Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Wed Jul 26, 2006; substantive revision Thu Jan 5, 2012

A glass has certain dispositions, for example the disposition to shatter when struck. But what is this disposition? It seems on the one hand to be a perfectly real property, a genuine respect of similarity common to glasses, china cups, and anything else fragile. Yet on the other hand, the glass's disposition seems mysterious, ‘ethereal’ (as Goodman (1954) put it) in a way that, say, its size and shape are not. For its disposition, it seems, has to do only with its possibly shattering in certain conditions. In general, it seems that nothing about the actual behavior of an object is ever necessary for it to have the dispositions it has. Many objects differ from one another with respect to their dispositions in virtue of their merely possible behaviors, and this is a mysterious way for objects to differ.

Much of the recent work on the topic of dispositions has been focused on attempts to dispel this mystery by explaining dispositions in other, more readily understandable terms. The topic of dispositions is interesting in its own right. But it derives further interest from the fact that appeals to dispositions have been made in just about every area of philosophy. There are explicitly dispositional analyses, for example, of mental states, of colors, of value, of properties, and of conditionals. Philosophers interested in just about anything should be interested in dispositions.

1. Analyses of Disposition Ascriptions

Many terms have been used to describe what we mean by dispositions: ‘power’ (Locke's term), ‘dunamis’ (Aristotle's term), ‘ability’, ‘potency’, ‘capability’, ‘tendency’, ‘potentiality’, ‘proclivity’, ‘capacity’, and so forth. In a very general sense, they mean disposition, or otherwise something close by. To avoid confusion, however, we will stick to the term ‘disposition’.

As noted earlier, philosophical interests in dispositions principally centre around the issue of how to explain them in more readily understandable terms. This issue came to the prominence in the early 20th century when philosophers aspired to construct an empiricist language in which all meaningful sentences including dispositional sentences can be analyzed in observational and extensional-logical terms. One early attempt at analyzing disposition ascriptions on the empiricist program is made by Carnap (1928, 1936–7) who considers the so-called reduction sentences as a way of introducing dispositional expressions into our language:

  • R. For each object x, if x is put into water, it is soluble iff it dissolves,

where the conditional is understood as a material conditional. The idea behind R is that we can meaningfully tell whether or not a given item is soluble only if it is put into water. R thus provides a rule for how to introduce the dispositional predicate ‘soluble’ in application to items that have in fact been put into water. But R is silent about whether x is soluble when it is not put into water, and this means that we cannot use R to completely eliminate the predicate ‘soluble’ from the language. Though this is what Carnap explicitly embraced, many philosophers found it deeply problematic. And so philosophers of empiricist leanings continued the search for a definition schema of dispositional expressions in an extensional language (Kaila 1939, 1942; Storer 1951).

Notwithstanding these attempts, however, it came to be widely accepted that disposition ascriptions cannot be analyzed in an extensional language (Pap 1958; Sellars 1958; Burks 1951, 1955). This had the effect of turning philosophers' attention to the connection between disposition ascriptions and counterfactual or subjunctive conditionals. In fact, it was generally recognised from the very beginning of philosophical research about dispositions that disposition ascriptions are closely linked with counterfactual conditionals: ‘x is soluble at t’ is associated with ‘x would dissolve if put into water at t’. This idea, however, was overlooked for decades partly due to the then popular epistemology of radically empiricist kind and partly due to the lack of a proper semantic understanding of counterfactual conditionals. But it later came to be brought into the spotlight largely due to the revival of the philosophy of modality from the early 1970s. For a historical survey of the debate regarding conceptual analysis of dispositions, see Malzkorn 2001 and Bird 2012.

1.1 Conventional and Canonical Dispositions

As is already clear, analyses of dispositions usually proceed on the assumption that, for any disposition, we can identify its stimulus conditions and manifestations. It is typically said that dispositions would exhibit their ‘characteristic manifestations’ under some ‘stimulus conditions’. However, most conventional dispositional predicates—‘fragile’, ‘soluble’, ‘malleable’ and the like—make no explicit reference to the stimulus conditions and manifestations for the properties they express and the assumption that we are nonetheless in a position to identify those stimulus conditions and manifestations is controversial. The stimulus condition and manifestation of (water-)solubility are typically assumed to be the event of being put into water and the event of dissolving, respectively, and perhaps uncontroversially so. But what are the manifestations of fragility? Something like shattering or cracking, it seems. But what about splintering, or breaking cleanly in two, or, as with a fragile house of cards, collapsing? It seems hard to say. And what exactly are the stimulus conditions of fragility? Striking, it seems. But what about twisting or shaking? We are at a loss. But do these questions have to do with philosophical understanding of dispositions at all?

Partly due to the difficulty of specifying precisely the stimulus conditions and manifestations of a disposition and partly due to the doubt over its philosophical relevance, philosophers find it useful to distinguish two sorts of disposition, or alternatively, two ways of referring to dispositions. Conventional dispositions are typically expressed by such simple predicates as ‘fragile’, ‘soluble’, ‘flammable’, and so on, which include no explicit reference to their stimulus conditions and manifestations. Canonical dispositions, on the other hand, are explicit about their stimulus conditions and manifestations, couched in the overtly dispositional locution. Some examples of canonical dispositions are the disposition to break in response to being struck, the disposition to cause death in response to being ingested, and so on. Obviously, the two ways of expressing dispositional properties are related to one another. As noted earlier, (water-)solubility might be identified with the disposition to dissolve in response to being put into water although this kind of identification is not readily available in many other cases of conventional disposition. This distinction between conventional and canonical dispositions allows us to keep questions about the adequacy of different analyses of dispositions sharply distinct from questions about how to identify the stimulus conditions and manifestations of particular dispositions.

Having introduced this distinction, we can facilitate the quest for an analysis of dispositions by separating two issues, the issue of providing a conceptual analysis of canonical dispositions and the issue of explaining conventional dispositions in terms of canonical dispositions. What do we mean by saying that x is poisonous? The first step for answering this question is to transform the conventional disposition of being poisonous into the corresponding (group of) canonical disposition(s) by specifying its stimulus conditions and manifestations. The second step is to seek a conceptual analysis of the canonical disposition(s) at hand. On this ‘two-step’ approach, first taken by Lewis (1997), the so-called conditional analyses of dispositions we will discuss below are designed to help with the second step, saying how to analyze canonical dispositions in terms of counterfactual conditionals. This approach has the advantage of allowing us to clarify what it takes to give an analysis of dispositions.

1.2 The Simple Conditional Analysis and Counterexamples

The simplest analysis of dispositions in terms of counterfactual conditionals is the Simple Conditional Analysis:

  • SCA. An object is disposed to M when C iff it would M if it were the case that C.

Notice that the analysandum of SCA is an ascription of a schematic canonical disposition. SCA has been explicitly endorsed by Ryle (1963), Goodman (1954), and Quine (1960) and implicitly by countless others.

Counterexamples to SCA first raised by Martin (1994) exploit the fact that some dispositions are ‘finkish’ in the sense that the conditions for an object's acquiring or losing disposition D might be the same as D's stimulus conditions. Suppose that an electrical wire is live just in case it has the canonical disposition to conduct electricity when touched by a conductor. (This is an artificial definition that might differ from a dictionary definition of ‘live’.) SCA then entails that a wire is live iff it would conduct electricity if touched by a conductor. Suppose now that a dead wire is connected to an electro-fink, a device which senses when the wire is about to be touched by a conductor, and which makes the wire live in every such circumstance. If the wire were touched by a conductor then, thanks to the work of the device, the wire would become live, and so would conduct electricity. Hence the wire would conduct electricity if touched by a conductor. Being dead, however, it is not disposed to conduct electricity if touched by a conductor. The device can also operate on a reverse cycle, attaching to a naturally live wire but removing its property of being live if ever it is touched by a conductor. In this case, although the wire is disposed to conduct electricity when touched by a conductor, the ‘reverse-cycle’ fink ensures that the associated counterfactual conditional is false. Martin's examples are special cases of what R. K. Shope (1978) called ‘The Conditional Fallacy in Contemporary Philosophy’, roughly the fallacy of ignoring the fact that, in a purported conditional analysis, the truth or falsity of the analysandum might depend on the truth or falsity of the antecedent of the conditional analysans.

