schaffer 2005, and Ney 2007 for the claim that quidditism doesn't entail scepticism unless it is combined with an implausible infallibilist account of knowledge.

Let us now turn to a criticism of dispositionalism—known as ‘Always packing never traveling argument’—whose key thought is that dispositionalism is caught in a certain sort of vicious regress or circularity (Campbell 1976; Swinburne 1980; Foster 1982; Robinson 1982; Blackburn 1990; Armstrong 1997; Heil 2003; Molnar 2003; Chakravartty 2007; Bird 2007b)—there is a different type of charge of infinite regress due to Psillos (2006) but it is repudiated by Marmodoro (2009). Armstrong (1997, p. 80) says:

Can it be that everything is potency, and act is the mere shifting around of potencies? … Given a purely Dispositionalist account of properties, particulars would seem to be always re-packing their bags as they change their properties, yet never taking a journey from potency to act. For ‘act’, on this view, is no more than a different potency.

There are different ways of articulating this criticism. What Bird (2007b) takes as the most pressing starts with the assumption that the essential characterisation of disposition D1 must include a reference to its manifestation M1 (cf. see Williams 2010 and Lowe 2010). On dispositionalism that all properties have dispositional essences, however, the property instantiated in this manifestation is also another disposition D2. But dispositions are dispositions to bring about certain manifestations. Consequently, D2's essential characterisation must be given in terms of its own manifestation M2. This leads to either an infinite regress or circularity. Bird correctly stresses that both of them are problematic for dispositionalism. But he goes further to argue that this problem can be overcome by appealing to what is known as graph theory, contending that it is possible for the structure of manifestation relations to uniquely determine the identity and distinctiveness of dispositions. But this is disputed by Lowe (2010).

We have thus far outlined some of the criticisms and arguments proponents of dispositionalism and categoricalism bring forth for consideration. It is worth noting that the possibility of ‘bare’ dispositions is often brought to bear on this debate, for, categoricalism apparently necessitates the impossibility of bare dispositions, i.e., that all dispositions must have distinct causal bases, whilst dispositionalism doesn't. It is indeed claimed that one of the most conclusive considerations in favour of dispositionalism is that fundamental properties like spin are bare dispositions (Mumford 2006). This issue is discussed in section 4.1.