Another kind of counterexample to SCA, due to Johnston (1992) and Bird (1998), involves a fragile glass that is carefully protected by packing material. It is claimed that the glass is disposed to break when struck but, if struck, it wouldn't break thanks to the work of the packing material. There is an important difference between this example and Martin's: the packing material would prevent the breaking of the glass not by removing its disposition to break when struck but by blocking the process that would otherwise lead from striking to breaking. This difference will be important in the context of evaluating Lewis's analysis of dispositions in section 1.4. The packing material is called a masker (Johnston) or antidote (Bird) to the glass's disposition at issue (see Choi 2003 for a refinement of the masking counterexample to SCA).

Still another kind of counterexample to SCA, discussed by Smith (1977), Prior, Pargetter & Jackson (1982), Lewis (1997), and Armstrong (1997), involves an interfering factor in virtue of which x mimics the manifestation of disposition D although it does not possess D. When a styrofoam dish is struck, it makes a distinctive sound. The Hater of Styrofoam is within earshot of it. What if it were struck? The Hater of Styrofoam would hear the distinctive sound and tear the styrofoam dish apart. It seems evident that the dish is not disposed to break when struck. If struck, however, it would break due to the interference of the Hater of Styrofoam, which goes against SCA. Here the Hater of Styrofoam is called a mimicker of the disposition to break when struck, meaning that it makes it the case that the dish, which does not have the disposition, mimics its manifestation. (This example is due to Lewis 1997.)

Notice that finking, masking and mimicking situations are ubiquitous (Fara 2005). Extremely fragile and valuable objects, for example, are routinely protected by various kinds of packaging material. See also Bird (1998) for his famous example of nuclear pile.

1.3 Defending the Simple Conditional Analysis

Despite the apparent force, however, it is not universally agreed that these examples undermine SCA. Some philosophers insist that SCA, when properly understood, is not susceptible at all to the alleged counterexamples, while some others maintain that they do refute SCA but they can be avoided by suitable sophistications of it. The first position is supported by Choi (2006, 2008) and Gundersen (2002), who challenges the assumption about what dispositions an object possesses in each of the alleged counterexamples. They emphasise that when the glass is protected by the packing material it is no longer disposed to break when struck; rather, it is disposed to break when struck in the absence of the packing material. This is in line with SCA since the glass would indeed break if struck in the absence of the packing material although it wouldn't break if struck under its current conditions—mutatis mutandis for the example of reverse-cycle finks. Similarly, Choi suggests that when the styrofoam dish is in the neighborhood of the Hater of Styrofoam, it is indeed disposed to break when struck; it is not disposed to break when struck in the absence of the Hater of Styrofoam. This suggestion is consistent with SCA since the dish wouldn't break if struck in the absence of the Hater of Styrofoam although it would break if struck under its current conditions—mutatis mutandis for the example of finks.

This tactic can be readily generalised so as to distinguish two dispositions, the simple disposition whose stimulus condition and manifestation are the event of being struck and the event of breaking, respectively, on the one hand, and the complex disposition whose stimulus condition and manifestation are the event of being struck in the absence of finks, reversecycle finks, maskers, and mimickers and the event of breaking, respectively, on the other. The simple counterfactual conditional associated with the first disposition (namely, ‘if x were struck it would break’) is false in the examples of reverse-cycle finks and maskers and true in the examples of finks and mimickers but the ascription of the first disposition (namely, ‘x is disposed to break if struck’) correspondingly has the same truth value in each example; meanwhile, the ascription of the second disposition (namely, ‘x is disposed to break if struck in the absence of finks, reversecycle finks, maskers, and mimickers)’ is true in the examples of reverse-cycle finks and maskers and false in the examples of finks and mimickers but the simple counterfactual conditional associated with the second disposition (namely, ‘if x were struck in the absence of finks, reversecycle finks, maskers, and mimickers it would break’) correspondingly has the same truth value in each example.

Manley & Wasserman (2008) object that this defence of SCA falls prey to what they call the problem of ‘Achilles' heels’ (for more on Manley & Wasserman's objection, see Bonevac, Dever & Sosa forthcoming; Choi forthcoming b; Manley & Wasserman forthcoming). Another line of criticism of Choi and Gundersen's strategy is to appeal to the intrinsicness of dispositions, which we will discuss in the next section.

1.4 Sophisticated Analyses

The typical reaction to the counterexamples is to take them to motivate a sophisticated conditional analysis. Versions of sophisticated analyses of dispositions have been offered by Prior (1985), Lewis (1997), Malzkorn (2000), Mellor (2000), Fara (2005), and Manley & Wasserman (2008). Here we will focus on Lewis's, Fara's, and Manley & Wasserman's analyses.

Lewis (1997) points out that if Martin's examples are to succeed as counterexamples to SCA then we must suppose that x's dispositions are intimately related to its intrinsic properties. For consider again Martin's example of an apparently dead wire attached to an electro-fink. Choi and Gundersen's defence of SCA rests on the insistence that the wire is not dead but live. But we can imagine its intrinsic duplicate unconnected to an electro-fink, which is unquestionably dead. Choi and Gundersen's defence therefore has the consequence that whether the wire is live or dead is an extrinsic matter. When Martin's examples are supplemented with the assumption that dispositions involved in the examples are intrinsic to their bearers, therefore, this will preclude Choi and Gundersen's defence of SCA. And so, Lewis, subscribing to the Intrinsic Dispositions Thesis (for short, IDT) that all dispositions are intrinsic to their bearers, concludes that Martin's examples have left no hope for SCA. But is IDT true? We will discuss it later in section 5.

Lewis's proposal (with some simplifications) is:

  • RCA. An object x is disposed to M when C iff x has an intrinsic property B such that, if it were the case that C, and if x were to retain B for a sufficient time, then C and B would jointly cause x to M.

Lewis's amendment enables us to circumvent the problem of finks and reverse-cycle finks. Martin's live wire connected to the reverse-cycle fink, for example, is correctly predicted to be live. For the wire has an intrinsic property—the property of having free electrons, say—such that, if it were touched by a conductor, and if it were to retain that property for a sufficient time, then the wire would conduct electricity (because of being touched and having the property).

It seems, though, that Lewis's amendment doesn't help with the problems of maskers and mimickers (Bird 1998; Fara 2005; Choi 2005a). Recall the fragile glass carefully protected with the packing material. The glass, it is thought, is disposed to break when struck. What if it were struck? It would retain all of its molecular structures for a sufficient time. But it would not break because of the masking operation of the packing material. So RCA seems to fail. Similarly, RCA doesn't avoid the problem of mimickers. The styrofoam dish, if struck, would break by the mimicking operation of the Hater of Styrofoam. Note that, if struck, the dish would retain for a sufficient time an intrinsic property, say, the microstructure responsible for its distinctive sound and, further, this intrinsic property would be a cause of the breaking. The prediction by RCA is therefore that the styrofoam dish is disposed to break when struck, which might be claimed to be counterintuitive.

In an effort to deflect the problem of maskers, Lewis employs what Manley & Wasserman (2008) name the strategy of getting specific. He suggests that we have a choice. We might, on the one hand, say that the protected glass is disposed to break when struck without the packing material; or we might say, instead, that it is disposed to break when struck but this disposition is masked by the packing material. Lewis insinuates that the first option is preferable to the second one. The first option being taken, however, one may well insist that the glass is not disposed to break when struck, which neutralises the problem of maskers. (Note that the strategy of getting specific is basically the same as the one Choi and Gundersen take to deal with the problems of finks, reverse-finks, and mimickers as well as the problem of maskers.)

Lewis's response to the problem of mimickers, on the other hand, is to invoke the idea that the manifestation of fragility is not simply x's breaking but x's breaking through a certain direct and standard process. The styrofoam dish, if struck, would break but not through a certain direct and standard process for fragility, a process that does not involve the Hater of Styrofoam's intervention. Then the dish is not fragile as it is not disposed to break through a certain direct and standard process if struck. Having explained away the intuition that the dish is not fragile, it opens the possibility of insisting that, given that the dish is situated within the earshot of the Hater of Styrofoam, it is indeed disposed to break when struck, which neutralises the problem of mimickers. See Choi 2005a for a criticism of Lewis's response.

We have three comments to add on Lewis's responses. The first comment is that Lewis denies that the problems of maskers and mimickers throw light on the analysis of dispositionality that philosophers intend to attain by the conditional analysis of dispositions. On his view, they touch upon merely the pragmatic issue of what specifications are built into the stimulus conditions and manifestations corresponding to a given dispositional concept. This is disputed by Choi (2008). Secondly, there is a noticeable tension between Lewis's criticism of SCA and his defence of RCA from the problems of maskers and mimickers. We have seen earlier that Lewis tries to add force to the problem of finks by assuming IDT. But this assumption seems to lead to a backlash against his defence of RCA from the problems of maskers and mimickers. Lewis's response to the problem of maskers is that the protected glass is disposed to break when struck without the packing material, which explains away the intuition that it is fragile; and that this opens the door for insisting that it is in fact not disposed to break when struck. But this move seems to be on a collision course with IDT because an unprotected intrinsic duplicate of the glass is undoubtedly disposed to break when struck. This illustrates the tension between Lewis's treatments of the problems of finks and maskers—and mutatis mutandis for the problem of mimickers (see Choi 2009 for discussion).

To introduce the third comment on Lewis's approach, let us compare it with Choi and Gundersen's approach that rules out finks, reverse-cycle finks, maskers, mimickers, etc., from the stimulus condition. A conspicuous difference between them is that, while, on Choi and Gundersen's approach, all of the problems of finks, reverse-cycle finks, maskers, and mimickers are handled in a uniform manner, this is not the case for Lewis's approach. Lewis deals with them by invoking diverse elements in RCA: the condition that x retain an intrinsic property for a sufficient time, the condition that the intrinsic property causally contribute to the occurrence of the manifestation, the condition that maskers be absent from the stimulus condition, the condition that the manifestation of fragility be x's breaking through a certain direct and standard process. Other things being equal, this difference will favour Choi and Gundersen's approach over Lewis's as explanatory unity is a theoretical virtue.

Having discussed Lewis's analysis of dispositions in detail, let us turn to a more recent proposal by Manley & Wasserman (2007, 2008). They take cues from, among other things, comparative disposition ascriptions like ‘x is more disposed to break when struck than y’. They stress that the versions of the conditional analysis of dispositions discussed so far cannot accommodate these comparative ascriptions as counterfactual conditionals invoked by conditional analyses do not admit of degree. This consideration suggests the following account of dispositions, or so they argue.

  • PROP. x is disposed to M in C iff some suitable proportion of C–cases are such that x would M in them,

where a C–case is a fully specific scenario that settles everything causally relevant to the manifestation of the disposition. The suitable proportion of C–cases is fixed partly by the stimulus condition C and partly by the context of ascription.

On PROP, ‘x is more disposed to M in C than y’ means that x would M in a greater proportion of C–cases than y. PROP thus seems to provide an account of comparative disposition ascriptions. Further, Manley & Wasserman hold that PROP has no difficulty handling some apparent counterexamples to the conditional analyses of dispositions on offer. But their analysis is not without difficulties. The trouble is that it is extremely difficult to make sense of talk of proportions of C–cases, especially given that very diverse factors are supposed to affect the weights of given C–cases: closeness of them to actuality, contextual variations of their weights, and so on. In addition, Manley & Wasserman's account of comparative disposition ascriptions requires a non-arbitrary standard for comparing the sizes of infinite sets of C–cases despite most of them being of the same cardinality. But it looks to be a tremendous task to set up such a standard, let alone, to do so in a way that is epistemically accessible to those of us who possess the dispositional concepts at issue.

Fara (2005) proposes that instead of using conditionals to give an analysis of dispositions we should use what he calls habituals. Habituals are a commonplace device for characterising how an object habitually behaves. ‘John walks to school’, for example, is true even if, occasionally John drives to school. In this sense, we can think of habituals as expressing universal generalizations that tolerate exceptions. In the belief that this feature of habituals makes them well placed to serve in an analysis of dispositions, Fara proposes a habitual analysis of dispositions: x is disposed to M when C iff it has an intrinsic property in virtue of which it Ms when C. But this is open to serious criticisms. Yli-Vakkuri (2010), for instance, argues that Fara's analysis, when carefully examined, reduces to the following version of conditional analysis of dispositions: x is disposed to M when C iff it has an intrinsic property in virtue of which, ceteris paribus, x would M if it were the case that C. But Yli-Vakkuri urges that this analysis is deeply unsatisfactory as it seems impossible to spell out the content of the ceteris paribus clause without rendering the resulting analysis vacuous or circular. See the next section for more on the issue of ceteris paribus clause.

1.5 Analyzing conventional dispositions

We have thus far surveyed a variety of conceptual analyses of canonical dispositions that involve explicit references to their stimulus conditions and manifestations. This corresponds to the second step in Lewis's two-step approach (see section 1.1). But they by themselves do not tell us how to understand conceptually conventional dispositions like fragility, flammability, conductivity, etc., that do not involve such explicit references. Here it might be suggested that, given that conventional dispositions are the ones we are most familiar with and find most useful in everyday or scientific contexts, our understanding of dispositions will remain incomplete unless we have obtained a full-blooded analysis of conventional dispositions. In fact, although the apparent counterexamples to SCA were presented in terms of canonical dispositions in the preceding sections, they are often presented in terms of conventional dispositions. On this construal, the simple conditional analysis is thought of as an analysis of conventional dispositions. For instance, the simple conditional analysis of fragility is understood as saying that x is fragile at t iff it would break if struck at t; and this analysis is claimed to be toppled, for example, by a carefully packed glass that remains fragile but would not break if struck. Thus the alleged counterexamples are often described as concerning the issue of how to link conventional dispositions with counterfactual conditionals. We noted earlier, though, that, to tackle this issue, we need define conventional dispositions into (groups of) canonical dispositions by specifying their stimulus conditions and manifestations, which corresponds to the first step in Lewis's two-step approach. With this in mind, we will inquire into the issue of how to specify the stimulus conditions and manifestations of conventional dispositions and other related issues. (The philosophical relevance of this inquiry is not universally agreed upon. See Lewis 1997; Choi 2003, 2008.)

Let us start by unraveling several different notions of stimulus condition. Mary utters ‘Arsenic is poisonous’. What is the stimulus condition of the disposition expressed by ‘poisonous’? An impromptu answer would be the event of being ingested. In most normal contexts of utterance, however, what she means is that arsenic is poisonous to humans. So, given this context of utterance, the stimulus condition can be said to be the event of being ingested by a human being (Prior 1985, chapter 1). This second stimulus condition can be identified by making explicit the context's contribution to the content of the stimulus condition. As we will see, furthermore, it has been suggested that the stimulus condition is not the simple event of being ingested but the event of being ingested without finks, maskers, and so forth. Here the condition of the absence of finks, maskers, and so forth seems to come not from the context of utterance but from the context-independent meaning of being poisonous (Choi 2011, forthcoming b). There are thus many different notions of stimulus condition although they are not miles away from each other. One says ‘My mobile phone set is fragile’. The stimulus condition could be any of its being struck, its being struck with a soft blow, its being struck without finks, maskers, and so forth.

This disambiguation is of much value when we articulate the notion of ‘multi-track’ disposition. There seems to be a general agreement that there are so-called ‘multi-track’ conventional dispositions that correspond to more than one pair of stimulus condition and manifestation (Ryle 1963, p. 114; Bird 2005a, p. 367; Bird 2007a, pp. 21–24; Ellis & Lierse 1994, p. 29). The thought is that exactly the same conventional dispositions may be picked out by multiple characterisations in terms of stimulus condition and manifestation. However, caution is required when we decide if a given disposition is multi-track or not. First of all, a single notion of stimulus condition must be in use: it is wrong to infer that the property of being poisonous is a multi-track disposition, from the fact that its stimulus condition could be being ingested, being ingested by humans, being ingested without finks, maskers, and so on. Further, we must hold the context of utterance fixed: it is wrong to infer that the property of being poisonous is multi-track, from the fact that its stimulus condition could be being ingested by humans, being ingested by dogs, being ingested by birds, and so on. The expression ‘poisonous’ is context-sensitive with respect to who x is poisonous to, referring to different dispositional properties relative to different contexts of utterance. Hence stimulus conditions like x's being ingested by humans, x's being ingested by dogs, etc., are not stimulus conditions of the same disposition. And hence they don't have to do with the issue of whether or not a given disposition is multi-track.

Are there then multi-track dispositions at all? There indeed are. Being electrically charged, an electron is disposed to experience an electrostatic force F in response to being placed at a distance d away from an electric charge q but it is also disposed to experience an electrostatic force F* in response to being placed at a distance d* away from an electric charge q*. Similarly, it might be plausibly claimed that fragility is a multi-track disposition with many different stimulus conditions: x's being struck, x's being stressed, x's being twisted, x's being shaken, and so on. Indeed, while Nancy Cartwright's (1999, pp. 59, 64) notion of capacity is akin to the notion of multi-track disposition (cf. see Teller 2002, pp. 717–718.), electric charge being a paradigm example of capacity in Cartwright's sense, she maintains that capacities are real properties and that reference to capacities is essential in the operation of science: scientific laws are nothing but expressions of what capacities exist and how they work together. On Cartwright's view, hence, not only do multi-track dispositions exist but it is their nature that science aims to unveil.

Be that as it may, however, we will leave behind multi-track dispositions, for, seeking a conceptual analysis of them raises many difficult questions that would take us far afield. In what follows, we will instead focus on single-track conventional dispositions that correspond to a unique pair of stimulus condition and manifestation, or alternatively we will simply assume that all conventional dispositions are single-track. We hope, though, the subsequent discussion will shed light on the issue of how to analyze multi-track dispositions.

What are the stimulus condition and manifestation of a given conventional disposition? It is generally held that any specification of the stimulus condition of a conventional disposition must include covert reference to a ceteris paribus clause (Prior 1985; Lewis 1997; Bird 1998; Mumford 1998; Mellor 2000; Malzkorn 2000; Cross 2005; Choi 2006, 2008; Hauska 2008b; Steinberg 2010): fragility, for example, is defined not as the canonical disposition to break when struck but rather as the canonical disposition to break when struck under certain standard conditions. For the sake of simplicity, let us combine this definition with the simple analysis of dispositions, SCA. Then it follows that ‘x is fragile’ is to be analyzed into ‘If x were struck under certain standard conditions it would break’ or ‘If x were struck then, ceteris paribus, it would break’. Recall that, in each of the alleged counterexamples to SCA, a fragile thing but not a non-fragile thing would break if struck in the absence of finks, reverse-cycle finks, maskers, mimickers, and so on. To the extent to which cases of finks, reverse-cycle finks, etc., are non-standard, therefore, the ceteris paribus clause ensures that ‘x is fragile’ has the same truth value as the associated counterfactual conditional in every case, thereby blocking the counterexamples.

So far so good. But serious doubts have been raised as to how to spell out the ceteris paribus clause in a way that fits the bill. It is even claimed that the only way to spell it out in such a way is to render the proposed analysis vacuous. For, on the intended reading of the ceteris paribus clause, to say that if x were struck, then ceteris paribus it would break seems to be simply to say that if it were struck then, unless it didn't break, it would break, which is vacuously true (see Martin 1994; Bird 1998; Mumford 1998, 2001; Fara 2005; Hauska 2008b and Steinberg 2010; although see Mellor 2000 for the view that the risk of vacuity is unproblematic).

The first and foremost question is thus how to spell out the ceteris paribus clauses in a way that does not render the resulting conditionals vacuous. Addressing this question, Choi (2008) proposes that the ceteris paribus clauses concern what he calls the ordinary conditions. For instance, ‘x is fragile’ is defined to mean that x would break if struck under the ordinary conditions for fragility. To give flesh to this proposal, Choi submits that the ordinary conditions for disposition D are extrinsic conditions to the putative bearer of D that are ordinary according to those who possess the corresponding dispositional concept. The ordinary conditions for fragility are then extrinsic conditions that are ordinary according to the possessors of the dispositional concept of fragility, most folks. But they do not possess the dispositional concept of superconductivity as they do not know how to use it in drawing inferences or classifying objects. It is possessed by a small number of physical scientists who deal with the phenomenon of superconductivity. According to Choi's proposal, therefore, the ordinary conditions for superconductivity are extrinsic conditions that are ordinary according to those physical scientists.

Choi argues that his analysis delivers intuitively correct rulings on the cases that have been considered as problematic for SCA. He claims, for instance, that, under the ordinary conditions for fragility, x is not protected by the packing material, which means that the protected glass would break if struck under such conditions. What if it is supposed that the packing material is so pervasive that it is not ruled out from the ordinary conditions for fragility? In this case, the glass wouldn't break if struck under the ordinary conditions for fragility, which means that it is not fragile according to Choi's proposal. Does this run counter to our intuitions? Choi says no. He insists that, on the supposition at issue, the glass is better deemed non-fragile.

2. The Dispositional/Categorical Distinction

The previous section was devoted to the issue of how to devise a conceptual analysis of dispositions in an attempt to improve our understanding of dispositions. Another way of improving it is to identify characteristics that distinguish dispositions from non-dispositional properties, especially, ‘categorical properties’. What are categorical properties? With respect to this question we are in no better position than we are with respect to dispositional properties. There are some clear cases like roundness and being made of wood. But it is not clear what characteristics they have in common. See Mumford 1998, pp, 20–22; Bird 2007a, pp. 66–67; Ellis 2010 for some attempts to characterise categorical properties. (Note that hybrid properties—like the property of being soluble and round—are possible (McKitrick 2003b, footnote 9). We'll ignore them in what follows.)

Philosophers have been interested in the dispositional/categorical distinction ever since Aristotle. But recent decades have witnessed an intense interest in this distinction. This is probably because, while the Humean metaphysic is one of the most discussed topics among contemporary metaphysicians, it requires a robust distinction between dispositional and categorical properties (cf. see Ellis 2001, p. 45). Lewis's famous conception of Humean supervenience, which has been found to be an attractive way of preserving the Humean denial of fundamental natural necessity in contemporary metaphysics, holds that the world is a ‘vast mosaic of local matters of particular fact’ and that there is ‘no difference without difference in the arrangement of qualities’ (Lewis 1986a, pp. ix–x). Instantiations of qualities are thus ultimate constituents of the world, on whose distribution all other property instantiations supervene. But Lewisian qualities are clearly supposed to be categorical properties. And so Lewis's Humean supervenience thesis has it that the distribution of dispositional properties is fully determined once the categorical properties of things are determined, which requires a dispositional/categorical distinction.

2.1 Entailment

What is it about dispositions that set them apart from categorical properties? Traditionally it is suggested that ascriptions of dispositions do, while ascriptions of categorical properties do not, entail certain counterfactual conditionals:

  • Entailment. F is a disposition iff there are an associated stimulus condition and manifestation such that, necessarily, x has F only if x would produce the manifestation if it were in the stimulus condition.

Among the philosophers who have supported Entailment, or something like it, are Carnap (1936–7), Ryle (1963), Goodman (1954), Quine (1960), Mackie (1973), Prior (1985), and Armstrong, Martin & Place (1996), Mumford (1998), Choi (2005b, 2008, forthcoming a).

If disposition ascriptions do not entail corresponding counterfactual conditionals, then Entailment is hopeless. Note that the apparent counterexamples to SCA may seem to show just that. But let's leave this claim aside for the sake of argument. Still Entailment might be disputed on the ground that ascriptions of dispositions are not unique in this regard. Mellor (1974) takes an allegedly paradigmatic categorical property, triangularity, and claimed that if x is triangular, then if its corners were correctly counted, the result would be three. Entailment therefore seems to predict that ‘triangular’ expresses a disposition. And as for ‘triangular’ so, presumably, for any predicate that might be thought to express a categorical property.

Mellor's suggestion, though, is liable to the problems of reverse-finks and maskers. One can easily set up an analogous case to an example of reverse-finks or maskers that shows that Mellor's conditional is not entailed by ‘x is triangular’: x is triangular but if its corners were about to be counted a sorcerer would change its shape so that the result of counting would not be three. Further, Prior (1982, 1985) argues that if we are to understand ‘correctly’ in Mellor's conditional as referring to the method of counting, as opposed to the result of counting, then his claim is false. For there are possible worlds in which quirky laws of nature ensure that counting always gives the wrong result. (Bird (2003, 2009) gives a useful discussion of the general lessons that should be drawn from the debate between Prior and Mellor.)

But it might be suggested that these problems for Mellor's claim can be handled by introducing a ceteris paribus clause in much the same fashion as, as we have seen in section 1.5, some philosophers do with respect to conventional dispositions (Mumford 1998; Choi 2008, forthcoming a). The suggestion is that the stimulus condition of triangularity is not simply x's corners being correctly counted but x's corners being correctly counted under certain standard conditions. Although ‘x is triangular’ may not entail Mellor's conditional as it stands, it does entail that if x's corners were correctly counted under certain standard conditions, it would give the result of three, where the standard conditions are understood to rule out cases where reverse-finks or maskers operate or quirky laws of nature obtain. Notwithstanding this defence of Mellor's claim, however, Choi argues that it is still hopeless, to which we will turn below.

2.2 Intrinsic Finks

Choi (2005b) imagines a tricky triangle Tt which has the same intrinsic properties as an ordinary triangle except that it has an intrinsic property that would cause it to become rectangular if someone starts to count its corners. What if Tt's corners were correctly counted under standard conditions? Given that standard conditions are generally thought to involve Tt's extrinsic properties only, Tt would become rectangular in virtue of one of its own intrinsic properties; as a result, it would not elicit the result of three but the result of four. It is therefore not true that if Tt's corners were correctly counted under standard conditions the result would be three. But it is intuitively evident that Tt is triangular. From this Choi concludes that ‘x is triangular’ does not even entail the ceteris paribus version of Mellor's conditional.

One might suspect, however, that Choi's thought experiment will backfire on the ground that we can envision an analogous case for dispositions: an object St only differs from a fragile glass in that the first, not the second, has an intrinsic property that would cause it to lose M if it were struck, where M is the type of microstructure St has in common with the fragile glass. St does not satisfy the counterfactual conditional that it would break if struck under the standard conditions. But is St not supposed to have almost all intrinsic properties in common with a fragile glass, most importantly, the microstructure M? This might lead one to think that St is fragile, from which it follows that even the ascription of fragility does not entail the corresponding counterfactual conditional. In response, though, Choi (2005b, pp. 599–602, forthcoming a) urges that St is not fragile. He has thus defended Entailment from Mellor's objections by invoking intrinsically finkish properties.

Handfield (2008b) gives an insightful angle to Choi's thought experiment. Let's say that a property putatively considered to be dispositional is intrinsically finkable or not depending on whether or not an object can co-instantiate it along with an intrinsic property that would remove it if the stimulus condition obtained. Then Handfield suggests that the core idea of Choi's thought experiment is that dispositional properties are not intrinsically finkable but categorical properties are.

At least some dispositions are extrinsically finkable. Martin's examples can be understood to show that the dispositional property of being live is extrinsically finkable. We can readily get a similar result for categorical properties. Handfield urges, though, that there is a glaring contrast between dispositional and categorical properties when we look at intrinsic finks, which is illustrated by Choi's thought experiment. Tt is triangular but it also has an intrinsic property that would remove its triangularity if its corners were counted. This property serves as an intrinsic fink to triangularity. The case of St, however, is claimed to show that we cannot devise an analogous case for dispositions, which permits the conclusion that fragility is not intrinsically finkable—and mutatis mutandis for the possibility of intrinsic reverse-finks, maskers, and mimickers. This view has been criticised by Clarke (2008, 2010), Fara (2008), Everett (2009), Ashwell (2010), and Bird (manuscript), though. Choi (forthcoming a) addresses some of their criticisms. This issue is importantly relevant to many other issues such as Kripke-Wittgenstein rule-following puzzle (Martin and Heil 1998; Handfield and Bird 2008; Cheng 2010; Schlosser 2011) and the principle of alternate possibilities (Cohen and Handfield 2007).

An entirely different line of criticism of Entailment is due to Cross (2005) and Hawthorne and Manley (2005). Their criticism is basically that even such a categorical property as being struck qualifies as a dispositional property by Entailment since x's being struck entails that if x were fragile it would break. This criticism is dealt with by Choi (2008).

3. Categoricalism, Dispositionalism, and Laws of Nature

In contemporary metaphysics, a surging number of philosophers express their allegiance to dispositional essentialism, the position that at least some properties have dispositional essences. Some of them go beyond this to take a stronger position, that all properties or at least all sparse properties in Lewis 1986b's sense are essentially dispositional (Popper 1959; Harré 1970; Harré and Madden 1975; Shoemaker 1980; Mumford 2004; Bird 2005b, 2007a; Chakravartty 2007; Whittle 2008). This position is known as dispositional monism or causal theory of properties. Alternatively it is simply named ‘dispositionalism’. The dispositionalist holds that the essence of a property P is wholly constituted by the nomic or causal roles P plays—for short, theoretical roles. Here the nomic role of P is given in terms of the Ramsey sentence that we can get from a true and complete final theory, a sentence that represents the totality of the factual content of the theory. The causal role of P, on the other hand, is given in terms of its potential causes and effects. Dispositionalism thus implies the following transworld identity condition for properties: properties P and Q are identical iff they play the same theoretical roles. Note that the theoretical roles played by a property P determine how its instances are disposed to act or react under various circumstances. On dispositionalism, therefore, P invariably endows its instances with the same dispositions, in which sense dispositionalism implies that properties have dispositional essences—and only dispositional essences.

The main impetus behind dispositionalism is the discontent philosophers have with the categoricalist's doctrine that the essence of a property doesn't have to do with what its instances are disposed to do under various circumstances. Categoricalism—also known as categorical monism—is the position that all properties, or at least all sparse properties are categorical properties, which serves to underpin the traditional Humean metaphysic that asserts that worlds can be characterised in terms of their complete histories of instantiations of categorical properties (Lewis 1986b, p. 162; Mumford 2006, p. 471; Williams 2011).

A famous argument for categoricalism due to Armstrong (1997, p. 79) is that dispositions are Meinongian—or, in Handfield's (2005) terms, dispositions are modally inverted. Suppose that a fragile glass x doesn't break. But x is fragile inasmuch as it would break in response to being struck under suitable conditions. If so, x's being fragile has within itself, essentially, an implicit reference to the manifestation, namely, the event of breaking, that didn't occur. That is, it points to an entirely counterfactual state of affair, in which sense the property of fragility is at least partly ‘hypothetical’. Armstrong takes it that this consequence is a version of Meinongianism, a metaphysical position that accepts an overly generous ontology including non-existent entities, which he finds obnoxious (see Handfield 2008a for an attempt to get around this objection). Armstrong goes on to offer what he calls an irenic or soft deflationist doctrine of dispositional properties. On this view, we can account for the truth-makers of disposition ascriptions in terms of categorical properties and laws of nature. Thus understood, to say that x is fragile is not to ascribe a real property to x. Rather, it is an abbreviated way of saying that, given laws of nature, from x's being struck, we can infer that x would break. On Armstrong's view, we do not use dispositional terms to describe irreducibly dispositional states of affairs. Rather, they are merely convenient ways of talking about categorical properties.

Armstrong implicitly assumes that categorical properties are non-Meinongian. This brings under the spotlight the question of how to characterise the essences of categorical properties in a way that renders them non-Meinongian. Towards this end, most categoricalists including Armstrong subscribe to quidditism, according to which the essence of a property is constituted by its internal or self-contained nature, that is, what is called quiddity, that is only contingently related to the specific theoretical roles it plays (Armstrong 1989, 1997; Lewis 2009). (Despite this move, Handfield (2005) criticises, Armstrong is still susceptible to the ‘Meinongianism objection’ as his nomic necessitation relation N is constituted by a relation to counterfactual states of affairs.) Armstrong (1997, p. 80) thus says, ‘properties are self-contained things, keeping themselves to themselves, not pointing beyond themselves to further effects brought about in virtue of such properties’. Then what exactly is this internal or self-contained nature? Given that theoretical roles are ruled out as being merely contingently related to it, there seems to be very little to be said about it. Thus Black (2000, p. 91) says that, according to Lewis who accepts quidditism, ‘Just about all there is to a Humean fundamental quality is its identity with itself and its distinctness from other qualities’. On quidditism, the essence of a property puts no constraint whatsoever on how its instances are disposed to act or react under various circumstances. This is why quidditism goes along with categoricalism which asserts that properties have no dispositional essences.

Quidditism is to properties what haecceitism is to individuals. Haecceitism famously implies a theory of primitive identity of individuals across possible worlds. Likewise, quidditism implies a theory of primitive transworld identity of properties which asserts that two properties are identical iff they are quiddistically the same, regardless of their theoretical roles (Black 2000; Whittle 2006; Lewis 2009). This being the case, a property could confer upon its instances completely different causal or nomic powers than it actually does but nonetheless continue to be the same property as it actually is so long as it remains quiddistically the same. The causal or nomic profile of a property is thus a merely contingent matter. (Schaffer (2005) points out that this ‘contingentism’ is not necessarily paired with quidditism: ‘anti-quiddistic contingentism’ is a respectable position.)

Quidditism therefore implies that laws of nature are metaphysically contingent, for, for any class of properties, there seems to be nothing standing in the way of either the possibility that they are bound up with each other by laws of nature or the possibility that they are not related at all to each other by any laws of nature. A consequence of quidditism is therefore that although, for instance, colour properties and mass properties are not actually linked with each other by any laws, they could have been so linked. Laws of nature are therefore a contingent matter. Some quidditists may go further to say that laws of nature are a type of regularity among property instances (Ramsey 1978; Lewis 1973; Earman 1984). Others may suggest that laws of nature are nomic necessitation relations between universals (Armstrong 1983; Dretske 1977; Tooley 1977).

Dispositionalism is a stark contrast to categoricalism, maintaining that all properties have dispositional essences. The dispositionalist charges that the categoricalist's appeal to the internal or self-contained nature of a property as its essence is unintelligible unless it is somehow related to the causal or nomic powers of its instances. On dispositionalism, as noted earlier, a given property endows all of its instances with the same dispositions, no matter what circumstances they are situated in. Dispositionalism then necessitates a diametrically opposing view of laws of nature to the one necessitated by categoricalism— more to the point, the one necessitated by quidditism. Because the property of being negatively charged has the essence characterised in terms of the disposition to attract positively charged particles and repel negatively charged particles, on dispositionalism, all negatively charged objects must be so disposed, which entails that Coulomb's law, which describes how charged particles interact with one another, is metaphysically necessary (see Corry 2011 for a criticism of this reasoning). In general, the dispositionalist typically maintains, laws of nature are just universal descriptions of dispositional essences of properties; and they are metaphysically necessary because their truth is ensured by the dispositional essences of relevant properties in all the possible worlds where those relevant properties exist. (This point is made by Swoyer (1982), Ellis (2001), Kistler (2002), and Bird (2005a, 2007a); see Mumford 2004 for the claim that dispositionalism obviates the need for laws and see Bird 2007a, chapter 9 for a criticism of this claim; see Chalmers 1999 and Fine 2002 for the claim that some of natural necessities, e.g., conservation laws, cannot be accounted for by dispositionalism.) This raises the hope that dispositionalism can provide a comprehensive and unified metaphysical grounding for natural modalities in general that may serve as an alternative to Humeanism. For some attempts at it, see Williams & Borghini 2008, Martin 2008, Jacobs 2010. Handfield (2008a) does not take dispositionalism and Humeanism as incompatible and explores the possibility of combining them to construct what he calls ‘Humean dispositionalism’.

Categoricalism and dispositionalism are two extremes of a large spectrum of possible positions on the essences of properties. For instance, philosophers like Swoyer (1982), Ellis & Lierse (1994), Ellis (1999, 2001, 2010), and Molnar (2003) maintain that some properties are essentially dispositional but others, most notably spatio-temporal properties, are not, in which sense they are dispositional essentialists but not dispositionalists. Another alternative is explored by Martin and Heil, who have suggested the ‘Limit View’ on which every property is in some sense both dispositional and categorical (Armstrong, Martin & Place 1996; Martin 1997; Martin & Heil 1999; Heil 2003, 2005). See Mumford 1998 for a slightly different view, the neutral monism which asserts that, while all properties are of a single type, the dispositional/categorical distinction corresponds to two different ways of denoting them. Notwithstanding this profusion of possible positions to be taken, however, categoricalism and dispositionalism have been the focus of discussion in the literature. For some of the criticisms and arguments dispositionalists and categoricalists have traded, see the

Appendix on quiddistically different worlds, irremediable ignorance, and regress of powers.

4. Dispositions and Categorical Bases

The causal basis for x's disposition is something like x's microstructural property that is or would be causally responsible for the manifestation of that disposition. It will be helpful to have in hand a characterisation of ‘causal basis’ that is more perspicuous than this. In their seminal paper on dispositions, Prior, Pargetter & Jackson (1982) offer the following definition (p. 251):

  • PPJ. A causal basis for disposition D is the property or property-complex that, together with the characteristic stimulus of D, is a causally operative sufficient condition for the characteristic manifestation of D in the case of “surefire” dispositions, and in the case of probabilistic dispositions is causally sufficient for the relevant chance of the manifestation.

We will not here consider cases of probabilistic dispositions; the ‘surefire’ or deterministic cases are difficult enough. A clarification is needed of the concept of causally operative sufficient condition. One thing we can say for sure about it is that a condition is causally operative sufficient for some effect only if, given the laws of nature, whenever the condition is present it is causally necessary that the effect occurs. PPJ then necessitates the following account of causal basis: a causal basis for D is a property or property-complex P such that, given the laws of nature, whenever an object x has P and undergoes the characteristic stimulus of D, it is causally necessary that x exhibits the characteristic manifestation of D. For a criticism of PPJ, see Contessa 2011.

PPJ is not the only way to characterise the notion of causal basis. Lewis (1997), for example, derives an alternative characterisation of causal basis from RCA, as pointed out by Hauska (2008a). The causal basis for D is then approximately defined as an intrinsic property P that would cause x to manifest D if x were to be exposed to the stimulus condition and, at the same time, x were to retain P for a sufficient time. For still alternative characterisations of causal basis, see Mackie 1977, Johnston 1992, McKitrick 2003b, and Molnar 2003.

Note that PPJ and Lewis's characterisation both leave it an open question whether the causal bases for a disposition need be categorical properties, or instead a disposition might have a disposition as a causal basis. Also it leaves it an open question whether a disposition could serve as a causal basis for itself or not. These open questions are the topic of the upcoming sections.

4.1 The Possibility of Bare Dispositions

Based dispositions are dispositions with causal bases that are distinct from the dispositions themselves. Assuming that the glass's microstructural property is a causal basis for and is distinct from its fragility, its fragility is a based disposition. As noted earlier, the possibility that a disposition serves as a causal basis for itself is not ruled out by the definitions of causal basis like PPJ or Lewis's, in which case, the disposition is not a based disposition as it is not distinct from its causal basis. The requirement that a disposition be distinct from its causal basis should be carefully understood, though: it should not be interpreted to rule out causal bases that are only contingently identical to the corresponding dispositions. Based dispositions are dispositions with causal bases that are not necessarily identical to the dispositions themselves, in which sense they have distinct causal bases. When a disposition serves as a causal basis for itself, it is necessarily identical to its causal basis, which entails that it is not a based disposition. It might be thought, though, that a based disposition is contingently identical to its causal basis. In fact, Armstrong (Armstrong, Martin & Place 1996) is well known for the claim that all based dispositions are contingently identical to their bases (cf. see section 4.2 below). Bare dispositions are baseless dispositions, which means that they are dispositions with no distinct causal bases (McKitrick 2003b). See Johnston 1992, Smith & Stoljar 1998, and Williams 2011 for different definitions of bare disposition.

The categoricalist maintains it is categorical properties that we truly attribute to x when we apparently talk about x's dispositions. What are those categorical properties? To this question, the categoricalist typically suggests that they are categorical causal bases, which rests on the assumption that all dispositions (more precisely, all of what we apparently consider as dispositions) must have categorical properties as causal bases. This is why the categoricalist is typically inclined to deny the possibility of bare dispositions. Conversely, the dispositionalist is not similarly pressed to say that dispositions must have causal bases, or at least, that all dispositions must have distinct causal bases. For this reason, some dispositionalists leave it an open question whether bare dispositions are possible or not but most of them, finding unattractive the idea of dispositions all the way down, go further to affirm the possibility of bare dispositions (McKitrick 2003b; Mumford 2006; Ellis 2001, 2002; Molnar 1999, 2003). Investigating the possibility of bare dispositions thus bears major significance for the debate between dispositionalism and categoricalism.

Prior et al. (1982) provide one important argument for the thesis that, necessarily, every disposition has a causal basis—a thesis they label the ‘Causal Thesis’. Putting the case of probabilistic dispositions aside, they consider an object A that is subject to knocking in a deterministic world. They argue (pp. 251–252):

[I]t will be either determined that A breaks, or that A does not break. In the latter case clearly A is not fragile. In the former there will be a causally sufficient antecedent condition operative in producing the breaking—that follows from Determinism. Hence if A is fragile and Determinism is true, there must be a causal basis.

This argument itself, if successful, doesn't show that dispositions must have distinct casual bases. It is consistent with the causal basis for a disposition being identical with the disposition itself. As we will see in section 4.2, however, Prior et al. do have at hand separate arguments for the thesis that dispositions are distinct from their causal bases. Taken together, these arguments will show the impossibility of bare dispositions. See Hauska (2008a) for a criticism of Prior et al.'s argument.

Smith and Stoljar (1998) argue that the proponent of the possibility of bare dispositions is committed to there being relations of ‘bare similarity’ holding between possible worlds, which they take as unacceptable. McKitrick (2003b) argues in response, first, that Smith and Stoljar do not succeed in showing that the commitment to bare similarity follows from the possibility of bare dispositions, and, second, that even if it did then this would not be nearly as problematic as they take it to be. If one has already accepted that there might be bare dispositions then, McKitrick suggests, one should not be uncomfortable with the idea that there could be ‘barely similar’ possible worlds.

So much for arguments in favour of the impossibility of bare dispositions. A strong argument for the possibility of bare dispositions begins with the thought that fundamental properties like spin, electric charge, etc., are all dispositional. This observation is put together with the assumption that, to the extent to which subatomic particles like leptons and quarks are fundamental, they cannot have any constituting parts. This assumption seems to be supported by experimental results in physics, showing that fundamental particles behave like point-like, structureless particles (Molnar 1999, 2003). But it entails that their dispositions cannot be grounded by the properties of their constituting parts. This seems to lead to the conclusion that dispositional properties of fundamental particles are bare dispositions, lacking any distinct causal bases (Harré & Madden 1975; Blackburn 1990; Ellis & Lierse 1994; Ellis 2001, 2002; Molnar 1999, 2003; McKitrick 2003b; the most powerful elaboration of this argument is given by Mumford 2006).

This argument is meant to prove more than needed for the refutation of categoricalism. Given that categoricalism entails the impossibility of bare dispositions, establishing the mere possibility of bare dispositions will suffice for refuting categoricalism. But the argument at hand, if successful, would demonstrate that fundamental properties are bare dispositions, entailing that bare dispositions do actually exist.

What should we make of this argument? Williams (2009, 2011) conducts an instructive discussion of it, where he, following Ellis and Lierse, labels it the ‘argument from science’—Mumford (2006) names it the ‘ungrounded argument’. He points out that it is ‘not just one argument, but a small, close-knit family of arguments’. The specific argument we presented earlier is most similar to what he calls the indirect ‘structureless’ version, which he takes as the most common among versions of the argument from science. Williams's worry about it is that what follows from the reasonable assumption that fundamental particles do not have constituting parts is not that their dispositions are in no way grounded but that their dispositions are not grounded via compositional structure. On his view, it is still an open possibility to the categoricalist that their dispositions are grounded via supervenient structure, meaning that dispositions of a subatomic particle supervene upon categorical properties of the particle itself.

In response, it might be thought that subatomic particles are entirely characterised in terms of dispositions like spin and electric charge, and therefore that they possess no categorical properties on which their dispositions would supervene, in which case the possibility of grounding via supervenient structure is blocked. Williams (2009, p. 13) retorts, though, that the reason why physicists speak only in terms of dispositions when they describe subatomic particles is merely that the only means they have to investigate subatomic particles is to ‘poke and prod at them with bombardments, and see how they react’ (For a similar point, see Strawson 1980; Blackburn 1990; Jackson 1998; Langton 1998; Hawthorne 2002; Lewis 2009). But this is not to say that they, as a matter of fact, have no categorical properties at all. In fact, we have, Williams continues to argue, good metaphysical reasons for attributing categorical properties to subatomic particles.

We have thus far seen that there is an ongoing debate regarding the thesis that all dispositions have distinct causal bases. But philosophers are in wide agreement with respect to a weaker thesis that at least some dispositions have distinct causal bases. This weak thesis, however, already raises an interesting question concerning the relation between dispositions and their causal bases, to which we turn in the next section.

4.2 The Relation between Dispositions and their Bases

Views about the relation between dispositions and their causal bases mirror views about the relation between mental and physical properties. Armstrong, Martin & Place (1996) and Mackie (1973, 1977) defend a ‘type-identity theory’ according to which any disposition is identical with its causal basis. Mumford (1998) defends a ‘token-identity theory’ according to which any instance of a disposition is identical with an instance of its causal basis. Prior—together with Pargetter and Jackson—defends a ‘functionalist theory’ according to which a disposition is a second-order property of having some causal basis or other. There are other views too, but we will confine discussion here to the three mentioned above.

Armstrong (Armstrong, Martin & Place 1996, chapter 3) puts forward one argument for the identity of dispositions with their causal bases that basically goes as follows: since dispositions are by definition properties that play certain causal roles, and since in fact their causal bases are what play those roles, it follows that dispositions are in fact identical with their causal bases. Armstrong claims that his identification of dispositions with their causal bases is a ‘contingent identification’ (Armstrong, Martin & Place 1996, p. 39): As a matter of fact the property that plays the brittleness role is such-and-such, but it might have been a different property that played that role; if so, brittleness would have been identical with that different property. This feature of Armstrong's view exposes it to Prior et al.'s (1982) argument from rigid designation. Following Kripke, Prior et al. take names of properties to be ‘rigid designators’, referring to the same property in every possible world (in which that property exists). As Kripke (1972) demonstrates, if a and b are rigid designators then the identity statement a = b is necessarily true if it is true at all. So on the assumption that, for example, ‘brittleness’ and ‘microstructural property so-and-so’ are rigid designators, the possibility that the causal basis for brittleness might have been something other than microstructural property so-and-so shows that brittleness is not identical with microstructural property so-and-so. See McKitrick 2003b for a reply to this argument. For additional arguments against Armstrong's view, see Prior et al. 1982 and Prior 1985; for discussions on them, see Mumford 1998, chapter 5 and McKitrick 2003b.

Opposing the identity of dispositions with their causal bases, Prior et al. (1982) present arguments for what they call the ‘Distinctness Thesis’. One of them is the argument from rigid designation, which we have just discussed. Another springs from the possibility of multiple realization of dispositions. Different fragile objects, for example, have different causal bases—some are fragile in virtue of their irregular atomic structure, some are fragile in virtue of their weak intermolecular bonding. This seems to serve as evidence for the Distinctness Thesis. Why? If dispositions were identified with their causal bases, we will end up having to say that diverse causal bases of fragility are identical to each other. But they are, ex hypothesi, distinct from each other. And so Prior et al. argue that the multiple realizability of dispositions provides a reductio basis for the Distinctness Thesis.

Mumford (1998, chapter 7) endorses this argument when it is construed as an argument against the ‘type-type’ identification of dispositions with their bases that Armstrong defends. But Mumford takes a strategy familiar from the philosophy of mind and maintains that Prior et al.'s argument does not defeat his own ‘token-token’ identification. According to Mumford, although in general dispositions are not identical with their bases, each instance of a disposition is identical with an instance of its causal basis. Anticipating Mumford's response, Prior (1985) complains that it is not at all clear what can be meant by ‘property instance’ if, as Mumford maintains, an object's instance of property A can be the very same thing as its instance of property B, even though property A is not the same as property B. Even if we grant the intelligibility of such a notion of property instance, however, might not the very same argument from rigid designation show that instances of dispositions cannot be identical with instances of their bases, any more than dispositions themselves can be identical with their bases? Such would seem to be the appropriate lesson to draw from the fact that Kripke's original version of the argument, aimed against identity theories in philosophy of mind, applies as much to token-token as to type-type versions of the identity theory. Mumford disagrees (p. 157), although he says little to substantiate his disagreement. See Rives 2005 for another objection to Mumford.

In the preceding paragraphs, we have canvassed Prior et al.'s arguments for their Distinctness Thesis. Using these arguments as a stepping stone, Prior (1985, chapter 7) and Jackson (1998) advance the functionalist view that disposition D is a second-order property, the property of having some first-order property or other that plays the causal role corresponding to D. It seems to be a consequence of this view that dispositions do no causal work (see section 6 below). For if having, say, the property of fragility is a matter of having a first-order property that plays the causal role associated with fragility, then it would seem that it is this first-order property, not the second-order property, that does all causal work. It would seem, then, that the functionalist view is open to the objection that it predicts dispositions to be ‘causally superfluous’ in a way that, intuitively, they are not. See Mumford 1998, Martin and Heil 1999, Heil 2003, 2005 for this objection, and see section 6 below for further discussion.

5. The Intrinsicness of Dispositions

The Intrinsic Dispositions Thesis (for short, IDT), the thesis that dispositions are intrinsic properties of their bearers, has been routinely accepted by many philosophers like Harré (1970), Armstrong (1973), Mellor (1974), Mackie (1977), Bird (1998), Molnar (2003), Choi (2005b), and Menzies (2009). Accepting it, Lewis (1997) says, ‘if two things (actual or merely possible) are exact intrinsic duplicates (and if they are subject to the same laws of nature) then they are disposed alike’ (p. 147). Lewis's qualification about the laws of nature is important, at least for those who take the laws to be contingent, for without it IDT is scarcely plausible. For if the laws are contingent then a fragile glass has intrinsic duplicates that are not disposed to break when dropped. Some of them will inhabit possible worlds whose laws of nature determine that objects with an irregular atomic structure gently bounce when dropped. IDT, therefore, should be understood as the thesis that within any sphere of worlds with the same laws of nature, any pair of objects with the same intrinsic properties will have the same dispositions. See Langton & Lewis 1998, Choi 2009, and Handfield 2009 for discussion of the precise meaning of the intrinsicness of dispositions.

Widely accepted as it is, however, IDT is not obviously true. Shoemaker (1980) considers a key's disposition to open his front door and points out that it could lose this disposition without undergoing any intrinsic change, for example, by the lock on his door being replaced by one of a different kind. It would seem, then, that the disposition to open Shoemaker's front door is not an intrinsic property of the key, and so IDT is false.

This apparent counterexample can be resisted, however. The only relevant disposition possessed by Shoemaker's key, it might be insisted, is the disposition to open locks of a certain type—the type of lock that is currently on Shoemaker's front door. Since a change in the lock will not cause the key to lose this disposition, it is an intrinsic disposition—or at least the present example does not show that it is not intrinsic. According to this response, the predicate ‘disposed to open Shoemaker's front door’ either fails to express a genuine property at all—this is Shoemaker's view—or else it somehow manages to express the intrinsic disposition to open locks of a certain type (Molnar 2003). McKitrick (2003a), however, argues that this response fails. She goes further to argue that there are indeed many cases of extrinsic dispositions, listing as examples weight (a case borrowed from Yablo 1999), vulnerability, visibility and recognizability. In light of these examples, it seems hard to dismiss the counterexamples to IDT as concerning spurious dispositions.

It is worth recalling that Lewis (1997) assumed IDT with a view to bolstering Martin's counterexamples to SCA. But it has come to light that IDT is false. Does this necessitate that Lewis fails to bolster Martin's counterexamples? Choi (2009) answers this question in the affirmative.

6. The Causal Efficacy of Dispositions

Some philosophers have said that dispositions are not causes of, or causally explanatory of, their manifestations. Why? Their thought can be encapsulated by Molière famous quip, in Le Malade Imaginaire, that a philosopher might explain why opium puts people to sleep by mentioning the fact that it has a ‘dormitive virtue’. The point, of course, is that this is no explanation or, if it is, it is not a good explanation. To have a dormitive virtue, it seems, is just to have a property that puts people to sleep, and that fact tells us only a little, if anything, about why substances with that property put people to sleep. Thus it is not obvious that the possession of a disposition plays a causal or explanatory role with respect to its manifestation. For, the possession of a (sure-fire) disposition conceptually necessitates the manifestation, and conceptual necessitation is not a kind of causal or explanatory connection. This is what McKitrick (2004, 2005) names the ‘analyticity argument’ for the causal inefficacy of dispositions. Arguments of this kind have been brought forth by Mackie (1973, 1977), Armstrong (1968), Block (1990), and Jackson (1995, 1996).

There is another type of argument. Prior et al. (1982) argue that the causal inefficacy of dispositions is a consequence of the Causal Thesis and the Distinctness Thesis (see section 4 above):

By the Causal Thesis, any disposition (and thus fragility) must have a causal basis. This causal basis is a sufficient causal explanation of the breaking as far as the properties of the object are concerned. But then there is nothing left for any other properties of the object to do. By the Distinctness Thesis the disposition is one of these other properties, ergo the disposition does nothing. (p. 255)

This argument is akin to ‘exclusion arguments’ advanced by, for instance, Block (1990) and Kim (1990, 1998) to deny the causal efficacy of mental properties. See Yablo (1992) for an objection to the exclusion argument, to the effect that a mental event is ‘better qualified than its physical basis for the role of cause’ (p. 279).

Prior et al. point out that their argument assumes that a disposition cannot be an overdetermining cause of its manifestation, more generally, that no event can have two ‘operative’ sufficient conditions (see also Jackson 1998, p. 202). Since, ex hypothesi, it is the causal basis for the disposition that is the operative sufficient condition for its manifestation, the disposition itself, even though its possession is sufficient in the circumstances for the manifestation, is an inoperative sufficient condition, and so is not a cause. Schaffer (2003), however, argues that cases of overdetermining causes in Prior et al.'s sense are not just possible but, as a matter of fact, routine. In his view, they must be modeled after widespread cases of quantitative overdetermination where ‘the cause is decomposable into distinct and independently sufficient parts’: when one big round rock hits a window, it has two hemispheres that quantitatively overdetermine the breaking of the window. If Schaffer is right, then Prior et al.'s argument for the causal inefficacy of dispositions is defused. See Rives (2005) for a different formulation of the argument that doesn't assume that a disposition cannot be an overdetermining cause of its manifestation.

We have surveyed two salient arguments for the causal inefficacy of dispositions. Note that they, to be successful, would have to be accompanied by an account of what causal efficacy is, and the large literature on causal efficacy attests to the difficulty of complying with this demand. McKitrick (2005) surveys several of the existing accounts of causal efficacy—or, in her terms, causal relevance—and argues that the most plausible of these give us no clear reason for thinking that dispositions are causally irrelevant to their manifestations.


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belief | causation: the metaphysics of | color | conditionals | intrinsic vs. extrinsic properties | laws of nature | Lewis, David | Lewis, David: metaphysics | mental causation | properties


As of January 2012, Sungho Choi has taken over responsibility for maintaining and keeping this entry current. The supplement on quiddistically different worlds, irremediable ignorance, and regress of powers is entirely new to the present version.